Relational Models Theory is a theory in cognitive anthropology positing a biologically innate set of elementary mental models and a generative computational system operating upon those models. The computational system produces compound models, using the elementary models as a kind of lexicon. The resulting set of models is used in understanding, motivating, and evaluating social relationships and social structures. The elementary models are intuitively quite simple and commonsensical. They are as follows: Communal Sharing (having something in common), Authority Ranking (arrangement into a hierarchy), Equality Matching (striving to maintain egalitarian relationships), and Market Pricing (use of ratios). Even though Relational Models Theory is classified as anthropology, it bears on several philosophical questions.
It contributes to value theory by describing a mental faculty which plays a crucial role in generating a plurality of values. It thus shows how a single human nature can result in conflicting systems of value. The theory also contributes to philosophy of cognition. The complex models evidently result from a computational operation, thus supporting the view that a part of the mind functions computationally. The theory contributes to metaphysics. Formal properties posited by the theory are perhaps best understood abstractly, raising the possibility that these mental models correspond to abstract objects. If so, then Relational Models Theory reveals a Platonist ontology.
The anthropologist Alan Page Fiske pioneered Relational Models Theory (RMT). RMT was originally conceived as a synthesis of certain constructs concerning norms formulated by Max Weber, Jean Piaget, and Paul Ricoeur. Fiske then explored the theory among the Moose people of Burkina Faso in Africa. He soon realized that its application was far more general, giving special insight into human nature. According to RMT, humans are naturally social, using the relational models to structure and understand social interactions, the application of these models seen as intrinsically valuable. All relational models, no matter how complex, are, according to RMT, analyzable by four elementary models: Communal Sharing, Authority Ranking, Equality Matching, Market Pricing.
Any relationship informed by Communal Sharing presupposes a bounded group, the members of which are not differentiated from each other. Distinguishing individual identities are socially irrelevant. Generosity within a Communal Sharing group is not usually conceived of as altruism due to this shared identity, even though there is typically much behavior which otherwise would seem like extreme altruism. Members of a Communal Sharing relationship typically feel that they share something in common, such as blood, deep attraction, national identity, a history of suffering, or the joy of food. Examples include nationalism, racism, intense romantic love, indiscriminately killing any member of an enemy group in retaliation for the death of someone in one’s own group, sharing a meal.
An Authority Ranking relationship is a hierarchy in which individuals or groups are placed in relative higher or lower relations . Those ranked higher have prestige and privilege not enjoyed by those who are lower. Further, the higher typically have some control over the actions of those who are lower. However, the higher also have duties of protection and pastoral care for those beneath them. Metaphors of spatial relation, temporal relation, and magnitude are typically used to distinguish people of different rank. For example, a King having a larger audience room than a Prince, or a King arriving after a Prince for a royal banquet. Further examples include military rankings, the authority of parents over their children especially in more traditional societies, caste systems, and God’s authority over humankind. Brute coercive manipulation is not considered to be Authority Ranking; it is more properly categorized as the Null Relation in which people treat each other in non-social ways.
In Equality Matching, one attempts to achieve and sustain an even balance and one-to-one correspondence between individuals or groups. When there is not a perfect balance, people try to keep track of the degree of imbalance in order to calculate how much correction is needed. “Equality matching is like using a pan balance: People know how to assemble actions on one side to equal any given weight on the other side” (Fiske 1992, 691). If you and I are out of balance, we know what would restore equality. Examples include the principle of one-person/one-vote, rotating credit associations, equal starting points in a race, taking turns offering dinner invitations, and giving an equal number of minutes to each candidate to deliver an on-air speech.
Market Pricing is the application of ratios to social interaction. This can involve maximization or minimization as in trying to maximize profit or minimize loss. But it can also involve arriving at an intuitively fair proportion, as in a judge deciding on a punishment proportional to a crime. In Market Pricing, all socially relevant properties of a relationship are reduced to a single measure of value, such as money or pleasure. Most utilitarian principles involve maximization. An exception would be Negative Utilitarianism whose principle is the minimization of suffering. But all utilitarian principles are applications of Market Pricing, since the maximum and the minimum are both proportions. Other examples include rents, taxes, cost-benefit analyses including military estimates of kill ratios and proportions of fighter planes potentially lost, tithing, and prostitution.
RMT has been extensively corroborated by controlled studies based on research using a great variety of methods investigating diverse phenomena, including cross-cultural studies (Haslam 2004b). The research shows that the elementary models play an important role in cognition including perception of other persons.
It may be jarring to learn that intense romantic love and racism are both categorized as Communal Sharing or that tithing and prostitution are both instances of Market Pricing. These examples illustrate that a relational model is, at its core, a meaningless formal structure. Implementation in interpersonal relations and attendant emotional associations enter in on a different level of mental processing. Each model can be individuated in purely formal terms, each elementary model strongly resembling one of the classic scale types familiar from measurement theory. (Strictly speaking, it is each mod which can be individuated in purely formal terms. This finer point will be discussed in the next section.)
Communal Sharing resembles a nominal (categorical) scale. A nominal scale is simply classifying things into categories. A questionnaire may be designed to categorize people as theist, atheist, agnostic, and other. Such a questionnaire is measuring religious belief by using a nominal scale. The groups into which Communal Sharing sorts people is similar. One either belongs to a pertinent group or one does not, there being no degree or any shades of gray. Another illustration of nominal scaling is the pass/fail system of grading. Authority Ranking resembles an ordinal scale in which items are ranked. The ranking of students according to their performance is one example. The ordered classification of shirts in a store as small, medium, large, and extra large is another. Equality Matching resembles an interval scale. On interval scales , any unit measures the same magnitude on any point in the scale. For example, on the Celsius scale the difference between 1 degree and 2 degrees is the same as the difference between 5 degrees and 6 degrees. Equality Matching resembles an interval scale insofar as one can measure the degree of inequality in a social relationship using equal intervals so as to judge how to correct the imbalance. It is by use of such a scale that people in an Equality Matching interaction can specify how much one person owes another. However, an interval scale cannot be used to express a ratio because it has no absolute zero point. For example, the zero point on the Celsius scale is not absolute so one cannot say that 20 degrees is twice as warm as 10 degrees while on a Kelvin scale because the zero point is absolute one can express ratios. Given that Market Pricing is the application of ratios to social interactions, it resembles a ratio scale such as the Kelvin scale. One cannot, for example, meaningfully speak of the maximization of utility without presupposing some sort of ratio scale for measuring utility. Maximization would correspond to 100 percent.
The four measurement scales correspond to different levels of semantic richness and precision. The nominal scale conveys little information, being very coarse grained. For example, pass/fail grading conveys less information than ranking students. Giving letter grades is even more precise and semantically rich, conveying how much one student out-performs another. This is the use of an interval scale. The most informative and semantically rich is a percentage grade which illustrates the ratio by which one student out-performs another, hence a ratio scale. For example, if graded accurately a student scoring 90 percent has done twice as well as a student scoring 45 percent. Counterexamples may be apparent: two students could be ranked differently while receiving the same letter grade by using a deliberately coarse-grained letter grading system so as to minimize low grades. To take an extreme case, a very generous instructor might award an A to every student (after all, no student was completely lost in class) while at the same time mentally ranking the students in terms of their performance. Split grades are sometimes used to smooth out the traditional coarse-grained letter grading system . But, if both scales are as sensitive as possible and based on the same data, the interval scale will convey more information than the ordinal scale. The ordinal ranking will be derivable from the interval grading, but not vice versa. This is more obvious in the case of temperature measurement, in which grade inflation is not an issue. Simply ranking objects in terms of warmer/colder conveys less information than does Celsius measurement.
One scale is more informative than another because it is less symmetrical; greater asymmetry means that more information is conveyed. On a measurement scale, a permutation which distorts or changes information is an asymmetry. Analogously, a permutation in a social-relational arrangement which distorts or changes social relations is an asymmetry. In either case, a permutation which does not carry with it such a distortion or change is symmetric. The nominal scale type is the most symmetrical scale type, just as Communal Sharing is the most symmetrical elementary model. In either case, the only asymmetrical permutation is one which moves an item out of a category, for example, expelling someone from the social group. Any permutation within the category or group makes no difference; no difference to the information conveyed, no difference to the social relation. In the case of pass/fail grading, the student’s performance could be markedly different from what it actually was. So long as the student does well enough to pass (or poorly enough to fail), this would not have changed the grade. Thanks to this high degree of symmetry, the nominal scale conveys relatively little information.
The ordinal scale is less symmetrical. Any permutation that changes rankings is asymmetrical, since it distorts or changes something significant. But items arranged could change in many respects relative to each other while their ordering remains unaffected, so a high level of symmetry remains. Students could vary in their performance, but so long as their relative ranking remains the same, this would make no difference to grades based on an ordinal scale.
An interval scale is even less symmetrical and hence more informative, as seen in the fact that a system of letter grades conveys more information than does a mere ranking of students. An interval scale conveys the relative degrees of difference between items. If one student improves from doing C level work to B level work, this would register on an interval scale but would remain invisible on an ordinal scale if the change did not affect student ranking. Analogously, in Equality Matching, if one person, and one person only, were to receive an extra five minutes to deliver their campaign speech, this would be socially significant. By contrast, in Authority Ranking, the addition of an extra five minutes to the time taken by a Prince to deliver a speech would make no socially significant difference provided that the relative ranking remains undisturbed (for example, the King still being allotted more time than the Prince, and the Duke less than the Prince).
In Market Pricing, as in any ratio scale, the asymmetry is even greater. Adding five years to the punishment of every convict could badly skew what should be proportionate punishments. But giving an extra five minutes to each candidate would preserve balance in Equality Matching.
The symmetries of all the scale types have an interesting formal property. They form a descending symmetry subgroup chain. In other words, the symmetries of a ratio scale form a subset of the symmetries of a relevant interval scale, the symmetries of that scale form a subset of the symmetries of a relevant ordinal scale, and the symmetries of that scale form a subset of the symmetries of a relevant nominal scale. More specifically, the scale types form a containment hierarchy. Analogously, the symmetries of Market Pricing form a subset of the symmetries of Equality Matching which form a subset of the symmetries of Authority Ranking which form a subset of the symmetries of Communal Sharing. Descending subgroup chains are common in nature, including inorganic nature. The symmetries of solid matter form a subset of the symmetries of liquid matter which form a subset of the symmetries of gaseous matter which form a subset of the symmetries of plasma.
This raises interesting questions about the origins of these patterns in the mind: could they result from spontaneous symmetry breakings in brain activity rather than being genetically encoded? Darwinian adaptations are genetically encoded, whereas spontaneous symmetry breaking is ubiquitous in nature rather than being limited to genetically constrained structures. The appeal to spontaneous symmetry breaking suggests a non-Darwinian approach to understanding how the elementary models could be “innate” (in the sense of being neither learned nor arrived at through reason). That is, are the elementary relational models results of self-organization rather than learning or natural selection? If they are programmed into the genome, why would this programming imitate a pattern in nature which usually occurs without genetic encoding? The spiral shape of a galaxy, for example, is due to spontaneous symmetry breaking, as is the transition from liquid to solid. But these transitions are not encoded in genes, of course. Being part of the natural world, why should the elementary models be understood any differently?
While all relational models are analyzable into four fundamental models, the number of models as such is potentially infinite. This is because social-relational cognition is productive; any instance of a model can serve as a constituent in an even more complex instance of a model. Consider Authority Ranking and Market Pricing; an instance of one can be embedded in or subordinated to an instance of the other. When a judge decides on a punishment that is proportionate to the crime, the judge is using a ratio scale and hence Market Pricing. But the judge is only authorized to do this because of her authority, hence Authority Ranking. We have here a case of Market Pricing embedded in a superordinate (as opposed to subordinate) structure of Authority Ranking resulting in a compound model. Now consider ordering food from a waiter. The superordinate relationship is now Market Pricing, since one is paying for the waiter’s service. But the service itself is Authority Ranking with the customer as the superior party. In this case, an instance of Authority Ranking is subordinate to an instance of Market Pricing. This is also a compound model with the same constituents but differently arranged. The democratic election of a leader is Authority Ranking subordinated to Equality Matching. An elementary school teacher’s supervising children to make sure they take turns is Equality Matching subordinated to Authority Ranking.
A model can also be embedded in a model of the same type. In some complex egalitarian social arrangements, one instance of Equality Matching can be embedded in another. Anton Pannekoek’s proposed Council Communism is one such example. The buying and selling of options is the buying and selling of the right to buy and sell, hence recursively embedded Market Pricing. Moose society is largely structured by a complex model involving multiple levels of Communal Sharing. A family among the Moose is largely structured by Communal Sharing, as is the village which embeds it, as is the larger community that embeds the village, and so on. In principle, there is no upper limit on the number of embeddings in a compound model. Hence, the number of potential relational models is infinite.
A model, whether elementary or compound, is devoid of meaning when considered in isolation. As purely abstract structures, models are sometimes known as “mods” , which is an abbreviation of, “cognitively modular but modifiable modes of interacting” (Fiske 2004, 3). (This may be a misnomer, since, as purely formal structures devoid of semantic content, mods are not modes of social interaction any more than syntax. is a communication system.) In order to externalize models, that is, in order to use them to interpret or motivate or structure interactions, one needs “preos,” these being “socially transmitted prototypes, precedents, and principles that complete the mods, specifying how, when and with respect to whom the mods apply” (2004, 4). Strictly speaking, a relational model is the union of a mod with a preo. A mod has the formal properties of symmetry, asymmetry, and in some cases embeddedness. But a mod requires a preo in order to have the properties intuitively identifiable as meaningful, such as social application, emotional resonance, and motivating force.
The notion of a preo updates and includes the notion of an implementation rule, from an earlier stage of relational-models theorizing. Fiske has identified five kinds of implementation rules (1991, 142). One kind specifies the domain to which a model applies. For example, in some cultures Authority Ranking is used to structure and give meaning to marriage. In other cultures, Authority Ranking does not structure marriage and may even be viewed as immoral in that context. Another sort of implementation rule specifies the individuals or groups which are to be related by the model. Communal Sharing, for example, can be applied to different groups of people. Experience, and sometimes also agreement, decides who is in the Communal Sharing group. In implementing Authority Ranking, it is not enough to specify how many ranks there are. One must also specify who belongs to which rank. A third sort of implementation rule defines values and categories. In Equality Matching, each participant must give or receive the same thing. But what counts as the same thing? In Authority Ranking, a higher-up deserves honor from a lower-down, but what counts as honor and what constitutes showing honor? There are no a priori or innate answers to these questions; culture and mutual agreement help settle such matters. Consider the principle of one-person/one-vote, an example of Equality Matching. Currently in the United States and Great Britain, whoever gets the most votes wins the election. But it is also possible to have a system in which a two-thirds majority is necessary for there to be a winner. Without a two-thirds majority, there may be a coalition government, a second election with the lowest performing candidates eliminated, or some other arrangement. These are different ways of determining what counts as treating each citizen as having an equal say. A fourth determines the code used to indicate the existence and quality of the relationship. Authority Ranking is coded differently in different cultures, as it can be represented by the size of one’s office, the height of one’s throne, the number of bars on one’s sleeve, and so forth. A fifth sort of implementation rule concerns a general tendency to favor some elementary models over others. For example, Market Pricing may be highly valued in some cultures as fair and reasonable while categorized as dehumanizing in others. The same is clearly true of Authority Ranking. Communal Sharing is much more prominent and generally valued in some cultures than in others. This does not mean that any culture is completely devoid of any specific elementary model but that some models are de-emphasized and marginalized in some cultures as compared to others. So the union of mod and preo may even serve to marginalize the resulting model in relation to other models.
The fact that the same mod can be united with different preos is one source of normative plurality across cultures, to be discussed in the next section. Another source is the generation of distinct compound mods. Different cultures can use different mods, since there is a considerable number of potential mods to choose from.
Each elementary model crucially enters into certain moral values. An ethic of service to one’s group is a form of Communal Sharing. It is an altruistic ethic in some sense, but bear in mind that all members of the group share a common identity. So, strictly speaking, it is not true altruism. Authority Ranking informs an ethic of obedience to authority including respect, honor, and loyalty. Any questions of value remaining to be clarified are settled by the authority; subordinates are expected to follow the values thus dictated. Fairness and even distribution are informed by Equality Matching. John Rawls’ veil of ignorance exemplifies Equality Matching; a perspective in which one does not know which role one will play guarantees that one aim for equality. Gregory Vlastos has even attempted to reduce all distributive justice to a framework that can be identified with Equality Matching. Market Pricing informs libertarian values of freely entering into contracts and taking risks with the aim of increasing one’s own utility or the utility of one’s group. But this also includes suffering the losses when one’s calculations prove incorrect. Utilitarianism is a somewhat counterintuitive attempt to extend this sort of morality to all sentient life, but is still recognizable as Market Pricing. It would be too simple, however, to say that there are only four sorts of values in RMT. In fact, combinations of models yield complex models, resulting in a potential infinity of complex values. Potential variety is further increased by the variability of possible preos. This great variety of values leads to value conflicts most noticeably across cultures.
RMT strongly suggests value pluralism, in Isaiah Berlin’s sense of “pluralism”. The pluralism in question is a cultural pluralism, different traditions producing mutually incommensurable values. Berlin drew a distinction between relativism and pluralism, even though there are strong similarities between the two. Relativism and pluralism both acknowledge values which are incommensurable, meaning that they cannot be reconciled and that there is no absolute or objective way to judge between them. Pluralism, however, acknowledges empathy and emotional understanding across cultures. Even if one does not accept the values of another culture, one still has an emotional understanding of how such values could be adopted. This stands in contrast to relativism, as defined by Berlin. If relativism is true, then there can be no emotional understanding of alien values. One understands the value system of an alien culture in essentially the same manner as one understands the behavior of ants or, for that matter, the behavior of tectonic plates; it is a purely causal understanding. It is the emotionally remote understanding of the scientist rather than the empathic understanding of someone engaging, say, with the poetry and theatre of another culture. Adopting RMT, pluralism seems quite plausible. Given that one has the mental capacity to generate the relevant model, one can replicate the alien value in oneself. One is not simply thinking about the foreigner’s relational model, but using one’s shared human nature to produce that same model in oneself. This does not, however, mean that one adopts that value, since one can also retain the conflicting model characteristic of one’s own culture. One’s decisive motivation may still flow wholly from the latter.
But the significance of RMT for the debate over pluralism and absolutism may be more complex than indicated above. Since RMT incorporates the view that people perceive social relationships as intrinsic values, this may indicate that a society which fosters interactions and relationships is absolutely better than one which divides and atomizes, at least along that one dimension. This may be an element of moral absolutism in RMT, and it is interesting to see how it is to be reconciled with any pluralism also implied.
The examples of embedding in Section 1.d. not only illustrate the productivity of social-relational cognition, but also its systematicity. To speak of the systematicity of thought means that the ability to think a given thought renders probable the ability to think a semantically close thought. The ability to conceive of Authority Ranking embedding Market Pricing makes it highly likely that one can conceive of Market Pricing embedding Authority Ranking. One finds productivity and systematicity in language as well. Any phrase can be embedded in a superordinate phrase. For example, the determiner phrase [the water] is embedded in the prepositional phrase [in [the water]], and the prepositional phrase [in [the water]] is embedded in the determiner phrase [the fish [in [the water]]]. The in-principle absence of limit here means that the number of phrases is infinite. Further, the ability to parse (or understand) a phrase renders very probable the ability to parse (or understand) a semantically close phrase. For example, being able to mentally process Plato did trust Socrates makes it likely that one can process Socrates did trust Plato as well as Plato did trust Plato and Socrates did trust Socrates. Productivity and systematicity, either in language or in social-relational cognition, constitute a strong inductive argument for a combinatorial operation that respects semantic relations. (The operation respects semantic relations, given that the meaning of a generated compound is a function of the meanings of its constituents and their arrangement.) In other words, it is an argument for digital computation.
This is essentially Noam Chomsky’s argument for a computational procedure explaining syntax (insofar as syntax is not idiomatic). It is also essentially Jerry Fodor’s argument for computational procedures constituting thought processes more generally. That digital computation underlies both complex social-relational cognition and language raises important questions. Are all mental processes largely computational or might language and social-relational cognition be special cases? Do language and social-relational cognition share the same computational mechanism or do they each have their own? What are the constraints on computation in either language or social-relational cognition?
Chomsky has noted the discrete infinity of language. Each phrase consists of a number of constituents which can be counted using natural numbers (discreteness), and there is no longest phrase meaning that the set of all possible phrases is infinite. Analogous points apply to social-relational cognition. The number of instances of an elementary mod within any mod can be counted using natural numbers. In the case discussed earlier in which a customer is ordering food from a waiter, there is one instance of Authority Ranking embedded in one instance of Market Pricing. The total number of instances is two, a natural number. There is no principled upper limit on the number of embeddings, hence infinity. The discrete infinity of language and social-relational cognition is tantamount to their productivity.
However, some philosophers, especially Jerrold Katz, have argued that nothing empirical can exhibit discrete infinity. Something empirical may be continuously infinite, such as a volume of space containing infinitely many points. But the indefinite addition of constituent upon constituent has no empirical exemplification. Space-time, if it were finite in this sense, would contain only finite energy and a finite number of particles. There are not infinitely many objects, as discrete infinity would imply. On this reasoning, the discrete infinity of an entity can only mean that the entity exists beyond space and time, still assuming that space-time is finite. This would mean that sentences, and by similar reasoning compound mods as well, are abstract objects rather than neural features or processes. This would mean that mods and sentences are abstract objects like numbers. One finds here a kind of Platonism, Platonism here defined as the view that there are abstract objects.
As a tentative reply, one could say that the symbols generated by a computational system are potentially infinite in number, but this raises questions about the nature of potentiality. What is a merely potential mod or a merely potential sentence? It is not something with any spatiotemporal location or any causal power. Perhaps it is sentence types (as contrasted with tokens) that exhibit discrete infinity. And likewise with mods, it is mod types that exhibit discrete infinity. But here too, one is appealing to entities, namely types, that have no spatiotemporal location or causal power. By definition, these are abstract objects.
The case for Platonism is perhaps stronger for compound mods, but one could also defend the same conclusion with regard to the elementary mods. Each elementary mod, as noted earlier, corresponds to one of the classic measurement scales. Different scale types are presupposed by different logics. Classical two-valued logic presupposes a nominal scale, as illustrated by the law of excluded middle: a statement is either on the truth scale, in which case it is true, or off the scale, in which case it is false. Alternatively, one could posit two categories, one for true and one for false, and stipulate that any statement belongs on one scale or the other. Fuzzy logics conceive truth either in terms of interval scales, for example, it is two degrees more true that Michel is bald than that Van is bald, or in terms of ratio scales, for example, it is 80 percent true that Van is bald, 100 percent true that Michel is bald. Even though it has perhaps not been formalized, there is intuitively a logic which presupposes an ordinal scale. A logic, say, in which it is more true that chess is a game than that Ring a Ring o’ Roses is a game, even though it would be meaningless to ask how much more. If nominal, ordinal, interval, and ratio scales are more basic than various logics, then the question arises as to whether they can seriously be considered empirical or spatiotemporal. If anything is Platonic, then something more basic than logic is likely to be Platonic. And what is an elementary mod aside from the scale type which it “resembles”? Is there any reason to distinguish the elementary mod from the scale type itself? If not, then the elementary mods themselves are abstract objects, at least on this argument.
Does reflection upon language and the relational models support a Platonist metaphysic? If so, what is one to make of the earlier discussion of RMT appealing, as it did, to neural symmetry breakings and mental computations? If mods are abstract objects, then the symmetry breakings and computations may belong to the epistemology of RMT rather than to its metaphysics. In other words, they may throw light on how one knows about mods rather than actually constituting the mods themselves. Specifically, the symmetry breaking and computations may account for the production of mental representations of mods rather than the mods themselves. But whether or not there is a good case here for Platonism is, no doubt, open to further questioning.
Middle East Technical University
Last updated: December 17, 2010 | Originally published: