The subject of Immanuel Kant’s philosophy of religion has received more attention in the beginning of the 21st century than it did in Kant’s own time. Religion was an unavoidable topic for Kant since it addresses the ultimate questions of metaphysics and morality. For, as he presents it in his Groundwork for the Metaphysics of Morals and elsewhere, the universal moral law does not entirely depend upon demonstrating the existence of God, but rather upon reason (though he believes that its source cannot be divorced from the concept of God). Nevertheless he shocks the casual reader of the First Preface of his Religion within the Boundaries of Mere Reason (hereafter Religion) by claiming that morality “inevitably leads to religion.”
Obedience to the moral law, of which Kant believes religion should be an example, appears to be an expectation that is neither universally nor willingly practiced. What is notable about the first two chapters of Religion is that he addresses this phenomenon in a manner that his Enlightenment predecessors had not: The failure of human moral agents to observe the moral law is symptomatic of a character or disposition (Gesinnung) that has been corrupted by an innate propensity to evil, which is to subordinate the moral law to self-conceit. Because this propensity corrupts an agent’s character as a whole, and is the innate “source” of every other evil deed, it may be considered “radical.” However, this propensity can be overcome through a single and unalterable “revolution” in the mode of thought (Revolution für die Denkungsart), which is simultaneously the basis for a gradual reform of character in the mode of sense (für die Sinnesart); for without the former, there is no basis for the latter. This reformation of character ultimately serves as the ground for moral agents within an ethical commonwealth, which, when understood eschatologically, is the Kingdom of God on Earth.
Kant’s account of radical evil demonstrates how evil can be a genuine moral alternative while nevertheless being an innate condition. Given the general optimism of the time, Kant’s view was revolutionary. It not only harkened back to an older Augustinian account of human nature, but also affirmed a propensity to evil within human nature using his apparatus of practical reason.
Kant’s account of radical evil in Religion must be seen within the context of his account of why, given the force of the moral law, rational beings would actually choose evil. The presence of moral evil in human beings can be explained by their possession of an innate propensity to subordinate the moral law to inclination. Of course, for Kant to even suggest that human beings have such a propensity places him at odds with the Enlightenment Zeitgeist, which saw human beings as neither wholly good nor wholly evil, but somewhere in between (“latitudinarianism”). He ultimately rejected this and in his Religion, he not only shows that a universal propensity to radical evil is possible, but also gives an account of how it is possible.
Contrary to the latitudinarianism of Jean-Jacques Rousseau and others on the subject of human nature, Kant holds to the following rigoristic thesis: Ethically, human beings are either wholly evil or wholly good by virtue of whether or not an agent has adopted the moral law as the governing maxim for all of his or her maxims (Religion 6:22-23). For either the moral law is the governing maxim for the choice of maxims or it is not; making the moral law the ground of our maxims is sufficient for moral goodness. This thesis turns on a second thesis: An individual with a morally good character or disposition (Gessinnung) has adopted a moral maxim as a governing maxim, and incorporates the moral law as a basis for choosing all other maxims. If an agent has done so, then by virtue of making all other maxims compliant with this maxim, these subsequent maxims will be consistent with the moral law. Nevertheless, when an alternative maxim—that of self-conceit—is chosen as a governing maxim, then this egoistic alternative becomes the basis for maxim choice and the moral law is subordinated to an alternative governing maxim along with every other maxim.
Consequently, the ethical choice facing the moral agent is either to subordinate all other maxims to the moral law, or to subordinate the moral law with every other maxim to an egoistic alternative. The fact is that human agents, although conscious of the moral law, nevertheless do in fact incorporate the occasional deviation from it as part of their individual maxim set. When an agent mis-subordinates the requirements of morality to the incentives of self-conceit (however small it may be), the result is radical evil (Religion 6.32).
Note that this propensity does not amount to the rejection of morality. It is in fact perfectly compatible with our acceptance of the requirements of the moral law, but only insofar as they are compatible with a maxim of inclination. But the next question, as always with Kant, must be one of possibility: how is it that radical evil is even possible for human agents?
Every human being possesses the incentive to adopt the moral law as the governing maxim for maxim choice by virtue of it having arisen out of a basic predisposition to the good. As such, an individual’s predisposition constitutes the determinate nature (Bestimmung) of a human being as a whole, of which Kant identifies three basic predispositions (Anlagen): animality (Thierheit), personality (Persönlichkeit), and humanity (Menschlichheit). They belong to us as part of our motivational DNA. By itself, a predisposition is generally not a conscious choice, but a source of motivation for choices, some of which happen to have ethical significance. The basic predispositions, taken as a whole, are considered good in the sense that, not only do they not resist the moral law, but they also demand compliance with it (Religion 6:28). For a human agent to have an original predisposition to the good yet nevertheless to be capable of evil, suggests that the possibility for the corruption of human nature is a consequence of the corruption of one of our basic predispositions.
Although it would be tempting to do so, it would be a mistake to identify the source of this corruption in our sensuous animal nature (the predisposition to animality). This predisposition concerns itself with the purely instinctual elements of the human being qua mammal: self-preservation, the sexual drive, and the desire for community. While the inclinations of animality indeed influence us ignobly, they are nevertheless necessary for every member of the species to survive and flourish. Hence human sensuality and appetite alone could hardly make human beings radically evil. As Kant states (Religion 6:35): “For not only do [the natural inclinations] bear no direct relation to evil . . . we also cannot presume ourselves responsible for their existence (we cannot because as connatural to us, natural inclinations do not have us for their author).”
Yet neither can our predisposition to personality be identified with our moral corruption, since Kant attributes to personality the capacity not only to grasp but also to determine the maxims that are morally required of us as universal legislation. For unlike the predisposition to animality, the predisposition to personality shares, with humanity, the property of rationality. The incentive to follow the moral law thus requires a distinct predisposition, so that the moral law can be an incentive given “from within” that stands in contrast to a circumstantially dependent happiness. It is the “highest incentive” (Religion 6:26n) by which we both grasp and choose the moral law, and it provides the basis for our personhood, if not our accountability. For this reason radical evil cannot constitute a “corruption of the morally legislative reason” (Religion 6:35).
This leaves humanity as the remaining basic predisposition susceptible to corruption. Although it shares the property of rationality with the predisposition to personality, humanity is distinct by virtue of the fact that it is concerned with the practical and therefore calculative elements of life. Yet this basic predisposition also possesses the inclination to seek equality in the eyes of others and to determine whether or not one is happy by comparison with others (Religion 6:26-27). It is manifestly egocentric since it relates to others in terms of its concern for happiness. Yet it is not by itself evil. Rather, it is from these positive characteristics within our predisposition of humanity that evil becomes a possibility and constitutes a propensity to egoistic and malignant self-love as self-conceit.
Once Kant is able to show how radical evil, as an innate condition, is possible the question becomes: How can evil, insofar as it rests on a propensity, constitute a genuine choice? In many ways, this question appears to be the essential problem for Kant’s ethics, since he believes that rational moral agency entails not only the capacity to know but also to obey the moral law.
Generally speaking, a propensity (Hang) is an innate yet non-necessary feature of every person that serves as a motivation for action in distinctively human affairs. However, unlike a basic predisposition (e.g., humanity, animality, and personality), a propensity can be represented as having been acquired by habit if it is good, or if it is evil, as having been self-inflicted (Religion 6:29). It demonstrates a tendency to respond or act in a particular manner, either in accordance with, or in tension with the moral law. Taken together, both predispositions and propensities serve to form an individual’s mindset or character (Gessinnung), for the development of which every human being is responsible.
The obvious requirement for Kant at this stage is to give an account of the nature of the propensity to evil, which he provides in psychological terms as a disordering of incentives. As opposed to other vices, this propensity is essentially depravity, and stands in contrast to frailty (fragilitas) and moral impurity (impuritas, improbitas). Depravity or perversity (perversitas), unlike frailty, is not mere weakness and an inability to resist sensuous inclination (Religion 6:29). And unlike impurity, it is more than merely obeying the moral law from alternative motivations (instead of a sense of duty). Instead, depravity must be understood as the reversal of “the ethical order as regards the incentives of a free power of choice” (Religion 6:30). The propensity to evil becomes manifest when human beings choose to act (Willkür) in accordance with the incentive of self-conceit, which stands in opposition to the incentive of the moral law. (Religion 6:36).
Yet merely possessing the propensity to self-conceit does not by itself make an agent evil, since a moral agent already possesses both the incentive of the moral law and that of self-conceit within that agent’s hierarchy of maxims. An agent’s moral character as a whole is determined ultimately by which maxim is going to be the dominant maxim for the choice of maxims. Yet, because both cannot fulfill this role, they compete with each other with the result that one is inevitably “subordinated to the other” (Religion 6:36). An evil character results when the moral agent makes the satisfaction of the moral law as the basis for maxim choice (Willkür) conditional to the incentives of self love (understood as self-conceit) and their inclinations (Religion 6:36). And so, what makes for an evil character is deviating from the moral law as the basis for maxim choice and adopting self-conceit in its place (Religion 6:29).
Note that for Kant, the faculty of volition or desire, or freedom of the will (Wille), has two different senses, a broad sense and a narrow sense. In the narrow sense (as Wille) it refers to the practical will that formulates laws as the “faculty of desire whose inner determining ground, hence even what pleases it, lies within the subject’s [practical] reason.” Practical will is considered in relation to the ground determining the choice of action (Metaphysics of Morals, 6:213), and through it an agent formulates both hypothetical and categorical imperatives. Practical will stands in contrast with executive will (Willkür), which is the power of choice (together with which it forms the will in the broad sense) to choose, decide, wish, and formulate maxims presented to it by the practical will as imperatives. Hence, whether or not an agent is wholly good or evil is determined entirely by “a free power of choice (Willkür) and this power . . . on the basis of its maxims [which] must reside in the subjective ground of the possibility of the deviation of the maxims from the moral law” (Religion 6:29).
Thus, either the incentive of the moral law or the incentive of egoistic self-conceit is sufficient for the agent to be either morally good or morally evil. When the propensity to subordinate the moral law to the governing maxim of self-conceit is taken up within the mindset or disposition (Gesinnung) as a governing maxim, the agent’s character as a whole is corrupted and becomes radically evil.
The propensity to evil is affirmed by Kant as a universal yet non-necessary feature of every human being. However, he appears to believe that its universal quality entails that there is no need for proof of its innateness. As he states: “We can spare ourselves the formal proof that there must be such a corrupt propensity rooted in the human being, in view of the multitude of woeful examples that the experience of human deeds parades before us” (Religion 6:33). Such examples are obvious simply from an examination of history and anthropology (Religion 6:33-34). The fact that Kant raises the possibility of a formal proof for the innateness of this propensity while declining to give one raises the question: What is the basis for characterizing this propensity as innate?
One view is that radical evil may be cast in terms of what Kant has identified as “unsociable sociality” (ungesellige Geselligkeit; “The Idea for a Universal History from a Cosmopolitan Point of View” 8:20). It arises within the human agent from interactions within society, and its demonstration need not appeal to a litany of human evils from which to derive an inductive proof. Instead, all that is necessary is an examination of the predisposition to humanity. Recall that by virtue of this predisposition, we possess a natural tendency not only to compare ourselves with others, but to compete with each other as a means of deriving our own self-worth. From our social interactions, we learn to give preference to our own concerns and needs, or self-conceit (Religion 6:26-27). This unsociable sociality becomes manifest in our tendency to exempt ourselves from the moral law while expecting others to follow it, treating others as means to our ends rather than as ends. And so, in human competitiveness we seek to compare and gain mastery over others, making our own preferences the basis for our governing maxim.
The source of this feature of the basic predisposition to humanity manifests itself in natural and self-aggrandizing human competitiveness. It originates out of the company of other human beings who mutually corrupt one another’s moral predispositions (Religion 6:93-94). Hence, by virtue of living in community and in our need for sociality, the shortcomings of our basic predisposition to humanity accounts for our self-conceit. Our social interactions serve as a kind of breeding ground for radical evil.
Our natural tendencies not only to compare ourselves with others, but to compete with them as a means for deriving our own self-worth, can be demonstrated through the study of anthropology. However this interpretation does not entail that Kant thinks that the individual is absolved of responsibility. Evil remains a deed that is the product of an individual’s capacity for choice, and for this reason the individual still retains the responsibility for its commission. Even if we claim that we are not guilty of a particular social evil (e.g., slavery or the Holocaust), on account of having been caught up in the “spirit of the age,” then inasmuch as we are participants, we are still guilty.
Thus on this first view, the propensity to evil is simply part of our nature as social beings and is aggravated by our proximity to each other, the existence of which is evident from an observation of unsociable sociability when, and where it occurs in human society. It is a universal feature shared by every human being, yet it does not require holding that each individual necessarily possesses this feature.
The alternative view for the basis for the propensity’s innateness is that the subordination of the moral law to the incentive of self-conceit is an entirely timeless and intelligible “deed” (That). This wholly intelligible act is so called because it does not take place at any one point in time, but it is nevertheless the deed out of which all subsequent evil deeds arise. It is, as Kant states, the “subjective determining ground of the power of choice that precedes every deed, and is itself not yet a deed” (Religion 6:31).
In making this claim, Kant follows the more Pietist (or less orthodox Lutheran) theologians of his day who broke from an Augustinian approach towards human evil or sin, claiming that each agent is alone responsible for its own evil. Adam and Eve were responsible for their own sin, and all subsequent human beings have followed their example in disobedience to the moral law (Religion 6:42-43). Human beings, then, approach their empirical circumstances having always already chosen the maxim by which they will act, and so subordinate the moral law to the incentive of self-conceit.
An a priori proof for the innate source of this radical evil can easily be drawn out through an examination of Kant’s observation in the Critique of Practical Reason that the moral law strikes down this incentive. Here he states that only two propensities are applicable to beings capable of apprehending the moral law: to follow the moral law either gladly (gern) or reluctantly (ungern; Critque of Practical Reason 5:82). Whether or not the moral law is followed gladly or reluctantly is in part a function of its ability to generate respect, which serves as an incentive for its adoption. As an incentive, the moral law competes with inclination for acceptance by the practical will, against which inclination sometimes wins. Viewed positively: Respect for the moral law, while illuminating to a certain extent our limitations, also reveals our dignity as rational beings. However, the incentive of respect for the moral law competes with sensuous inclinations which arise out of self-regard (Selbstsucht, solipsismus; Critique of Practical Reason 5:73).
Note that for Kant self-regard is a complex phenomenon. As a rational and guided concern for one’s own livelihood and well being (Eigenliebe, philautia; Critique of Practical Reason 5:74) self-regard constitutes a healthy benevolence towards ourselves. For “we find our nature as sensible beings so constituted that the matter of the faculty of desire (objects of inclination, whether of hope or fear) first forces itself upon us” (Critique of Practical Reason 5:74). However, self-regard also subsumes a more malignant form of self-concern, that of self-conceit (Eigendünkel, arrogantia), in which the “pathologically determinable self” desires “to make its claims primary and originally valid, just as if it constituted our entire self” (Critique of Practical Reason 5:74). In the language of Religion, a healthy self-regard is mechanical self-love, that is an extension of the predisposition to animality in the human being. It is a kind of self-concern for which no reason is required, but it is not immune to the plentitude of vices, including gluttony, lust, and “wild lawlessness” (Religion 6:26-27). But mechanical self-love is entirely different from the malignant self-regard that is self-conceit, which, in conflict with the moral law, arrogantly “prescribes the subjective conditions of [self-love] as laws” (Critique of Practical Reason 5:74).
So, while the moral agent recognizes the requirements of the moral law and wishes to practice self-restraint by virtue of its normative requirements, the moral law is neither universally adopted nor gladly accepted in all cases and at all times. The fact that the moral law does not merely infringe “upon our self-conceit,” but “humiliates every human being when he compares with it the sensible propensity of his nature,” illustrates that this malignant condition is as unavoidable as it is universal (Critique of Practical Reason 5:74).
To return to the issue of radical evil in the Religion, human beings are generally susceptible to natural inclinations that never actually agree with the dictates of the moral law. Rather than naturally possessing a propensity to follow the moral law, humans instead possess a propensity to follow their own self-serving inclinations. Since, as we saw earlier, human beings are wholly good or evil by virtue of whether or not they choose a moral governing maxim or an egoistic alternative at the top of their hierarchy of maxims, this propensity must be evil and imputable to human nature.
Although Kant, for the most part, dedicates only the first two chapters of the Religion to radical evil, he anticipates some of its issues in the Groundwork for the Metaphysics of Morals (as heteronomy), in the Critique of Practical Reason, and in the Metaphysics of Morals. He dedicates the remaining two books of Religion to cultivating the idea of an ethical community which requires as a necessary condition for participation that an individual possesses a disposition transformed by a “revolution.” While the revolution may be characterized as a singular event, it is also the first step in a new life of unending progress toward goodness (Religion 6:67). Only through a revolution can an individual claim to have acquired a “holy will.” The “Kingdom of God on earth,” or the ethical commonwealth, is composed of individuals who have recognized both this need for a revolution and the primacy of the moral law as their governing maxim (Religion 6:95 ff).
While radical evil must be understood in terms of a propensity that is as inexplicable as it is universal, it is nevertheless “imputed to us” as a disposition (Religion 6.43). How we come to choose a good disposition (and overcome evil), is equally unfathomable. The difficulty lies in the fact that acquiring such a disposition cannot merely be a matter of a resolution to try harder next time (though such resolve is of some merit). Nor is a mere change in the habitual practice of virtues sufficient by itself to acquire a good character because the disposition remains corrupted in the midst of such efforts. The only solution is to undergo a revolution in our “mode of thought” (Denkungsart; Religion 6:47). Acquiring an original goodness that constitutes “holiness of maxims” is the acquisition of a disposition in compliance with our duty to the maxim of obedience to the moral law and serves as the basis for our subsequent maxims (Religion 6:47). It should be noted that Kant’s use of ‘revolution’ should not be confused with a social or political revolution, since this would ultimately lead to the Terror witnessed in the French Revolution.
The acquisition of the holy disposition through such a revolution requires that we take up the disposition of the human personification of the holy will, present to us in our reason as the archetype of moral perfection. To elevate ourselves to this ideal of moral perfection constitutes our universal human duty (Religion 6:61-62). Kant identifies the historical human personification of this archetype as the “Son of God.” This individual is described in religious terms as the one who has “descended from Heaven,” whom we come to believe in through “practical faith.” When an agent acquires this disposition, then that agent, by emulating it, may be considered as “not an unworthy object of divine pleasure” (Religion 6:62). We are no longer subject to suffering the moral consequences of our own sin or debt. Yet we are nevertheless obliged to continue to experience the consequences of the life lived prior to the revolution (Religion 6:75n). Indeed, according to Kant, to undergo suffering as the consequence of a “pre-conversion” life is consistent with his views about the development of a good character (Religion 6:69).
The revolution, then, is not merely an intellectual undertaking. It also involves a practical and continual process of reformation of maxims in accordance with the newly acquired governing maxim of “holiness of maxims.” An intelligible (Denkungsart) revolution takes place when a human being makes a singular decision which instantaneously reverses “the supreme ground of his maxims” (Religion 6:48), and precedes a gradual empirical (Sinnesart) reformation of character. The former is the volitional overcoming of the propensity to evil that serves as a basis for maxim choice, a mode that is distinct from that of the empirical reformation (for Kant, they are in fact, two sides of the same coin). For, once an individual has experienced this inner revolution, “he is a good human being only in incessant laboring and becoming, i.e. he can hope – in view of the purity of the principle – to find himself upon the good (though narrow) path of constant progress from bad to better” (Religion 6:48).
The operative in question here is that of “manifestation of the good principle,” or “humanity in its moral perfection,” as displayed in the disposition of the Son of God in history (Religion 6:77). Our acquisition of a renewed disposition requires a kind of moral habituation. It is a disposition that results from adopting holiness of maxims as a governing maxim, and subsequently not only serves to systematically root out vice, but aids in the resolution to resist backsliding from temptation—because for Kant, ought implies can. It involves a commitment to the struggle to restructure one’s incentives from top to bottom, as it were, from self-conceit towards virtue; it is to begin to fulfill one’s duties from duty itself.
We may note that by means of this revolution, moral reform does carry with it a degree of uncertainty as to whether or not we will succeed. Hope for success rests on considering our efforts from the divine perspective. For, from this perspective, what matters is a change of heart, or the acquisition of a transformed moral disposition or character. Through such a change, Kant says, “in the sight of the divine judge for whom the disposition takes the place of the deed,” the agent is morally “another being” (Religion 6:74). Because one who has taken on the disposition of the archetype of humanity has become a new creation, the disposition of the personified archetype comes to be considered a kind of work “imputed to us by grace” (Religion 6:75-76). At the same time, Kant also appears to recognize that, in practical terms and from the human perspective, we might need reassurance that our efforts are successful.
On this matter, Kant appears to offer some consolation using the distinction between “narrow” and “perfect” duties on the one hand, and “wide” or “imperfect” duties on the other (Groundwork for the Metaphysics of Morals, 4:424). Narrow or perfect duties clearly constitute tasks that we are required to do or accomplish and are therefore exact in their stipulation. On the other hand, a wide or imperfect duty is one such that, although we are required to strive for it, is not something that we can be expected to attain. Holiness of will is such a duty. For while holiness is narrow and perfect—and constitutes a qualitative ideal—practically considered, it can only be considered a wide duty “because of the frailty (fragilitas) of human nature.” That is: “It is a human being’s duty to strive for this perfection, but not to reach it . . . and his compliance with this duty can, accordingly consist only in continual progress” (The Metaphysics of Morals 6:446). Holiness of will is for us such an ideal, the fulfillment of which we cannot be certain of attaining in this lifetime
Kant’s account of radical evil as a propensity has received much discussion at the turn of the twenty-first century and has generated a fair degree of controversy. One criticism is that he does not allow for the possibility of diabolical evil. A second is that, while Kant is committed to holding that the propensity to evil is universal, his positions on the revolution fail to properly allow for the possibility of grace, the doctrine that God is able to act in human affairs and effect change within a person’s moral disposition. This paper does not attempt to adjudicate between these two concerns, and they do not affect the main thesis that for Kant, evil is largely a moral category, present universally in human beings as a propensity to self-conceit that influences the adoption of maxims.
Erik M. Hanson
University of Colorado
U. S. A.
Last updated: December 14, 2012 | Originally published: