Rāmānuja (c. 1017 - c. 1137)
Rāmānuja (ācārya), the eleventh century South Indian philosopher, is the chief proponent of Viśiṣṭādvaita, which is one of the three main forms of the Orthodox Hindu philosophical school, Vedānta. As the prime philosopher of the Viśiṣṭādvaita tradition, Rāmānuja is one of the Indian philosophical tradition’s most important and influential figures. He was the first Indian philosopher to provide a systematic theistic interpretation of the philosophy of the Vedas, and is famous for arguing for the epistemic and soteriological significance of bhakti, or devotion to a personal God. Unlike many of his contemporaries, Rāmānuja defended the reality of a plurality of individual persons, qualities, values and objects while affirming the substantial unity of all. On some accounts, Rāmānuja’s influence on popular Hindu practice is so vast that his system forms the basis for popular Hindu philosophy. His two main philosophical writings (the Śrī Bhāṣya and Vedārthasaṅgraha) are amongst the best examples of rigorous and energetic argumentation in any philosophical tradition, and they are masterpieces of Indian scholastic philosophy.
Table of Contents
- Rāmānuja's Life and Works
- Rāmānuja's Cosmology and Metaphysics
- Negative Philosophical Criticisms of Bhedābheda and Advaita Vedānta
- Substantive Theses
- Hermeneutic Criticism
- Rāmānuja's Theism
- Rāmānuja's Soteriology
- Rāmānuja's Epistemology
- Rāmānuja's Ethics
- Interpreting Rāmānuja: the Northern and Southern Schools and the Authenticity of the Gadyas
- Conclusion: Rāmānuja's Place in the History of Indian Philosophy
- References and Further Readings
On traditional accounts, Rāmānuja lived the unusually long life of 120 years (twice the average lifespan at the time), from 1017 to 1137 C.E., though recent scholarship places his life between 1077 to 1157 C.E., with a life of 80 years (Carman p.27). He was born in the Southern, Tamil speaking region of India, in the small township of Śrīperumbūdur on the outskirts of modern day Chennai (Madras) into a family that hailed from a subclass of Brahmins (the Hindu priestly caste) known for their scholarship and learning in the Vedas. His family was likely bilingual, fluent in both the local vernacular (Tamil) and the language of scholarship (Sanskrit). From a young age he is reputed to have displayed a prodigious intellect and liberal attitudes towards caste. At this time he became friendly with a local, saintly Sudra (member of the servile caste) by the name of Kāñcīpurna, whose occupation it was to perform services for the local temple idol of the Hindu deity Vishnu. Rāmānuja admired Kāñcīpurna's piety and devotion to Vishnu and sought Kāñcīpurna as his guru-much to the horror of Kāñcīpurna who regarded Rāmānuja's humility before him as an affront to caste propriety.
Shortly after being married in his teenage years, and after his father passed away, Rāmānuja and his family moved to the neighboring city of Kāñcīpuram. There Rāmānuja found his first formal teacher, Yādavaprakāśa, who was an accomplished professor of the form of the Vedānta philosophy that was in vogue at the time-a form of Vedānta that has strong affinities to Śaṅkara's Absolute Idealistic Monism (Advaita Vedānta) but was also close to the Difference-and-non-difference view (Bhedābheda Vedānta). ("Vedānta" means the 'end of the Vedas' and refers to the philosophy expressed in the end portion of the Vedas, also known as the Upaniṣads, and encoded in the cryptic summary by Bādarāyaṇa called the Vedānta Sūtra or Brahma Sūtra. The perennial questions of Vedānta are: what is the nature of Brahman, or the Ultimate, and what is the relationship between the multiplicity of individuals to this Ultimate. Vedānta comprises one of the six orthodox schools of Hindu philosophy.)
At first Yādavaprakāśa was thrilled to receive a talented and intelligent student of the likes of Rāmānuja. But disagreements between the two, on the proper interpretation of the Upaniṣads, soon broke out. Yādavaprakāśa favored an amoral, impersonal, non-theistic interpretation of the Upaniṣads. Rāmānuja, in contrast, favored a theistic interpretation of the Upaniṣads that placed a premium on the aesthetic and moral excellences of Brahman. Yādavaprakāśa found Rāmānuja's skill at offering alternative interpretations threatening both to his authority and the popularity of his philosophy. He thus hatched a plan, with some of his other students, to murder Rāmānuja while on a pilgrimage. Rāmānuja however got word of the plan from his classmate and cousin (Govinda) and escaped from the pilgrimage with his life. Rāmānuja (surprisingly) did not make public his knowledge of the failed assassination attempt and resumed classes with Yādavaprakāśa when he returned to Kāñcīpuram. Yādavaprakāśa for his part did not reveal his complicity in the plot to take Rāmānuja's life, and feigned happiness at continuing to be his teacher. Not too long afterwards, however, Yādavaprakāśa ordered Rāmānuja to leave his school, after a final disagreement on the interpretation of scripture occurred.
Without a teacher, Rāmānuja returned dejected to his childhood mentor, Kāñcīpurna, who assured him that a teacher would come his way. For the time being, Kāñcīpurna instructed Rāmānuja to help him in his manual service to the temple idol of Vishnu.
At the same time Yamuna, the spiritual head of the fledgling Tamil Vaiṣṇava (Vishnu worshiping) community, was near the end of his life and in search of a successor. This community, known as the Śrī Vaiṣṇava Sampradāya, was formed around the memory of the Four Thousand Tamil Verses (Nālāyira Divya Prabhandam) of twelve Tamil Vaiṣṇava saints (Āḻvārs), renowned for their devotional poetry on Vishnu. While it had a modest popular base, it lacked a formal and legitimizing articulation in the Sanskrit academic community. Though a competent and accomplished philosopher in his own right who authored the impressive Siddhi Trayam, Yamuna came into the fold too late in his life to fully articulate the philosophy of Śrī Vaiṣṇavas to the pan-Indian academic community. He thus held out the hope that Rāmānuja would, amongst other things, take up the task of articulating the philosophical ethos of the tradition that had been entrusted to him, in the form of a formal, Sanskrit commentary on the Brahma Sūtra (the cryptic summary of the philosophical purport of the Upaniṣads). Upon finding out that Rāmānuja had been freed from ties to Yādavaprakāśa, and had returned to the company of Kāñcīpurna (himself a member of Yamuna's Śrī Vaiṣṇava community) Yamuna was overjoyed and sent word to Rāmānuja to come and take up the post as his successor. Yamuna however died just before Rāmānuja could reach him, and once again Rāmānuja found himself without the teacher he had been searching for.
After Rāmānuja had gained his composure, he made his way over to the crowd centered on Yamuna's new corpse. He noted that three fingers of Yamuna’s were curled. Yamuna's senior disciples explained to Rāmānuja that they likely represented three wishes of Yamuna, one of which being that a commentary on the Brahma Sūtra should be written. When Rāmānuja pledged to try to fulfill those wishes, the fingers uncurled. The crowd took this as a sign that Rāmānuja was the heir apparent of Yamuna. Rāmānuja was however vexed at the local temple idol of Vishnu for not even allowing him a brief meeting with Yamuna, and would not formally join the community for nearly a year.
When Rāmānuja did decide to formally join the Śrī Vaiṣṇava fold, Yamuna's senior disciple, Mahāpūrṇa, supervised his initiation. For a matter of six months, Rāmānuja had found himself the teacher he was looking for in the form of Mahāpūrṇa. Under Mahāpūrṇa, Rāmānuja learned the verses of the Tamil Vaiṣṇava saints. However, his learning under Mahāpūrṇa came to an abrupt end when Rāmānuja's wife picked a fight with Mahāpūrṇa’s wife, on the premise that the latter was a member of a lower Brahmanic subcaste. Upon hearing this, the hurt Mahāpūrṇa and his wife departed from Rāmānuja's company without notice. Rāmānuja, once again lost his teacher. But this was not the first time that Rāmānuja's wife had interfered with his spiritual development.
At an earlier point, Rāmānuja had invited his childhood mentor, Kāñcīpurna, for a meal. Rāmānuja had hoped to partake of Kāñcīpurna's leavings as a sacrament. However, Kāñcīpurna arrived early in absence of Rāmānuja. Rāmānuja's wife fed Kāñcīpurna, sent him off, and ritually purified the dining area, by, amongst other things, discarding Kāñcīpurna's leftovers.
Having lost the benefits of a teacher twice over as a result of his wife's caste-pretensions, Rāmānuja was incensed. He thus sent his wife back to her natal home, and promptly became a renounciate (saṃnyāsin). He earned the title "king of ascetics (yatirāja) from the temple deity of Vishnu speaking through Kāñcīpurna at this point.
Rāmānuja's separation from his wife and his initiation into the order of ascetics marks the beginning of his career as an independent and self-assured philosopher. He traveled around India and participated in public debates with exponents of rival philosophies. Many of the philosophers that Rāmānuja defeated became prominent disciples in his fold. Rāmānuja standardized and reformed temple worship in those Vaiṣṇava temples that he gained control over (often through winning debates with the custodians of the temple). To this day his instructions are the norm of Śrī Vaiṣṇava temple and home worship in India and abroad.
The Śrī Vaiṣṇava tradition is unanimous in holding that Rāmānuja authored nine, and only nine, works: all in Sanskrit. While Rāmānuja is reported by the writings of his disciples to have lectured in Tamil on the verses of the Tamil Vaiṣṇava saints, he left no writings on their work, and no explicit mention of them in his writings. At first glance, this seems remarkable, given that the Divya Prabhandam is regarded by the Śrī Vaiṣṇava tradition, as the Tamil equivalent of the Vedas. However, Rāmānuja's silence on the Āḻvārs in his Sanskrit writings may have been a result of his aim as philosopher to not preach to the converted, but to articulate his philosophy to the pan-Indian academic community.
Rāmānuja's first work was likely the Vedārthasaṅgraha ('Summary of the Meaning of the Vedas'). It sets out Rāmānuja’s philosophy, which is theistic (it affirms a morally perfect, omniscient and omnipotent God) and realistic (it affirms the existence and reality of a plurality of qualities, persons and objects). This work is referred to several times in Rāmānuja's magnum opus, his commentary on the Brahma Sūtra, the Śrī Bhāṣya (also known as his Brahma Sūtra Bhāṣya). This is the work that Rāmānuja is best known by outside of the Śrī Vaiṣṇava tradition. In addition to this large commentary on the Brahma Sūtra, Rāmānuja apparently wrote two more shorter commentaries: Vedāntapīda, and Vedāntasāra. Aside from the Vedārthasaṅgraha and Śrī Bhāṣya, Rāmānuja's most important philosophic work is a commentary on the Bhagavad Gītā (Bhagavad Gītā Bhāṣya). In addition to these philosophic works, Rāmānuja is held by tradition to have written three prose hymns called collectively the Gadya Traya, which include the Śaraṇāgati Gadya, Śrīraṅga Gadya and the Vaikunṭḥa Gadya). The Śaraṇāgati Gadya is a dialogue between Rāmānuja and the Hindu deities Śrī (Lakṣmī) and Nārāyaṇa (Vishnu) (which jointly comprise God, or Brahman, for Rāmānuja) in which Rāmānuja surrenders himself before God and petitions Vishnu, through Lakṣmī, for his Grace. Vishnu and Lakṣmī, for their part, respond favorably to Rāmānuja's act of surrender. The Śrīraṅga Gadya is a prayer of surrender to the feet of Ranganatha. (This is Vishnu in his repose on the many headed serpent Ādi Śeṣa -'ancient servant,' ‘ancient residue,’ or ‘primeval matter'- on the milk ocean.) The Vaikunṭḥa Gadya describes in great detail the eternal realm of Vishnu, called Vaikunṭḥa, on which one should meditate in order to gain liberation. Finally Rāmānuja is held to have authored a manual of daily worship called the Nityagrantha.
The authenticity of all but the three large works attributed to Rāmānuja - Śrī Bhāṣya, Vedārthasaṅgraha and the Bhagavad Gītā Bhāṣya - have come into question in recent times. The argument against the authenticity of these texts appears to be a minority position amongst scholars. With respect to the two smaller commentaries on the Brahma Sūtra, it has been argued that they must be inauthentic, because it seems unlikely that Rāmānuja would himself have bothered to take the time to abridge his larger commentary, the Śrī Bhāṣya (cf. Buitenen p.32). With respect to the short religious works attributed to Rāmānuja, it has been argued that they present doctrines that go beyond those that are found in his major commentaries (cf. Lester p.279).
Subsequent tradition has applied the label "Viśiṣṭādvaita" to the philosophy of Rāmānuja. It is meant to contrast his philosophy from leading competing views, such as Advaita (Non-Dualist), Bhedābheda (Difference-and-non-difference) and Dvaita (Dualist) Vedānta. The term "Viśiṣṭādvaita" is often translated as 'Qualified Non-Dualism.' An alternative, and more informative, translation is "Non-duality of the qualified whole," or perhaps 'Non-duality with qualifications.” The label attempts to mark out Rāmānuja's effort to affirm the unity of the many, without giving up on the reality of distinct persons, qualities, universals, or aesthetic and moral values.
Where all versions of Vedānta intersect is in their effort to provide a consistent and defendable interpretation of the Brahma Sūtra, on philosophical and hermeneutic grounds. Given the common textual bases, there are certain doctrinal invariances amongst the various sub-schools of Vedānta.
In accordance with the Upaniṣads, the various schools of Vedānta hold that there is an ultimate entity, called Brahman, which also is referred to by scripture as "Ātman" (“Self”). The Vedānta schools recognize, in accordance with the Upaniṣads, that Brahman plays a key role in the organization of the universe. Attainment of Brahman by an individual constitutes its highest good: soteriological liberation or moḳsa.
The chief areas of disagreement amongst the various schools of Vedānta are on the nature and ontological status of individual selves, objects of cognition and Brahman, as well as the relevance and importance of ethics or duty (dharma) to the good life.
Rāmānuja's foils in the articulation of his philosophy are two forms of Vedānta that were not clearly distinguished during his day: these are the Bhedābheda view, and the Advaita philosophy. Both these views take a similar stance on the relationship of an individual's subjectivity and Brahman: on both accounts, the conscious principle of the individual is of a piece with Brahman. In the case of Advaita Vedānta, the consciousness of an individual is regarded as numerically identical with the consciousness of Brahman. On this view, the psychological ego or sense of individuality is something distinct from consciousness: it is its object. The Bhedābheda view similarly asserts the numerical identity of an individual's consciousness and Brahman, but it emphasizes that this identity is counteracted by a separating off, or differentiating effort, on the part of Brahman to compartmentalize itself and mysteriously constitute the world of plurality and difference. On this view, the individual ego is constituted by Brahman. According to the versions of Bhedābheda and Advaita that Rāmānuja was acquainted with, mere knowledge of one's identity with Brahman is sufficient to bring about liberation; works, such as ritual and moral obligations, can at best play a preparatory role in bringing an individual to the state of being desirous for liberation, but they have no intrinsic value. Corollaries of these views are the position that consciousness, and not plurality, is metaphysically fundamental; that consciousness does not require objects for its existence; that belief in plurality consists in the uncritical acceptance of ordinary experience; and that dialectical reasoning can yield substantive knowledge with practical import. On many fronts (on the reality of universals, particulars, and moral values) both the Bhedābheda Advaita schools are classic forms of anti-realism.
Students of Rāmānuja's thought may wish to know whom Rāmānuja is arguing against. In all likely hood, it is his former teacher, Yādavaprakāśa. However, Rāmānuja does not attribute the Advaita or Bhedābheda views to any particular philosopher. Rather, these views are voiced by the opponent, or the ubiquitous pūrvapakṣin , everywhere in Indian philosophy, expressing the views to be criticized.
Rāmānuja's arguments that he presents against his opponent are of roughly three varieties. Some are negative, and focus on philosophical problems of the opponent's view. Some are positive, and concern arguing for theses that Rāmānuja wishes to defend. And some arguments are hermeneutic. This last category of arguments combines criticism and positive philosophical argument, but it centers on the proper interpretation of the Vedas.
Rāmānuja criticizes many of the arguments of the Bhedābheda and Advaita views on logical grounds. These schools employed dialectical arguments that conclude on the basis of logical puzzles that arise in accounting for distinctions and difference in perception that difference (which includes the idea of a distinct quality) is an unintelligible notion. From such considerations, these philosophers would typically conclude that only undifferentiated consciousness is the real (Brahman). Rāmānuja at many points in the Śrī Bhāṣya and the Vedārthasaṅgraha attempts to argue against such views by an argument ad absurdum. Particularly, Rāmānuja argues that the arguments presented by the Bhedābheda and Advaita Vedāntins lead to intolerable contradictions and further conclusions that go against common sense. At one point he suggests that those who would make such arguments are "no better than a man who would claim that his own mother never had any children" (Śrī Bhāṣya, I.i.1. "Great Siddhānta" p.44).
Rāmānuja argues that the epistemic considerations that his opponents adduce for their positions undercut their own views. The philosophers that Rāmānuja takes aim at argue that all means of cognition involve error. Rāmānuja argues that if this is so, it follows that we could never know that all cognition involves error, for such putative knowledge would itself involve an erroneous cognition, and hence not qualify as genuine knowledge. If Rāmānuja's opponents view is correct, then it follows that some cognitions are not erroneous. But this is exactly what the disputed conclusion rules out (Śrī Bhāṣya, I.i.1. "Great Siddhānta" pp.74-78).
While the previous two strategies that Rāmānuja employs in his criticism of the Bhedābheda and Advaita views are largely negative, and involve criticizing these views on formal grounds, Rāmānuja also defends philosophical theses that these two schools rule out. The most important of these theses is the view that consciousness is always consciousness of some object distinguished by a characteristic (cf. Śrī Bhāṣya, I.i.1. "Great Siddhānta" p.53 and "Great Pūrvapakṣa" p.32). This is the doctrine known as "dharmabhūtajñāna" in the Viśiṣṭādvaita tradition (Śrīnivāsadāsa VII.2). It implies the view that all epistemic states, be it consciousness or perception, are intentional or object oriented. If it is the case that even consciousness requires an object for its existence, it follows that there can be no such thing as pure consciousness apart from difference (such as qualities, properties and objects of consciousness). Thus, on this account, if consciousness exists, it follows that difference and plurality does as well. With this one thesis, and against the backdrop of Vedāntic idealism, Rāmānuja is able to generate one limb of his organismic cosmology.
Another important substantive philosophical thesis that Rāmānuja defends is that consciousness is itself a property. To modern readers, this may seem to be a trivial point. However, it is central to the project of Rāmānuja's opponents that Brahman is the only reality, and it is a reality devoid of distinctions or qualities. Rāmānuja's opponents are happy to affirm that certain things can be said of Brahman, for instance, that it is (as affirmed in the Taittirīya Upaniṣad II.i.1.) truth (satyam) knowledge (jñānam) and infinite (anantam). However, they take the stand that these are not properties of Brahman, but the very being of Brahman (Śrī Bhāṣya, I.i.1. "Great Pūrvapakṣa" p.29). Rāmānuja, in contrast, defends the view that such attributions bring attention to the reality of Brahman's qualities (cf. Śrī Bhāṣya, I.i.1. "Great Pūrvapakṣa" p.28).
A third and important substantive thesis that Rāmānuja defends is the reality of the individual. According to Advaita Vedānta (and the Bhedābheda view to a lesser extent), the individual person, in contradistinction to other persons, is an illusion (māyā) that comes about by nescience (avidya). Rāmānuja argues that the very idea that something can be ignorant presumes that there is an individual capable of being ignorant. For all Vedāntins affirm that Brahman is of the nature of consciousness and knowledge. Hence, to say that Brahman is ignorant is absurd. If anything is subject to ignorance, it must be an individual other than Brahman. However, if this is so, then ignorance cannot be brought into explain the existence of individuals, for it presumes the existence of an individual capable of being ignorant. Rāmānuja's positive view is thus that there are, indeed, distinct individuals, many who are under the spell of ignorance. However, their individuality is ontologically and logically prior to their ignorance (Śrī Bhāṣya, I.i.1. "Great Siddhānta" p.103)
All Vedānta philosophies must turn to the Vedas, and particularly the Upaniṣads, for scriptural grounding. Hence, in criticizing his fellow Vedāntins, Rāmānuja makes use of arguments that concern the proper interpretation of scripture.
According to Rāmānuja, his opponents have failed to arrive at an interpretation of the Vedas based on all Vedic texts. Rather, they emphasize some passages that support a monistic interpretation, and ignore those passages that either presume or emphasize plurality. Rāmānuja notes that his opponents hold to the view that those Vedic texts that come later in the corpus are to be emphasized (the fact that they come later is presumed, on this account, to show that they contain the more advanced and esoteric teachings) (Śrī Bhāṣya, I.i.1. "Great Pūrvapakṣa" p.27). These, more than other portions of the Vedas, emphasize the oneness of reality with Brahman. Rāmānuja argues that even these portions of the Vedas presume and affirm plurality. Even if it were not the case that these portions of the Vedas mentioned plurality, we would have to take all the Vedas on par for Rāmānuja. According to Rāmānuja, one cannot attempt to give interpretations of isolated portions of the Vedas. Rather, one must take the Vedas as one unified corpus, aiming at the expression of a single doctrine (cf. Śrī Bhāṣya pp.92-3, I.i.1. "Great Siddhānta"). Hence, any tenable interpretation of the philosophy of the Vedas must not only affirm the reality of plurality, but also the importance of ritual and moral obligations (dharma), for these are spoken about at length in the earlier portions of the Vedas.
Even if the Vedic corpus as a whole is taken to present a single doctrine, Rāmānuja is still left with the task of accounting for how the seemingly monistic portions of the Upaniṣads are consistent with the reality of a plurality of distinct individuals. To overcome this hermeneutic hurdle, Rāmānuja introduces the doctrine of sāmānādhikaraṇya , sometimes translated as "co-ordinate predication" or “the principle of grammatical coordination” but literally meaning 'several things in a common substrate.' The etymology of the word suggests an ontological doctrine. However, Rāmānuja means to employ it as a semantic doctrine. According to Rāmānuja, "The experts on such matters define it thus: `The signification of an identical entity by several terms [śabda] which are applied to that entity on different grounds is co-ordinate predication" (Vedārthasaṅgraha §24).
In both the Śrī Bhāṣya and the Vedārthasaṅgraha, Rāmānuja draws a distinction between the object denoted by a term, and the quality that it can be identified in connection with. The possibility of using various terms with the same denotation but with different qualitative content is what Rāmānuja calls "co-ordinate predication."
The doctrine that Rāmānuja advances under the heading of co-ordinate predication strikingly anticipates the Fregean distinction between sense and reference. In the writings of Rāmānuja, the doctrine is used to interpret monistic passages of the Vedas in a manner that affirms both the unity of the thing designated, via the coreferentiality of the various terms, while affirming that the various terms bring to the sentence an emphasis on distinct properties of the unitary thing so identified. With respect to the famous formula "that thou art" (tat tvam asi) from the Chandyoga Upaniṣad (which Advaitins quote as support for the absolute identity of the individual's self with Brahman), Rāmānuja understands the indexicals "that" and “thou” as signifying an underlying unity, while containing distinct qualitative content. Hence, "that" in this context, brings to fore the quality of the underlying substantial unity of all individuals in Brahman, while "thou" emphasize that we, as individuals, are qualities or distinctions in this underlying unity (Śrī Bhāṣya, I.i.1. "Great Siddhānta" pp.129-39).
Even if the doctrine of co-ordinate predication is granted, there is yet another hermeneutic hurdle for Rāmānuja to contend with: this is the Upaniṣadic equation of Brahman (the Ultimate) with Ātman (or Self). If the Ultimate and the Self are one, then it would seem that there is no room for the existence of a plurality of individual persons. The problem might be solved by denying that "Ātman" means self, but this would be to stipulate a meaning for the word "Ātman" that it does not have in Sanskrit or Vedic. Rāmānuja's solution to this problem is the cosmological doctrine of śarīra and śarīrī (body and soul), or śeṣa and śeṣin (dependant and dependant upon). According to Rāmānuja, Brahman is the Self of all. However, this is not because our individual personhood is identical with the personhood of Brahman, but because we, along with all individuals, constitute modes or qualities of the body of Brahman. Thus, Brahman stands to all others as the soul or mind stands to its body. The metaphysical model that Rāmānuja thus argues for is at once cosmological in nature, and organic. All individuals are Brahman by virtue of constituting its body, but all individuals retain an identity in contradistinction to other parts of Brahman, particularly the soul of Brahman.
In accordance with much of the monism of Upaniṣadic passages, Rāmānuja maintains that there is a way in which the individual self (jīva, or jīvātman) is identical with the Ultimate Self (Ātman or Paramātman). This is in our natures. According to Rāmānuja, each jīva shares with Brahman an essential nature of being a knower. However, due to beginningless past actions (karma) our true nature (as being knowers and dependants upon Brahman) are obscured from us. Moreover, our sharing this nature in no way implies that we have the same relationship to other things (Śrī Bhāṣya, I.i.1. "Great Siddhānta" pp.99-102). In other words, our likeness in one respect with Brahman does not imply that we ourselves are either omnipotent, omniscient or all good.
In contrast to preceding commentators on the Brahma Sūtra, Rāmānuja's version of Vedānta is explicitly theistic. Brahman as Ātman (the Highest Self of all) is the union of two deities: Vishnu, or Nārāyaṇa, and His Consort Śrī, or Lakṣmī. (In Hinduism, Vishnu is the God who upholds and preserves all things, while Lakṣmī is the Goddess of prosperity.) The unity of both the father (Vishnu) and mother (Lakṣmī) element in Brahman is essential to Rāmānuja. It is a consequence of the view that Brahman is ubhayaliṅgam, or having both sexes: this accounts for Brahman's creative potency. According to Rāmānuja, Brahman (considered as the Ātman) is antagonistic to all evil lacks all faults (pāpam, heya, mala or doṣa), and is comprised of innumerable auspicious qualities (kalyāṇaguṇa ): these auspicious qualities are both moral and aesthetic (Vedārthasaṅgraha §§ 2, 6, 9, 19, 92, 112, 147, 161, 163, 198, 234, Śrī Bhāṣya, I.i.1. pp.5, 80, 89, 92, 94, 125, 132, 133, 136, 144, I.i.2. p. 157, I.i.4. p.201, Bhagavad Gītā Bhāṣya I. Intro, IX.34, to name just a few references-Rāmānuja never tires or speaking of God's excellences.).
The highest Self (Ātman) stands to all other persons as their parent, on Rāmānuja's account. However, Rāmānuja, like many Vedāntins, does not subscribe to the Medieval Christian doctrine of creation ex nihilo: Brahman does not create individual persons, or basic, non-relational qualities for that matter, for these are eternal features of its Body. Brahman does engage in a form of creation, which consists in granting individual persons the fruits of their desires (whatever they are). The result of this dispensation is the organization of the elements comprising Brahman's body into the cosmos (Śrī Bhāṣya, I.i.1. "Great Siddhānta" p.124)
On Rāmānuja's account, our greatest good consists of being ever aware of our true nature (as modes of Brahman) and of being aware of the nature of Brahman. When all impediments to this awareness are removed, the individual attains moḳsa (liberation). Knowledge of Brahman consists in liberation, for Rāmānuja, mainly because of the character of Brahman. He writes:
Entities other than Brahman can be objects of such cognitions of the nature of joy only to a finite extent and for limited duration. But Brahman is such that cognizing of him is an infinite and abiding joy. It is for this reason that the śruti [scripture] says, `Brahman is bliss' (Taittirīya Upaniṣad II.6.) Since the form of cognition as joy is determined by its object, Brahman itself is joy. (Vedārthasaṅgraha §241)
Rāmānuja is explicit in holding that theoretical knowledge of Brahman's nature will not suffice to procure liberation (Śrī Bhāṣya, I.i.1. "Small Siddhānta" pp.13-14). Our embodied state places psychological constraints upon us that must be nullified. The remedy to be employed, for Rāmānuja, is what he calls, after the Bhagavad Gītā, bhakti yoga, or the discipline of devotion or worship. This type of yoga is comprised of two essential elements: (a) an attendance to one's duties with a deontological sense that they are the things that ought to be done for their own sake, and not for their consequences (also known as karma yoga), and (b) the constant worship of Brahman, particularly in the form of offering all of the fruits of one's labor to Brahman. These features of bhakti yoga serve two complimentary purposes. First, they counteract past undesirable actions (karmas) whose residual effects impede a full appreciation of reality. Secondly, they inculcate subservience before Brahman. This is valuable for Rāmānuja, for service to God, on his account, is constitutive of an unbroken appreciation of Brahman's nature.
Epistemic concerns figure centrally in Rāmānuja's arguments, and his diagnosis of the state of bondage (saṃsāra ), or non-liberation. Like many Indian philosophers, Rāmānuja holds that liberation comes about by the cessation of nescience (Śrī Bhāṣya, I.i.1. "Small Siddhānta" p.12). However, unlike many of his contemporaries, Rāmānuja does not believe that reason is an independent means of knowledge, capable of dispelling ignorance.
Rāmānuja holds a position that is similar to naïve empiricism. According to naïve empiricism, the only knowledge that one can have is knowledge that one has gained by one's own experience. Rāmānuja’s view is like naïve empiricism, in so far as his intentional account of the nature of all epistemic states (dharmabhūtajñāna) leads him to the view that all genuine or first-rate knowledge (jñāna) consists in a perceptual relationship between a knower and an object of knowledge-knowledge de re-and not between a believer and a sentence or proposition-knowledge de dicto. Unlike some proponents of naïve empiricism, Rāmānuja does not think that it suffices to intermittently have an acquaintance with objects of knowledge. Knowledge (jñāna) only occurs when there is direct perception of an object. Unlike proper empiricists, Rāmānuja does not restrict knowledge to that which can be gathered from the senses. The individual self (jīva) on Rāmānuja's account is also capable of having a direct vision of transcendent entities, like Brahman. Yet, the character of the epistemic state in which one is acquainted with Brahman is a type of perception for Rāmānuja.
Because of Rāmānuja's perceptual conception of knowledge, he does not regard acquaintance with scripture (śruti) as anything more than knowledge of the sentence meaning of scripture (cf. Śrī Bhāṣya, I.i.1. "Small Siddhānta" pp.13-14). Yet, like many of his fellow Vedāntins, Rāmānuja regards scripture (śruti) as a pramāṇa, or a means of knowledge. śruti, or the revealed literature, consists of a very specific corpus of texts: the Vedas. (If Rāmānuja believed that the Divya Prabhandam authored by the Tamil Vaiṣṇava saints is the Tamil equivalent of the Vedas, then he would have held these to also be within the purview of śruti). Scripture is an important source of knowledge, for Rāmānuja, for it is the only place that we can learn of our moral obligations (dharma) and what our liberation consists in (moḳsa). On the basis of the validity of scripture, several texts gain a derivative authority. These texts are smṛti (remembered) texts, which include the law books (dharmaśāstras) of eminent figures, and seemingly sacred texts like the Bhagavad Gītā. On the question of the justification of taking scripture seriously, Rāmānuja holds that none can be given. Scripture is self-justifying. Scripture, for its part, can lead people to have cognitions of independent entities, such as Brahman, after providing them directions to perceive Brahman: without it one would never know what to look for. However, sensuous perception cannot vouch for the veracity of its contents, nor can reason independently provide a rational proof of its veracity. Having followed scripture's dictates, one will eventually have proof of its validity (Śrī Bhāṣya I.i.4. p.175) (direct perceptual contact with objects such as Brahman). However, prior to embarking on the journey outlined in scripture, it must be taken on faith alone. Thus, on the position of the validity of scripture, Rāmānuja is a fideist (see Śrī Bhāṣya I.i.3. for Rāmānuja's classic criticism of natural theology pp.162-74). (Some critics are apt to think that Rāmānuja is correct on the ungroundability of the validity of scripture on either sensuous perception or reason, but that this impossibility makes Rāmānuja's whole philosophy implausible.)
While according scripture great weight, Rāmānuja shows his preference for common sense by tempering his interpretations of scripture in light of ordinary, sensuous experience. Contrary to the dialectically minded philosophers of his day, Rāmānuja presumes in his defense of Viśiṣṭādvaita in the Śrī Bhāṣya (I.i.1.) that scriptural interpretation must accord with ordinary experience.
Rāmānuja's unique contribution to Indian epistemology is the view that bhakti, or devotion, is itself an epistemic state. We have noted that, for Rāmānuja, knowledge of Brahman consists in directly perceiving it. When bhakti takes firm root in an individual, it turns into parabhakti, which is the highest order of bhakti. In all cases, however, bhakti is a direct awareness of Brahman's nature, and thus constitutes a type of knowledge (jñāna) (Vedārthasaṅgraha §238). The perceptual character of bhakti is sometimes obscured by Rāmānuja's synonyms for this state. He sometimes calls it meditation or worship (upāsana). However, he also insists that it is a kind of seeing, which has the character of direct perception (pratyakṣatā or sākṣātkāra) (cf. Śrī Bhāṣya, I.i.1. "Small Pūrvapakṣa" pp.15-7).
Rāmānuja's object oriented account of knowledge has the problem of accounting for error. If knowledge corresponds to objects, what do false beliefs correspond to: mental objects? His response anticipates Bertrand Russell's account of error in On Denoting, which does away with ersatz objects in the explanation of error. According to Rāmānuja, erroneous experiences, like dream states, are real, and they can be genuine objects of knowledge (as in the statement 'I dreamt last night' or 'I am dreaming’). However, the objects that the experience claims to be about are absent in false cognitions. This absence of the proper objects of knowledge explains the erroneousness of beliefs in them (Śrī Bhāṣya I.i.1. "Great Siddhānta" p.78). Thus, on Rāmānuja's account, mistaking mother of pearl for a piece of silver does not consist in mistakenly seeing something silver in color, but in the mistaken cognition that the object perceived is a piece of silver.
Rāmānuja's ethics divides into his views on substantive matters, and metaethical issues.
Rāmānuja's substantive ethics in turn has two sources. Like other orthodox Hindu thinkers, Rāmānuja holds that the primary source of moral knowledge is the Vedas. This is particularly true of the earlier portion of the Vedas, which sets forth prescribed and optional works (karmas) that constitute dharma. The importance of dharma, derived from the Vedas, is stressed in all three of Rāmānuja's major works. Like other orthodox Hindu thinkers, Rāmānuja also holds that the venerable tradition, or smṛti literature, supplements the Vedic texts' account of dharma. The most important of the smṛti texts, for Rāmānuja, is the Bhagavad Gītā.
The Gītā emphasizes the importance of adopting a deontological attitude (concern for duty for duty's sake and not for its consequences) in order to perfect the execution of prescribed duties, particular to one's place in society. But the Gītā also emphasizes the importance of certain virtues. The Gītā praises being a friend (mitra) and showing compassion (karuṇā) to all creatures (Bhagavad Gītā XII.13), and enumerates ahimsa, or non-injury, as one of the virtues essential to having jñāna, or gnosis (Bhagavad Gītā XIII.7-11).
On what is to be done when the requirements of virtues conflict with prescribed duties, Rāmānuja is uncompromising. For Rāmānuja, dharma, as set forth in the Vedas, is inviolable. This puts Rāmānuja in the awkward position of having to defend the propriety of animal sacrifices, sanctioned and prescribed in the earlier portion of the Vedas. Śrī Vaiṣṇava Brahmins, as a rule, are vegetarians. Rāmānuja was, in all likelihood, himself a vegetarian. However, his general inclination to positively endorse the Bhagavad Gītā's disavowal of animal cruelty did not stop him from affirming the propriety of animal sacrifices. In this respect, Rāmānuja agrees with his Advaitin predecessor, Śaṅkara, who held that while violence in general is evil, ritual slaughter is not any ordinary act of violence: because it is sanctioned by the Vedas, it cannot be evil (Śaṅkara, Brahma Sūtra Bhāṣya, III.i.25). Rāmānuja however goes further and argues that ritual slaughter is not only not evil; it is also not really a form of violence. Rather, it is a healing act like a physician's procedure, which causes temporary pain but is ultimately to the benefit of the patient. The sacrificed animal, on Rāmānuja's account, is more than compensated in the next life for being ritually slaughtered (Śrī Bhāṣya, III.i.25. pp.599-600).
Rāmānuja's metaethical comments concern the ground and validity of morality. Rāmānuja seems to have always presumed that morality is intrinsically valuable. The intrinsic merit of God Himself, on Rāmānuja's account, is tied to His moral excellences. Given that God has nothing to gain by being moral, the value of morality, at least in God's case, cannot be instrumental. However, for all other creatures, morality, or dharma, has an instrumental value: it helps counteract consequences of past karmas. Importantly, it is also the easy way to propitiate God. Rāmānuja notes that, in theory, it is possible to achieve liberation through mental efforts alone. However, this is only a theoretical possibility, and is in reality impossible for creatures like us. jñāna yoga, or mental disciplines geared towards achieving liberation by solely meditating upon the Self (and not availing oneself of ancillary aids, like attendance to one's duties) is difficult and likely to lead to error. Karma yoga, or attendance to one's duties, on the other hand, is easy for our duties are those obligations suited to our capacities and nature (Rāmānuja Gītā Bhāṣya, XVIII.47 p.583). Morality, on Rāmānuja's account, has both intrinsic and instrumental value. This account of the instrumental value of our obligations also contains, within it, the seeds of an account of the validity of our obligations: our obligations are those appropriate acts that are suited to us to perform. Thus, morality is not simply a law imposed from outside, on Rāmānuja's account, but the best mode of action, given our personal natures. However, because of our context, we are unable to determine what is best for us, independently of scripture. Hence, our reliance on scripture to tell us our duties leads to the appearance that dharma is a law imposed on us from outside.
Dharma (duty or morality) is of the utmost importance for Rāmānuja. It thus might seem ironic that the Bhagavad Gītā itself advises us to give up our dharmas. At the very end of the work, after the importance and benefits of living the virtuous life are extolled, Krishna (the incarnation of Vishnu delivering a sermon in the Bhagavad Gītā) advises us to 'give up all dharmas' and seek refuge in Him alone (Bhagavad Gītā XVIII.66). Rāmānuja offers two interpretations of this verse: (1) it can be taken as implying that we are to abandon the sense of agency that is incompatible with our cosmological dependence upon God, or (2), it can be taken as implying that we ought to give up recourse to expiatory rituals (sometime called "dharmas") to nullify the effects of past actions. Neither interpretation allows for abandoning our prescribed obligations (Rāmānuja, Bhagavad Gītā Bhāṣya XVIII.66, p.599). Rāmānuja's views contrast sharply with the views of the Advaita Vedāntin Śaṅkara, who argues that morality (dharma) for the seeker of liberation (moḳsa) is an evil, for it ensnares a person in things of the world (Śaṅkara, Bhagavad Gītā Bhāṣya, IV:21 pp.202-203).
Within two centuries after Rāmānuja, the Śrī Vaiṣṇava tradition split into two separate sub-traditions. Both schools claim to have the authority of Rāmānuja in support of their views. These traditions are the Northern or Vaḍagalai school, and the Southern or Tengalai school. The respective founding figures of these schools are Vedānta Deśika and Manavālamāmuni, two of many eminent Śrī Vaiṣṇava scholars to follow Rāmānuja. One manner in which the Northern and Southern schools differ is with respect to the importance that the Vedas are to play in the devotees life: the Northern school holds that Vedic observances are essential to proper Śrī Vaiṣṇava practices, while the Southern school emphasises the importance of emulating the examples of the twelve Āḻvārs. Most importantly, the two schools differ on the relationship between divine grace and individual effort. Both schools agree that Grace is necessary for liberation, but they disagree as to the conditions under which Grace is dispensed. According to the Northern school, Grace is conditional on the effort of the individual. Liberation, on this view, is a cooperative effort between God and the aspirant. According to the Southern school, Grace is dispensed freely. Liberation, on this view, is the sole responsibility of God. (On some accounts, the two schools can also be defined with respect to eighteen points of difference. See Govindācārya for one of the few but regrettably unbalanced accounts of this controversy).
Both schools agree that the intercession of Grace is tied to the devotee performing the spiritual act of śaraṇāgati or prapatti-surrender before God. The act of prapatti, or the formal surrender to God, with the understanding that one has no other refuge, is central to Śrī Vaiṣṇava cultic life. However, Northern and Southern schools differ with respect to what is to follow. For the Southern school, a one-time act of prapatti is sufficient. Subsequent lapses in devotion or attitude do not alter God's disposition to save the individual. However, for the Northern school, lapses on the part of the devotee require a fresh commitment on the part of the individual to surrender before God, in addition to constant effort on the part of the individual to attend to their moral duties in the spirit of bhakti yoga.
The controversy between the two schools could be circumvented if it could be shown that the very doctrine of śaraṇāgati or prapatti is foreign to the thought of Rāmānuja. This is what some recent scholars have attempted to show. Robert C. Lester, following the arguments of the Vaḍagalai Śrī Vaiṣṇava scholar, Agnihothram Rāmānuja Thatachariar of Kumbakonam, argues that the doctrine of śaraṇāgati or prapatti, at the heart of latter day Śrī Vaiṣṇava controversy, is only found in the Śaraṇāgati Gadya and the Śrīraṅga Gadya, and are absent from Rāmānuja's main philosophic works. On this basis, Lester argues that the Gadyas (specifically the Śaraṇāgati Gadya and Śrīraṅga Gadya) and the doctrine of śaraṇāgati or prapatti are spurious.
According to this argument, the Gadyas present, for the first time, the view that surrendering to God constitutes a unique means of gaining liberation. And, moreover, Lester argues that this idea is foreign to the arguments that Rāmānuja presents in the Śrī Bhāṣya, the Vedārthasaṅgraha and the Gītā Bhāṣya. These works are unanimous in stressing the role of bhakti as both the beginning and end of liberation.
In defence of the authenticity of the Gadyas, one might argue that the very idea of bhakti contains within it the notion of śaraṇāgati-that to love or be devoted to God is to surrender oneself to God. However, Lester argues that the notion of bhakti promulgated in the three main works of Rāmānuja is distinct from the notion of prapatti or śaraṇāgati in the Gadyas. First, the Śaraṇāgati Gadya makes it clear that the devotee is seeking God, not out of love, but out of desperation, with the request that God grant the devotee bhakti, and the favour of being eternally in His service. Śaraṇāgati or prapatti thus constitutes an act that is logically distinct from what is involved in bhakti, which is the steady remembrance of God, and attendance to one's duties in a spirit of sacrifice. Secondly, the Gadyas have suggested to many that the act of surrendering to God is sufficient to procure liberation. The critic persuaded by Lester's view holds that such a view is nowhere to be found in Rāmānuja's three main works.
In response to Lester's arguments, one might take a holistic stance: the import of the Gadyas and Rāmānuja's larger works must be assessed together. This is the stand that has been traditionally adopted by Śrī Vaiṣṇavas of both schools. If this approach is adopted, one is likely to read Rāmānuja's account of bhakti as implying an implicit understanding of our dependence and helplessness before God (a view shared by both the Northern and Southern schools), and one may also regard the Gadyas as not putting forth the radical notion that the act of surrender is sufficient for liberation (this, however, is what the Southern school appears to be committed to). With respect to Rāmānuja's main works, there is clear textual evidence that he regarded individuals as impotent, apart from God (cf. Śrī Bhāṣya, II.i.34. pp.478-9). As noted, on Rāmānuja's account, God’s role as creator is to grant us the fruits of our desires. Without God actually acting on our behalf to simulate a world in which it seems as if we are doers, we would be nothing but isolated persons with many desires, and largely incorrect beliefs, cut off from our peers, with no way to work through our predilections. God's creative role, on this account, serves the purpose of bridging the gap between ourselves and the rest of reality. On this picture of the human condition, it is quite clear that we as individuals are literally helpless, but for the creative dispensation of God.
Another response to Lester's argument is to invoke Rāmānuja’s own doctrine of co-ordinate predication, while defending the view that Rāmānuja in his main works holds that prapatti is sufficient for liberation. Rāmānuja in the Vedārthasaṅgraha writes:
The heart of the whole śāstra [body of authoritative texts] is this: The individual selves are essentially of the nature of pure knowledge, devoid of restriction and limitation. They get covered up by nescience in the shape of karma. The consequence is that the scope and breadth of their knowledge is curtailed in accordance with their karma. They get embodied in the multifarious varieties of bodies from [the deity] Brahma down to, the lowest species. Their knowledge is limited in accordance with their specific embodiment. They are deluded into identification with their bodies. In accordance with them they become subject to joys and sorrows, which, in essence constitute what is termed "the river of transmigratory existence" [saṃsāra]. For these individual selves, so lost in saṃsāra, there is no way of emancipation, other than surrender to the supreme Lord [bhagavatprapattimanthrena]. For the purpose of inculcating that sole way of emancipation, the first truth to be taught by the śāstra is that the individual souls are not intrinsically divided into several kinds, like gods, men, etc., and that they are fundamentally alike and are equal in having knowledge as their essential nature. The essential nature of the individual self is such that it is wholly subservient and instrumental to God and therefore God is its inner self. The nature of the supreme Being is unique, on, account of his absolute perfection and absolute antithesis to everything that is evil. God is the ocean of countless, infinitely excellent attributes. The śāstras further assert that all sentient and non sentient entities are sustained and operated by the supreme Being. Therefore, the Supreme is the ultimate self of all. They teach meditation along with its accessory conditions as the means for attaining him. (Vedārthasaṅgraha §99, my italics)
It is noteworthy that while Rāmānuja avails himself of the notion that surrendering to God is the only way to emancipation, he is also clear to emphasise that disciplines such as "meditation" and accessory conditions are essential to attaining liberation. One might argue, thus, that Rāmānuja did hold that prapatti or śaraṇāgati are the "only" way to liberation, but this way is not substantially distinct from the way of bhakti yoga. Rather, "bhakti" and “prapatti” are distinct qualities that qualify one path. On this interpretation, Rāmānuja is assuming that the reader will appreciate the phenomenon of co-ordinate predication, which is the putative semantic phenomenon that Rāmānuja appeals to elsewhere to argue that all individuals are Brahman, while being essentially distinct modes or attributes of Brahman, and not identical to the totality of Brahman. In this way, prapatti and bhakti both denote the same path, but they emphasize different points along the path.
Rāmānuja stands in the Indian philosophical tradition as one of its most important figures. He is the first thinker in this tradition to provide a systematic theistic interpretation of the import of the Vedas. His uncompromising stand on the side of common sense and moral realism stands as a striking contrast to stereotyped accounts of Indian philosophical thought as otherworldly and amoral. And while his significance in the history of Indian philosophy may be under appreciated, his greater influence on the character and form of popular Hinduism may also be under-recognized, despite the fact that he is regarded as a saint in many parts of Southern India. According to Karl Potter, "…Rāmānuja's tradition can be said to represent one of the main arteries through which philosophy reached down to the masses, and it may be that Viśiṣṭādvaita is today the most powerful philosophy in India in terms of numbers of adherents, whether they know themselves by that label or not" (Potter p.253). Whether Potter is correct or not, Rāmānuja is an Indian philosopher who defended the symbiosis of the spiritual, moral and practically earnest life.
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