Rāmānuja (ācārya), the eleventh century South Indian philosopher, is the chief proponent of Vishishtādvaita, which is one of the three main forms of the Orthodox Hindu philosophical school, Vedānta. As the prime philosopher of the Vishishtādvaita tradition, Rāmānuja is one of the Indian philosophical tradition’s most important and influential figures. He was the first Indian philosopher to provide a systematic theistic interpretation of the philosophy of the Vedas, and is famous for arguing for the epistemic and soteriological significance of bhakti, or devotion to a personal God. Unlike many of his contemporaries, Rāmānuja defended the reality of a plurality of individual persons, qualities, values and objects while affirming the substantial unity of all. On some accounts, Rāmānuja’s influence on popular Hindu practice is so vast that his system forms the basis for popular Hindu philosophy. His two main philosophical writings (the Shrī Bhāshya and Vedārthasangraha) are amongst the best examples of rigorous and energetic argumentation in any philosophical tradition, and they are masterpieces of Indian scholastic philosophy.
On traditional accounts, Ramanuja lived the unusually long life of 120 years (twice the average lifespan at the time), from 1017 to 1137 AD, though recent scholarship places his life between 1077 to 1157 AD, with a life of 80 years (Carman p.27). He was born in the Southern, Tamil speaking region of India, in the small township of Shri Perumbudur on the outskirts of modern day Chennai (Madras) into a family that hailed from a subclass of Brahmins (the Hindu priestly caste) known for their scholarship and learning in the Vedas. His family was likely bilingual, fluent in both the local vernacular (Tamil) and the language of scholarship (Sanskrit). From a young age he is reputed to have displayed a prodigious intellect and liberal attitudes towards caste. At this time he became friendly with a local, saintly Sudra (member of the servile caste) by the name of Kancipurna, whose occupation it was to perform services for the local temple idol of the Hindu deity Vishnu. Ramanuja admired Kancipurna’s piety and devotion to Vishnu and sought Kancipurna as his guru-much to the horror of Kancipurna who regarded Ramanuja’s humility before him as an affront to caste propriety.
Shortly after being married in his teenage years, and after his father passed away, Ramanuja and his family moved to the neighboring city of Kancipuram. There Ramanuja found his first formal teacher, Yadavaprakasha, who was an accomplished professor of the form of the Vedanta philosophy that was in vogue at the time-a form of Vedanta that has strong affinities to Shankara’s Absolute Idealistic Monism (Advaita Vedanta) but was also close to the Difference-and-non-difference view (Bhedabheda Vedanta). (“Vedanta” means the ‘end of the Vedas’ and refers to the philosophy expressed in the end portion of the Vedas, also known as the Upanishads, and encoded in the cryptic summary by Badharayana called the Vedanta Sutra or Brahma Sutra. The perennial questions of Vedanta are: what is the nature of Brahman, or the Ultimate, and what is the relationship between the multiplicity of individuals to this Ultimate. Vedanta comprises one of the six orthodox schools of Hindu philosophy.)
At first Yadavaprakasha was thrilled to receive a talented and intelligent student of the likes of Ramanuja. But disagreements between the two, on the proper interpretation of the Upanishads, soon broke out. Yadavaprakasha favored an amoral, impersonal, non-theistic interpretation of the Upanishads. Ramanuja, in contrast, favored a theistic interpretation of the Upanishads that placed a premium on the aesthetic and moral excellences of Brahman. Yadavaprakasha found Ramanuja’s skill at offering alternative interpretations threatening both to his authority and the popularity of his philosophy. He thus hatched a plan, with some of his other students, to murder Ramanuja while on a pilgrimage. Ramanuja however got word of the plan from his classmate and cousin (Govinda) and escaped from the pilgrimage with his life. Ramanuja (surprisingly) did not make public his knowledge of the failed assassination attempt and resumed classes with Yadavaprakasha when he returned to Kancipuram. Yadavaprakasha for his part did not reveal his complicity in the plot to take Ramanuja’s life, and feigned happiness at continuing to be his teacher. Not too long afterwards, however, Yadavaprakasha ordered Ramanuja to leave his school, after a final disagreement on the interpretation of scripture occurred.
Without a teacher, Ramanuja returned dejected to his childhood mentor, Kancipurna, who assured him that a teacher would come his way. For the time being, Kancipurna instructed Ramanuja to help him in his manual service to the temple idol of Vishnu.
At the same time Yamuna, the spiritual head of the fledgling Tamil Vaishnava (Vishnu worshiping) community, was near the end of his life and in search of a successor. This community, known as the Shri Vaishnava Sampradaya, was formed around the memory of the Four Thousand Tamil Verses (Nalayira Divya Prabhandam) of twelve Tamil Vaishnava saints (Alvars), renowned for their devotional poetry on Vishnu. While it had a modest popular base, it lacked a formal and legitimizing articulation in the Sanskrit academic community. Though a competent and accomplished philosopher in his own right who authored the impressive Siddhi Trayam, Yamuna came into the fold too late in his life to fully articulate the philosophy of Shri Vaishnavas to the pan-Indian academic community. He thus held out the hope that Ramanuja would, amongst other things, take up the task of articulating the philosophical ethos of the tradition that had been entrusted to him, in the form of a formal, Sanskrit commentary on the Brahma Sutra (the cryptic summary of the philosophical purport of the Upanishads). Upon finding out that Ramanuja had been freed from ties to Yadavaprakasha, and had returned to the company of Kancipurna (himself a member of Yamuna’s Shri Vaishnava community) Yamuna was overjoyed and sent word to Ramanuja to come and take up the post as his successor. Yamuna however died just before Ramanuja could reach him, and once again Ramanuja found himself without the teacher he had been searching for.
After Ramanuja had gained his composure, he made his way over to the crowd centered on Yamuna’s new corpse. He noted that three fingers of Yamuna’s were curled. Yamuna’s senior disciples explained to Ramanuja that they likely represented three wishes of Yamuna, one of which being that a commentary on the Brahma Sutra should be written. When Ramanuja pledged to try to fulfill those wishes, the fingers uncurled. The crowd took this as a sign that Ramanuja was the heir apparent of Yamuna. Ramanuja was however vexed at the local temple idol of Vishnu for not even allowing him a brief meeting with Yamuna, and would not formally join the community for nearly a year.
When Ramanuja did decide to formally join the Shri Vaishnava fold, Yamuna’s senior disciple, Mahapurna, supervised his initiation. For a matter of six months, Ramanuja had found himself the teacher he was looking for in the form of Mahapurna. Under Mahapurna, Ramanuja learned the verses of the Tamil Vaishnava saints. However, his learning under Mahapurna came to an abrupt end when Ramanuja’s wife picked a fight with Mahapurna’s wife, on the premise that the latter was a member of a lower Brahminic subcaste. Upon hearing this, the hurt Mahapurna and his wife departed from Ramanuja’s company without notice. Ramanuja, once again lost his teacher. But this was not the first time that Ramanuja’s wife had interfered with his spiritual development.
At an earlier point, Ramanuja had invited his childhood mentor, Kancipurna, for a meal. Ramanuja had hoped to partake of Kancipurna’s leavings as a sacrament. However, Kancipurna arrived early in absence of Ramanuja. Ramanuja’s wife fed Kancipurna, sent him off, and ritually purified the dining area, by, amongst other things, discarding Kancipurna’s leftovers.
Having lost the benefits of a teacher twice over as a result of his wife’s caste-pretensions, Ramanuja was incensed. He thus sent his wife back to her natal home, and promptly became a renounciate (sannyasin). He earned the title “king of ascetics (yatiraja) from the temple deity of Vishnu speaking through Kancipurna at this point.
Ramanuja’s separation from his wife and his initiation into the order of ascetics marks the beginning of his career as an independent and self-assured philosopher. He traveled around India and participated in public debates with exponents of rival philosophies. Many of the philosophers that Ramanuja defeated became prominent disciples in his fold. Ramanuja standardized and reformed temple worship in those Vaishnava temples that he gained control over (often through winning debates with the custodians of the temple). To this day his instructions are the norm of Shri Vaishnava temple and home worship in India and abroad.
The Shri Vaishnava tradition is unanimous in holding that Ramanuja authored nine, and only nine, works: all in Sanskrit. While Ramanuja is reported by the writings of his disciples to have lectured in Tamil on the verses of the Tamil Vaishnava saints, he left no writings on their work, and no explicit mention of them in his writings. At first glance, this seems remarkable, given that the Divya Prabhandam is regarded by the Shri Vaishnava tradition, as the Tamil equivalent of the Vedas. However, Ramanuja’s silence on the Alvars in his Sanskrit writings may have been a result of his aim as philosopher to not preach to the converted, but to articulate his philosophy to the pan-Indian academic community.
Ramanuja’s first work was likely the Vedarthasangraha (‘Summary of the Meaning of the Vedas’). It sets out Ramanuja’s philosophy, which is theistic (it affirms a morally perfect, omniscient and omnipotent God) and realistic (it affirms the existence and reality of a plurality of qualities, persons and objects). This work is referred to several times in Ramanuja’s magnum opus, his commentary on the Brahma Sutra, the Shri Bhashya (also known as his Brahma Sutra Bhashya). This is the work that Ramanuja is best known by outside of the Shri Vaishnava tradition. In addition to this large commentary on the Brahma Sutra, Ramanuja apparently wrote two more shorter commentaries: Vedantapida, and Vedantasara. Aside from the Vedarthasangraha and Shri Bhashya, Ramanuja’s most important philosophic work is a commentary on the Bhagavad Gita (Bhagavad Gita Bhashya). In addition to these philosophic works, Ramanuja is held by tradition to have written three prose hymns called collectively the Gadya Traya, which include the Sharanagati Gadya, Shriranga Gadya and the Vaikuntha Gadya). The Sharanagati Gadya is a dialogue between Ramanuja and the Hindu deities Shri (Lakshmi) and Narayana (Vishnu) (which jointly comprise God, or Brahman, for Ramanuja) in which Ramanuja surrenders himself before God and petitions Vishnu, through Lakshmi, for his Grace. Vishnu and Lakshmi, for their part, respond favorably to Ramanuja’s act of surrender. The Shriranga Gadya is a prayer of surrender to the feet of Ranganatha. (This is Vishnu in his repose on the many headed serpent Adiœesa -’ancient servant,’ ‘ancient residue,’ or ‘primeval matter’- on the milk ocean.) The Vaikuntha Gadya describes in great detail the eternal realm of Vishnu, called Vaikuntha, on which one should meditate in order to gain liberation. Finally Ramanuja is held to have authored a manual of daily worship called the Nityagrantha.
The authenticity of all but the three large works attributed to Ramanuja – Shri Bhashya, Vedarthasangraha and the Bhagavad Gita Bhashya – have come into question in recent times. The argument against the authenticity of these texts appears to be a minority position amongst scholars. With respect to the two smaller commentaries on the Brahma Sutra, it has been argued that they must be inauthentic, because it seems unlikely that Ramanuja would himself have bothered to take the time to abridge his larger commentary, the Shri Bhashya (cf. Buitenen p.32). With respect to the short religious works attributed to Ramanuja, it has been argued that they present doctrines that go beyond those that are found in his major commentaries (cf. Lester p.279).
Subsequent tradition has applied the label “Vishishtadvaita” to the philosophy of Ramanuja. It is meant to contrast his philosophy from leading competing views, such as Advaita (Non-Dualist), Bhedabheda (Difference-and-non-difference) and Dvaita (Dualist) Vedanta. The term “Vishishtadvaita” is often translated as ‘Qualified Non-Dualism.’ An alternative, and more informative, translation is “Non-duality of the qualified whole,” or perhaps ‘Non-duality with qualifications.” The label attempts to mark out Ramanuja’s effort to affirm the unity of the many, without giving up on the reality of distinct persons, qualities, universals, or aesthetic and moral values.
Where all versions of Vedanta intersect is in their effort to provide a consistent and defendable interpretation of the Brahma Sutra, on philosophical and hermeneutic grounds. Given the common textual bases, there are certain doctrinal invariances amongst the various sub-schools of Vedanta.
In accordance with the Upanishads, the various schools of Vedanta hold that there is an ultimate entity, called Brahman, which also is referred to by scripture as “Atma” (“Self”). The Vedanta schools recognize, in accordance with the Upanishads, that Brahman plays a key role in the organization of the universe. Attainment of Brahman by an individual constitutes its highest good: soteriological liberation or moksha.
The chief areas of disagreement amongst the various schools of Vedanta are on the nature and ontological status of individual selves, objects of cognition and Brahman, as well as the relevance and importance of ethics or duty (dharma) to the good life.
Ramanuja’s foils in the articulation of his philosophy are two forms of Vedanta that were not clearly distinguished during his day: these are the Bhedabheda view, and the Advaita philosophy. Both these views take a similar stance on the relationship of an individual’s subjectivity and Brahman: on both accounts, the conscious principle of the individual is of a piece with Brahman. In the case of Advaita Vedanta, the consciousness of an individual is regarded as numerically identical with the consciousness of Brahman. On this view, the psychological ego or sense of individuality is something distinct from consciousness: it is its object. The Bhedabheda view similarly asserts the numerical identity of an individual’s consciousness and Brahman, but it emphasizes that this identity is counteracted by a separating off, or differentiating effort, on the part of Brahman to compartmentalize itself and mysteriously constitute the world of plurality and difference. On this view, the individual ego is constituted by Brahman. According to the versions of Bhedabheda and Advaita that Ramanuja was acquainted with, mere knowledge of one’s identity with Brahman is sufficient to bring about liberation; works, such as ritual and moral obligations, can at best play a preparatory role in bringing an individual to the state of being desirous for liberation, but they have no intrinsic value. Corollaries of these views are the position that consciousness, and not plurality, is metaphysically fundamental; that consciousness does not require objects for its existence; that belief in plurality consists in the uncritical acceptance of ordinary experience; and that dialectical reasoning can yield substantive knowledge with practical import. On many fronts (on the reality of universals, particulars, and moral values) both the Bhedabheda Advaita schools are classic forms of anti-realism.
Students of Ramanuja’s thought may wish to know whom Ramanuja is arguing against. In all likely hood, it is his former teacher, Yadavaprakasha. However, Ramanuja does not attribute the Advaita or Bhedabheda views to any particular philosopher. Rather, these views are voiced by the opponent, or the ubiquitous purvapaksin, everywhere in Indian philosophy, expressing the views to be criticized.
Ramanuja’s arguments that he presents against his opponent are of roughly three varieties. Some are negative, and focus on philosophical problems of the opponent’s view. Some are positive, and concern arguing for theses that Ramanuja wishes to defend. And some arguments are hermeneutic. This last category of arguments combines criticism and positive philosophical argument, but it centers on the proper interpretation of the Vedas.
Ramanuja criticizes many of the arguments of the Bhedabheda and Advaita views on logical grounds. These schools employed dialectical arguments that conclude on the basis of logical puzzles that arise in accounting for distinctions and difference in perception that difference (which includes the idea of a distinct quality) is an unintelligible notion. From such considerations, these philosophers would typically conclude that only undifferentiated consciousness is the real (Brahman). Ramanuja at many points in the Shri Bhashya and the Vedarthasangraha attempts to argue against such views by an argument ad absurdum. Particularly, Ramanuja argues that the arguments presented by the Bhedabheda and Advaita Vedantins lead to intolerable contradictions and further conclusions that go against common sense. At one point he suggests that those who would make such arguments are “no better than a man who would claim that his own mother never had any children” (Shri Bhashya, I.i.1. “Great Siddhanta” p.44).
Ramanuja argues that the epistemic considerations that his opponents adduce for their positions undercut their own views. The philosophers that Ramanuja takes aim at argue that all means of cognition involve error. Ramanuja argues that if this is so, it follows that we could never know that all cognition involves error, for such putative knowledge would itself involve an erroneous cognition, and hence not qualify as genuine knowledge. If Ramanuja’s opponents view is correct, then it follows that some cognitions are not erroneous. But this is exactly what the disputed conclusion rules out (Shri Bhashya, I.i.1. “Great Siddhanta” pp.74-78).
While the previous two strategies that Ramanuja employs in his criticism of the Bhedabheda and Advaita views are largely negative, and involve criticizing these views on formal grounds, Ramanuja also defends philosophical theses that these two schools rule out. The most important of these theses is the view that consciousness is always consciousness of some object distinguished by a characteristic (cf. Shri Bhashya, I.i.1. “Great Siddhanta” p.53 and “Great Purvapaksa” p.32). This is the doctrine known as “dharmabhutajnana” in the Vishishtadvaita tradition (Shrinivasadisa VII.2). It implies the view that all epistemic states, be it consciousness or perception, are intentional or object oriented. If it is the case that even consciousness requires an object for its existence, it follows that there can be no such thing as pure consciousness apart from difference (such as qualities, properties and objects of consciousness). Thus, on this account, if consciousness exists, it follows that difference and plurality does as well. With this one thesis, and against the backdrop of Vedantic idealism, Ramanuja is able to generate one limb of his organismic cosmology.
Another important substantive philosophical thesis that Ramanuja defends is that consciousness is itself a property. To modern readers, this may seem to be a trivial point. However, it is central to the project of Ramanuja’s opponents that Brahman is the only reality, and it is a reality devoid of distinctions or qualities. Ramanuja’s opponents are happy to affirm that certain things can be said of Brahman, for instance, that it is (as affirmed in the Taittitriya Upanishad II.i.1.) truth (satyam) knowledge (jnanam) and infinite (anantam). However, they take the stand that these are not properties of Brahman, but the very being of Brahman (Shri Bhashya, I.i.1. “Great Purvapaksa” p.29). Ramanuja, in contrast, defends the view that such attributions bring attention to the reality of Brahman‘s qualities (cf. Shri Bhashya, I.i.1. “Great Purvapaksa” p.28).
A third and important substantive thesis that Ramanuja defends is the reality of the individual. According to Advaita Vedanta (and the Bhedabheda view to a lesser extent), the individual person, in contradistinction to other persons, is an illusion (maya) that comes about by nescience (avidya). Ramanuja argues that the very idea that something can be ignorant presumes that there is an individual capable of being ignorant. For all Vedantins affirm that Brahman is of the nature of consciousness and knowledge. Hence, to say that Brahman is ignorant is absurd. If anything is subject to ignorance, it must be an individual other than Brahman. However, if this is so, then ignorance cannot be brought into explain the existence of individuals, for it presumes the existence of an individual capable of being ignorant. Ramanuja’s positive view is thus that there are, indeed, distinct individuals, many who are under the spell of ignorance. However, their individuality is ontologically and logically prior to their ignorance (Shri Bhashya, I.i.1. “Great Siddhanta” p.103)
All Vedanta philosophies must turn to the Vedas, and particularly the Upanishads, for scriptural grounding. Hence, in criticizing his fellow Vedantins, Ramanuja makes use of arguments that concern the proper interpretation of scripture.
According to Ramanuja, his opponents have failed to arrive at an interpretation of the Vedas based on all Vedic texts. Rather, they emphasize some passages that support a monistic interpretation, and ignore those passages that either presume or emphasize plurality. Ramanuja notes that his opponents hold to the view that those Vedic texts that come later in the corpus are to be emphasized (the fact that they come later is presumed, on this account, to show that they contain the more advanced and esoteric teachings) (Shri Bhashya, I.i.1. “Great Purvapaksa” p.27). These, more than other portions of the Vedas, emphasize the oneness of reality with Brahman. Ramanuja argues that even these portions of the Vedas presume and affirm plurality. Even if it were not the case that these portions of the Vedas mentioned plurality, we would have to take all the Vedas on par for Ramanuja. According to Ramanuja, one cannot attempt to give interpretations of isolated portions of the Vedas. Rather, one must take the Vedas as one unified corpus, aiming at the expression of a single doctrine (cf. Shri Bhashya pp.92-3, I.i.1. “Great Siddhanta“). Hence, any tenable interpretation of the philosophy of the Vedas must not only affirm the reality of plurality, but also the importance of ritual and moral obligations (dharma), for these are spoken about at length in the earlier portions of the Vedas.
Even if the Vedic corpus as a whole is taken to present a single doctrine, Ramanuja is still left with the task of accounting for how the seemingly monistic portions of the Upanishads are consistent with the reality of a plurality of distinct individuals. To overcome this hermeneutic hurdle, Ramanuja introduces the doctrine of samanadhikaranya, sometimes translated as “co-ordinate predication” or “the principle of grammatical coordination” but literally meaning ‘several things in a common substrate.’ The etymology of the word suggests an ontological doctrine. However, Ramanuja means to employ it as a semantic doctrine. According to Ramanuja, “The experts on such matters define it thus: `The signification of an identical entity by several terms [shabda] which are applied to that entity on different grounds is co-ordinate predication” (Vedarthasangraha §24).
In both the Shri Bhashya and the Vedarthasangraha, Ramanuja draws a distinction between the object denoted by a term, and the quality that it can be identified in connection with. The possibility of using various terms with the same denotation but with different qualitative content is what Ramanuja calls “co-ordinate predication.”
The doctrine that Ramanuja advances under the heading of co-ordinate predication strikingly anticipates the Fregean distinction between sense and reference. In the writings of Ramanuja, the doctrine is used to interpret monistic passages of the Vedas in a manner that affirms both the unity of the thing designated, via the coreferentiality of the various terms, while affirming that the various terms bring to the sentence an emphasis on distinct properties of the unitary thing so identified. With respect to the famous formula “that thou art” (tat tvam asi) from the Chandyogai Upanishad (which Advaitins quote as support for the absolute identity of the individual’s self with Brahman), Ramanuja understands the indexicals “that” and “thou” as signifying an underlying unity, while containing distinct qualitative content. Hence, “that” in this context, brings to fore the quality of the underlying substantial unity of all individuals in Brahman, while “thou” emphasize that we, as individuals, are qualities or distinctions in this underlying unity (Shri Bhashya, I.i.1. “Great Siddhanta” pp.129-39).
Even if the doctrine of co-ordinate predication is granted, there is yet another hermeneutic hurdle for Ramanuja to contend with: this is the Upanishadic equation of Brahman (the Ultimate) with Atma (or Self). If the Ultimate and the Self are one, then it would seem that there is no room for the existence of a plurality of individual persons. The problem might be solved by denying that “Atma” means self, but this would be to stipulate a meaning for the word “Atma” that it does not have in Sanskrit or Vedic. Ramanuja’s solution to this problem is the cosmological doctrine of sharira and shariri (body and soul), or shesha and sheshin (dependant and dependant upon). According to Ramanuja, Brahman is the Self of all. However, this is not because our individual personhood is identical with the personhood of Brahman, but because we, along with all individuals, constitute modes or qualities of the body of Brahman. Thus, Brahman stands to all others as the soul or mind stands to its body. The metaphysical model that Ramanuja thus argues for is at once cosmological in nature, and organic. All individuals are Brahman by virtue of constituting its body, but all individuals retain an identity in contradistinction to other parts of Brahman, particularly the soul of Brahman.
In accordance with much of the monism of Upanishadic passages, Ramanuja maintains that there is a way in which the individual self (jiva, or jivatma) is identical with the Ultimate Self (Atma or Paramatma). This is in our natures. According to Ramanuja, each jiva shares with Brahman an essential nature of being a knower. However, due to beginningless past actions (karma) our true nature (as being knowers and dependants upon Brahman) are obscured from us. Moreover, our sharing this nature in no way implies that we have the same relationship to other things (Shri Bhashya, I.i.1. “Great Siddhanta” pp.99-102). In other words, our likeness in one respect with Brahman does not imply that we ourselves are either omnipotent, omniscient or all good.
In contrast to preceding commentators on the Brahma Sutra, Ramanuja’s version of Vedanta is explicitly theistic. Brahman as Atman (the Highest Self of all) is the union of two deities: Vishnu, or Narayana, and His Consort Shri, or Lakshmi. (In Hinduism, Vishnu is the God who upholds and preserves all things, while Lakshmi is the Goddess of prosperity.) The unity of both the father (Vishnu) and mother (Lakshmi) element in Brahman is essential to Ramanuja. It is a consequence of the view that Brahman is ubhayalingam, or having both sexes: this accounts for Brahman‘s creative potency. According to Ramanuja, Brahman (considered as the Atman) is antagonistic to all evil lacks all faults (papam, heya, mala or dosha), and is comprised of innumerable auspicious qualities (kalyanaguna): these auspicious qualities are both moral and aesthetic (Vedarthasangraha §§ 2, 6, 9, 19, 92, 112, 147, 161, 163, 198, 234, Shri Bhashya, I.i.1. pp.5, 80, 89, 92, 94, 125, 132, 133, 136, 144, I.i.2. p. 157, I.i.4. p.201, Bhagavad Gita Bhashya I. Intro, IX.34, to name just a few references-Ramanuja never tires or speaking of God’s excellences.).
The highest Self (Atma) stands to all other persons as their parent, on Ramanuja’s account. However, Ramanuja, like many Vedantins, does not subscribe to the Medieval Christian doctrine of creation ex nihilo: Brahman does not create individual persons, or basic, non-relational qualities for that matter, for these are eternal features of its Body. Brahman does engage in a form of creation, which consists in granting individual persons the fruits of their desires (whatever they are). The result of this dispensation is the organization of the elements comprising Brahman‘s body into the cosmos (Shri Bhashya, I.i.1. “Great Siddhanta” p.124)
On Ramanuja’s account, our greatest good consists of being ever aware of our true nature (as modes of Brahman) and of being aware of the nature of Brahman. When all impediments to this awareness are removed, the individual attains moksha (liberation). Knowledge of Brahman consists in liberation, for Ramanuja, mainly because of the character of Brahman. He writes:
Entities other than Brahman can be objects of such cognitions of the nature of joy only to a finite extent and for limited duration. But Brahman is such that cognizing of him is an infinite and abiding joy. It is for this reason that the shruti [scripture] says, `Brahman is bliss’ (Taittitriya Upanishad II.6.) Since the form of cognition as joy is determined by its object, Brahman itself is joy. (Vedarthasangraha §241)
Ramanuja is explicit in holding that theoretical knowledge of Brahman‘s nature will not suffice to procure liberation (Shri Bhashya, I.i.1. “Small Siddhanta” pp.13-14). Our embodied state places psychological constraints upon us that must be nullified. The remedy to be employed, for Ramanuja, is what he calls, after the Bhagavad Gita, bhakti yoga, or the discipline of devotion or worship. This type of yoga is comprised of two essential elements: (a) an attendance to one’s duties with a deontological sense that they are the things that ought to be done for their own sake, and not for their consequences (also known as karma yoga), and (b) the constant worship of Brahman, particularly in the form of offering all of the fruits of one’s labor to Brahman. These features of bhakti yoga serve two complimentary purposes. First, they counteract past undesirable actions (karmas) whose residual effects impede a full appreciation of reality. Secondly, they inculcate subservience before Brahman. This is valuable for Ramanuja, for service to God, on his account, is constitutive of an unbroken appreciation of Brahman‘s nature.
Epistemic concerns figure centrally in Ramanuja’s arguments, and his diagnosis of the state of bondage (samsara), or non-liberation. Like many Indian philosophers, Ramanuja holds that liberation comes about by the cessation of nescience (Shri Bhashya, I.i.1. “Small Siddhanta” p.12). However, unlike many of his contemporaries, Ramanuja does not believe that reason is an independent means of knowledge, capable of dispelling ignorance.
Ramanuja holds a position that is similar to naïve empiricism. According to naïve empiricism, the only knowledge that one can have is knowledge that one has gained by one’s own experience. Ramanuja’s view is like naïve empiricism, in so far as his intentional account of the nature of all epistemic states (dharmabhutajnana) leads him to the view that all genuine or first-rate knowledge (jnana) consists in a perceptual relationship between a knower and an object of knowledge-knowledge de re-and not between a believer and a sentence or proposition-knowledge de dicto. Unlike some proponents of naïve empiricism, Ramanuja does not think that it suffices to intermittently have an acquaintance with objects of knowledge. Knowledge (jnana) only occurs when there is direct perception of an object. Unlike proper empiricists, Ramanuja does not restrict knowledge to that which can be gathered from the senses. The individual self (jiva) on Ramanuja’s account is also capable of having a direct vision of transcendent entities, like Brahman. Yet, the character of the epistemic state in which one is acquainted with Brahman is a type of perception for Ramanuja.
Because of Ramanuja’s perceptual conception of knowledge, he does not regard acquaintance with scripture (shruti) as anything more than knowledge of the sentence meaning of scripture (cf. Shri Bhashya, I.i.1. “Small Siddhanta” pp.13-14). Yet, like many of his fellow Vedantins, Ramanuja regards scripture (shruti) as a pramana, or a means of knowledge. shruti, or the revealed literature, consists of a very specific corpus of texts: the Vedas. (If Ramanuja believed that the Divya Prabhandam authored by the Tamil Vaishnava saints is the Tamil equivalent of the Vedas, then he would have held these to also be within the purview of shruti). Scripture is an important source of knowledge, for Ramanuja, for it is the only place that we can learn of our moral obligations (dharma) and what our liberation consists in (moksha). On the basis of the validity of scripture, several texts gain a derivative authority. These texts are smriti (remembered) texts, which include the law books (dharmashastras) of eminent figures, and seemingly sacred texts like the Bhagavad Gita. On the question of the justification of taking scripture seriously, Ramanuja holds that none can be given. Scripture is self-justifying. Scripture, for its part, can lead people to have cognitions of independent entities, such as Brahman, after providing them directions to perceive Brahman: without it one would never know what to look for. However, sensuous perception cannot vouch for the veracity of its contents, nor can reason independently provide a rational proof of its veracity. Having followed scripture’s dictates, one will eventually have proof of its validity (Shri Bhashya I.i.4. p.175) (direct perceptual contact with objects such as Brahman). However, prior to embarking on the journey outlined in scripture, it must be taken on faith alone. Thus, on the position of the validity of scripture, Ramanuja is a fideist (see Shri Bhashya I.i.3. for Ramanuja’s classic criticism of natural theology pp.162-74). (Some critics are apt to think that Ramanuja is correct on the ungroundability of the validity of scripture on either sensuous perception or reason, but that this impossibility makes Ramanuja’s whole philosophy implausible.)
While according scripture great weight, Ramanuja shows his preference for common sense by tempering his interpretations of scripture in light of ordinary, sensuous experience. Contrary to the dialectically minded philosophers of his day, Ramanuja presumes in his defense of Vishishtadvaita in the Shri Bhashya (I.i.1.) that scriptural interpretation must accord with ordinary experience.
Ramanuja’s unique contribution to Indian epistemology is the view that bhakti, or devotion, is itself an epistemic state. We have noted that, for Ramanuja, knowledge of Brahman consists in directly perceiving it. When bhakti takes firm root in an individual, it turns into parabhakti, which is the highest order of bhakti. In all cases, however, bhakti is a direct awareness of Brahman‘s nature, and thus constitutes a type of knowledge (jnana) (Vedarthasangraha §238). The perceptual character of bhakti is sometimes obscured by Ramanuja’s synonyms for this state. He sometimes calls it meditation or worship (upasana). However, he also insists that it is a kind of seeing, which has the character of direct perception (pratyakshata or sakshatkara) (cf. Shri Bhashya, I.i.1. “Small Purvapaksha” pp.15-7).
Ramanuja’s object oriented account of knowledge has the problem of accounting for error. If knowledge corresponds to objects, what do false beliefs correspond to: mental objects? His response anticipates Bertrand Russell’s account of error in On Denoting, which does away with ersatz objects in the explanation of error. According to Ramanuja, erroneous experiences, like dream states, are real, and they can be genuine objects of knowledge (as in the statement ‘I dreamt last night’ or ‘I am dreaming’). However, the objects that the experience claims to be about are absent in false cognitions. This absence of the proper objects of knowledge explains the erroneousness of beliefs in them (Shri Bhashya I.i.1. “Great Siddhanta” p.78). Thus, on Ramanuja’s account, mistaking mother of pearl for a piece of silver does not consist in mistakenly seeing something silver in color, but in the mistaken cognition that the object perceived is a piece of silver.
Ramanuja’s ethics divides into his views on substantive matters, and metaethical issues.
Ramanuja’s substantive ethics in turn has two sources. Like other orthodox Hindu thinkers, Ramanuja holds that the primary source of moral knowledge is the Vedas. This is particularly true of the earlier portion of the Vedas, which sets forth prescribed and optional works (karmas) that constitute dharma. The importance of dharma, derived from the Vedas, is stressed in all three of Ramanuja’s major works. Like other orthodox Hindu thinkers, Ramanuja also holds that the venerable tradition, or smriti literature, supplements the Vedic texts’ account of dharma. The most important of the smriti texts, for Ramanuja, is the Bhagavad Gita.
The Gita emphasizes the importance of adopting a deontological attitude (concern for duty for duty’s sake and not for its consequences) in order to perfect the execution of prescribed duties, particular to one’s place in society. But the Gita also emphasizes the importance of certain virtues. The Gita praises being a friend (mitra) and showing compassion (karuna) to all creatures (Bhagavad Gita XII.13), and enumerates ahimsa, or non-injury, as one of the virtues essential to having jnana, or gnosis (Bhagavad Gita XIII.7-11).
On what is to be done when the requirements of virtues conflict with prescribed duties, Ramanuja is uncompromising. For Ramanuja, dharma, as set forth in the Vedas, is inviolable. This puts Ramanuja in the awkward position of having to defend the propriety of animal sacrifices, sanctioned and prescribed in the earlier portion of the Vedas. Shri Vaishnava Brahmins, as a rule, are vegetarians. Ramanuja was, in all likelihood, himself a vegetarian. However, his general inclination to positively endorse the Bhagavad Gita‘s disavowal of animal cruelty did not stop him from affirming the propriety of animal sacrifices. In this respect, Ramanuja agrees with his Advaitin predecessor, Shankara, who held that while violence in general is evil, ritual slaughter is not any ordinary act of violence: because it is sanctioned by the Vedas, it cannot be evil (Shankara, Brahma Sutra Bhashya, III.i.25). Ramanuja however goes further and argues that ritual slaughter is not only not evil; it is also not really a form of violence. Rather, it is a healing act like a physician’s procedure, which causes temporary pain but is ultimately to the benefit of the patient. The sacrificed animal, on Ramanuja’s account, is more than compensated in the next life for being ritually slaughtered (Shri Bhashya, III.i.25. pp.599-600).
Ramanuja’s metaethical comments concern the ground and validity of morality. Ramanuja seems to have always presumed that morality is intrinsically valuable. The intrinsic merit of God Himself, on Ramanuja’s account, is tied to His moral excellences. Given that God has nothing to gain by being moral, the value of morality, at least in God’s case, cannot be instrumental. However, for all other creatures, morality, or dharma, has an instrumental value: it helps counteract consequences of past karmas. Importantly, it is also the easy way to propitiate God. Ramanuja notes that, in theory, it is possible to achieve liberation through mental efforts alone. However, this is only a theoretical possibility, and is in reality impossible for creatures like us. jnana yoga, or mental disciplines geared towards achieving liberation by solely meditating upon the Self (and not availing oneself of ancillary aids, like attendance to one’s duties) is difficult and likely to lead to error. Karma yoga, or attendance to one’s duties, on the other hand, is easy for our duties are those obligations suited to our capacities and nature (Ramanuja Gita Bhashya, XVIII.47 p.583). Morality, on Ramanuja’s account, has both intrinsic and instrumental value. This account of the instrumental value of our obligations also contains, within it, the seeds of an account of the validity of our obligations: our obligations are those appropriate acts that are suited to us to perform. Thus, morality is not simply a law imposed from outside, on Ramanuja’s account, but the best mode of action, given our personal natures. However, because of our context, we are unable to determine what is best for us, independently of scripture. Hence, our reliance on scripture to tell us our duties leads to the appearance that dharma is a law imposed on us from outside.
Dharma (duty or morality) is of the utmost importance for Ramanuja. It thus might seem ironic that the Bhagavad Gita itself advises us to give up our dharmas. At the very end of the work, after the importance and benefits of living the virtuous life are extolled, Krishna (the incarnation of Vishnu delivering a sermon in the Bhagavad Gita) advises us to ‘give up all dharmas’ and seek refuge in Him alone (Bhagavad Gita XVIII.66). Ramanuja offers two interpretations of this verse: (1) it can be taken as implying that we are to abandon the sense of agency that is incompatible with our cosmological dependence upon God, or (2), it can be taken as implying that we ought to give up recourse to expiatory rituals (sometime called “dharmas“) to nullify the effects of past actions. Neither interpretation allows for abandoning our prescribed obligations (Ramanuja, Bhagavad Gita Bhashya XVIII.66, p.599). Ramanuja’s views contrast sharply with the views of the Advaita Vedantin Shankara, who argues that morality (dharma) for the seeker of liberation (moksha) is an evil, for it ensnares a person in things of the world (Shankara, Bhagavad Gita Bhashya, IV:21 pp.202-203).
Within two centuries after Ramanuja, the Shri Vaishnava tradition split into two separate sub-traditions. Both schools claim to have the authority of Ramanuja in support of their views. These traditions are the Northern or Vadakalai school, and the Southern or Tenkalai school. The respective founding figures of these schools are Vedanta Deshika and Manavalamamuni, two of many eminent Shri Vaishnava scholars to follow Ramanuja. One manner in which the Northern and Southern schools differ is with respect to the importance that the Vedas are to play in the devotees life: the Northern school holds that Vedic observances are essential to proper Shri Vaishnava practices, while the Southern school emphasises the importance of emulating the examples of the twelve Alvars. Most importantly, the two schools differ on the relationship between divine grace and individual effort. Both schools agree that Grace is necessary for liberation, but they disagree as to the conditions under which Grace is dispensed. According to the Northern school, Grace is conditional on the effort of the individual. Liberation, on this view, is a cooperative effort between God and the aspirant. According to the Southern school, Grace is dispensed freely. Liberation, on this view, is the sole responsibility of God. (On some accounts, the two schools can also be defined with respect to eighteen points of difference. See Govindacarya for one of the few but regrettably unbalanced accounts of this controversy).
Both schools agree that the intercession of Grace is tied to the devotee performing the spiritual act of sharanagati or prapatti-surrender before God. The act of prapatti, or the formal surrender to God, with the understanding that one has no other refuge, is central to Shri Vaishnava cultic life. However, Northern and Southern schools differ with respect to what is to follow. For the Southern school, a one-time act of prapatti is sufficient. Subsequent lapses in devotion or attitude do not alter God’s disposition to save the individual. However, for the Northern school, lapses on the part of the devotee require a fresh commitment on the part of the individual to surrender before God, in addition to constant effort on the part of the individual to attend to their moral duties in the spirit of bhakti yoga.
The controversy between the two schools could be circumvented if it could be shown that the very doctrine of sharanagati or prapatti is foreign to the thought of Ramanuja. This is what some recent scholars have attempted to show. Robert C. Lester, following the arguments of the Vadakalai Shri Vaishnava scholar, Agnihothram Ramanuja Thatachariar of Kumbakonam, argues that the doctrine of sharanagati or prapatti, at the heart of latter day Shri Vaishnava controversy, is only found in the Sharanagati Gadya and the Shriranga Gadya, and are absent from Ramanuja’s main philosophic works. On this basis, Lester argues that the Gadyas (specifically the Sharanagati Gadya and Shriranga Gadya) and the doctrine of sharanagati or prapatti are spurious.
According to this argument, the Gadyas present, for the first time, the view that surrendering to God constitutes a unique means of gaining liberation. And, moreover, Lester argues that this idea is foreign to the arguments that Ramanuja presents in the Shri Bhashya, the Vedarthasangraha and the Gita Bhashya. These works are unanimous in stressing the role of bhakti as both the beginning and end of liberation.
In defence of the authenticity of the Gadyas, one might argue that the very idea of bhakti contains with in it the notion of sharanagati-that to love or be devoted to God is to surrender oneself to God. However, Lester argues that the notion of bhakti promulgated in the three main works of Ramanuja is distinct from the notion of prapatti or sharanagati in the Gadyas. First, the Sharanagati Gadya makes it clear that the devotee is seeking God, not out of love, but out of desperation, with the request that God grant the devotee bhakti, and the favour of being eternally in His service. Sharanagati or prapatti thus constitutes an act that is logically distinct from what is involved in bhakti, which is the steady remembrance of God, and attendance to one’s duties in a spirit of sacrifice. Secondly, the Gadyas have suggested to many that the act of surrendering to God is sufficient to procure liberation. The critic persuaded by Lester’s view holds that such a view is nowhere to be found in Ramanuja’s three main works.
In response to Lester’s arguments, one might take a holistic stance: the import of the Gadyas and Ramanuja’s larger works must be assessed together. This is the stand that has been traditionally adopted by Shri Vaishnavas of both schools. If this approach is adopted, one is likely to read Ramanuja’s account of bhakti as implying an implicit understanding of our dependence and helplessness before God (a view shared by both the Northern and Southern schools), and one may also regard the Gadyas as not putting forth the radical notion that the act of surrender is sufficient for liberation (this, however, is what the Southern school appears to be committed to). With respect to Ramanuja’s main works, there is clear textual evidence that he regarded individuals as impotent, apart from God (cf. Shri Bhashya, II.i.34. pp.478-9). As noted, on Ramanuja’s account, God’s role as creator is to grant us the fruits of our desires. Without God actually acting on our behalf to simulate a world in which it seems as if we are doers, we would be nothing but isolated persons with many desires, and largely incorrect beliefs, cut off from our peers, with no way to work through our predilections. God’s creative role, on this account, serves the purpose of bridging the gap between ourselves and the rest of reality. On this picture of the human condition, it is quite clear that we as individuals are literally helpless, but for the creative dispensation of God.
Another response to Lester’s argument is to invoke Ramanuja’s own doctrine of co-ordinate predication, while defending the view that Ramanuja in his main works holds that prapatti is sufficient for liberation. Ramanuja in the Vedarthasangraha writes:
The heart of the whole shastra [body of authoritative texts] is this: The individual selves are essentially of the nature of pure knowledge, devoid of restriction and limitation. They get covered up by nescience in the shape of karma. The consequence is that the scope and breadth of their knowledge is curtailed in accordance with their karma. They get embodied in the multifarious varieties of bodies from [the deity] Brahma down to, the lowest species. Their knowledge is limited in accordance with their specific embodiment. They are deluded into identification with their bodies. In accordance with them they become subject to joys and sorrows, which, in essence constitute what is termed “the river of transmigratory existence” [samsara]. For these individual selves, so lost in samsara, there is no way of emancipation, other than surrender to the supreme Lord [bhagavatprapattimanthrena]. For the purpose of inculcating that sole way of emancipation, the first truth to be taught by the shastra is that the individual souls are not intrinsically divided into several kinds, like gods, men, etc., and that they are fundamentally alike and are equal in having knowledge as their essential nature. The essential nature of the individual self is such that it is wholly subservient and instrumental to God and therefore God is its inner self. The nature of the supreme Being is unique, on, account of his absolute perfection and absolute antithesis to everything that is evil. God is the ocean of countless, infinitely excellent attributes. The shastras further assert that all sentient and non sentient entities are sustained and operated by the supreme Being. Therefore, the Supreme is the ultimate self of all. They teach meditation along with its accessory conditions as the means for attaining him. (Vedarthasangraha §99, my italics)
It is noteworthy that while Ramanuja avails himself of the notion that surrendering to God is the only way to emancipation, he is also clear to emphasise that disciplines such as “meditation” and accessory conditions are essential to attaining liberation. One might argue, thus, that Ramanuja did hold that prapatti or sharanagati are the “only” way to liberation, but this way is not substantially distinct from the way of bhakti yoga. Rather, “bhakti” and “prapatti” are distinct qualities that qualify one path. On this interpretation, Ramanuja is assuming that the reader will appreciate the phenomenon of co-ordinate predication, which is the putative semantic phenomenon that Ramanuja appeals to elsewhere to argue that all individuals are Brahman, while being essentially distinct modes or attributes of Brahman, and not identical to the totality of Brahman. In this way, prapatti and bhakti both denote the same path, but they emphasize different points along the path.
Ramanuja stands in the Indian philosophical tradition as one of its most important figures. He is the first thinker in this tradition to provide a systematic theistic interpretation of the import of the Vedas. His uncompromising stand on the side of common sense and moral realism stands as a striking contrast to stereotyped accounts of Indian philosophical thought as otherworldly and amoral. And while his significance in the history of Indian philosophy may be under appreciated, his greater influence on the character and form of popular Hinduism may also be under-recognized, despite the fact that he is regarded as a saint in many parts of Southern India. According to Karl Potter, “…Ramanuja’s tradition can be said to represent one of the main arteries through which philosophy reached down to the masses, and it may be that Vishishtadvaita is today the most powerful philosophy in India in terms of numbers of adherents, whether they know themselves by that label or not” (Potter p.253). Whether Potter is correct or not, Ramanuja is an Indian philosopher who defended the symbiosis of the spiritual, moral and practically earnest life.
Last updated: May 1, 2005 | Originally published: