Ayn Rand was a major intellectual of the twentieth century. Born in Russia in 1905 and educated there, she immigrated to the United States after graduating from the university, where she studied history, politics, philosophy, and literature. Rand had always found capitalism and the individualism of the United States a welcome alternative to the corrupt and negative socialism of Russia. Upon becoming proficient in English and establishing herself as a writer in the U.S., she became a passionate advocate of her philosophy, Objectivism.
Rand’s philosophy is in the Aristotelian tradition, with that tradition’s emphasis upon metaphysical naturalism, empirical reason in epistemology, and self-realization in ethics. Objectivism is rational self-interest and self-responsibility – the idea that no person is any other person’s slave. The virtues of her philosophy are principled policies based on rational assessment: rationality, productiveness, honesty (in order to rationally make the best decisions we must be privy to the facts), integrity, independence, justice, and pride.
Her political philosophy is in the classical liberal tradition, with that tradition’s emphasis upon individualism, the constitutional protection of individual rights to life, liberty, and property, and limited government.
She wrote both technical and popular works of philosophy, and she presented her philosophy in both fictional and non-fictional forms, the most philosophically complete and popular of which are Atlas Shrugged and Fountainhead. Her philosophy has influenced several generations of academics and public intellectuals, as well as having had widespread popular appeal.
Ayn Rand’s life was often as colorful as those of her heroes in her best-selling novels The Fountainhead and Atlas Shrugged. Rand first made her name as a novelist, publishing We the Living in 1936, The Fountainhead in 1943, and her magnum opus Atlas Shrugged in 1957. These philosophical novels embodied themes she then developed in non-fiction form in a series of essays and books written in the 1960s and 1970s.
Born in St. Petersburg, Russia, on February 2, 1905, Rand was raised in a middle-class family. As a child, she loved story-telling, and she decided at age nine to become a writer. In school she showed academic promise, particularly in mathematics. Her family was devastated by the communist revolution of 1917, both by the social upheavals that the revolution and the ensuing civil war brought and by her father’s pharmacy’s being confiscated by the Soviets. The family moved to the Crimea to recover financially and to escape the harshness of life the revolution brought to St. Petersburg. They later returned to Petrograd (the new name given to St. Petersburg by the Soviets), where Rand was to attend university.
At the University of Petrograd, Rand concentrated her studies on history, with secondary focuses on philosophy and literature. At university, she was repelled by the dominance of communist ideas and strong-arm tactics that suppressed free inquiry and discussion. As a youth, she had been repelled by the communists’ political program, and now an adult, she was also more fully aware of the destructive effects that the revolution had had on Russian society more broadly.
Having studied American history and politics in university, and having long been an admirer of Western plays, music, and movies, she became an admirer of America’s individualism, its vigor, and its optimism, seeing it as the opposite of Russian collectivism, decay, and gloom. Not believing, however, that she would be free under the Soviet system to write the kinds of books she wanted to write, she resolved to leave Russia and go to America.
Rand graduated from the University of Petrograd in 1924. She then enrolled at the State Institute for Cinema Arts in order to study screen writing. In 1925, she finally received permission from the Soviet authorities to leave the country in order to visit relatives in the United States. Officially, her visit was to be brief; Rand, however, had already decided not to return to the Soviet Union.
After several stops in western European cities, Rand arrived in New York City in February 1926. From New York, she traveled on to Chicago, Illinois, where she spent the next six months living with relatives, learning English, and developing ideas for stories and movies. She had decided to become a screenwriter, and, having received an extension to her visa, she left for Hollywood, California.
On Rand’s second day in Hollywood, an event occurred that was worthy of her dramatic fiction and one that had a major impact on her future. She was spotted by Cecil B. DeMille, one of Hollywood’s leading directors, while she was standing at the gate of his studio. She had recognized him as he was passing by in his car, and he had noticed her staring at him. He stopped to ask why she was staring, and Rand explained that she had recently arrived from Russia, that she had long been passionate about Hollywood movies, and that she dreamed of being a screen writer. DeMille was then working on “The King of Kings,” and gave her a ride to his movie set and signed her on as an extra. Then, during her second week at DeMille’s studio, another significant event occurred: Rand met Frank O’Connor, a young actor also working as an extra. Rand and O’Connor were married in 1929, and they remained married for fifty years until his death in 1979.
Rand also worked for DeMille as a reader of scripts, and struggled financially while working on her own writing. She also held a variety of non-writing jobs until in 1932 she was able to sell her first screenplay, “Red Pawn,” to Universal Studios. Also in 1932 her first stage play, “Night of January 16th,” was produced in Hollywood and later on Broadway.
Rand had been working for years on her first significant novel, We the Living, and finished it in 1933. However, for several years it was rejected by various publishers, until in 1936 it was published by Macmillan in the U.S. and Cassell in England. Rand described We the Living as the most autobiographical of her novels, its theme being the brutality of life under communist rule in Russia. We the Living did not receive a positive reaction from American reviewers and intellectuals. It was published in the 1930s, a decade sometimes called the “Red Decade,” during which American intellectuals were often pro-Communist and respectful and admiring of the Soviet experiment.
Rand’s next major project was The Fountainhead, which she had begun to work on in 1935. While the theme of We the Living was political, the theme of The Fountainhead was ethical, focusing on individualist themes of independence and integrity. The novel’s hero, the architect Howard Roark, is Rand’s first embodiment of her ideal man, the man who lives on a principled and heroic scale of achievement.
As with We the Living, Rand had difficulties getting The Fountainhead published. Twelve publishers rejected it before being published by Bobbs-Merrill in 1943. Again not well received by reviewers and intellectuals, the novel nonetheless became a best-seller, primarily through word-of-mouth recommendation. The Fountainhead made Rand famous as an exponent of individualist ideas, and its continuing to sell well brought her financial security. Warner Brothers produced a movie version of the novel in 1949, starring Gary Cooper and Patricia Neal, for which Rand wrote the screenplay.
In 1946, Rand began work on her most ambitious novel, Atlas Shrugged. At the time she was working part-time as a screenwriter for producer Hal Wallis. In 1951 she and her husband moved to New York City, where she began to work full-time on Atlas. Published by Random House in 1957, Atlas Shrugged is her most complete expression of her literary and philosophical vision. Dramatized in the form of a mystery story about a man who stopped the motor of the world, the plot and characters embody the political and ethical themes first developed in We the Living and The Fountainhead, and integrates them into a comprehensive philosophy including metaphysics, epistemology, economics, and the psychology of love and sex.
Atlas Shrugged was an immediate best-seller and Rand’s last work of fiction. Her novels had expressed philosophical themes, although Rand considered herself primarily a novelist and only secondarily a philosopher. The creation of plots and characters and the dramatization of achievements and conflicts were her central purposes in writing fiction, rather than presenting an abstracted and didactic set of philosophical theses.
The Fountainhead and Atlas Shrugged, however, had attracted to Rand many readers who were strongly interested in the philosophical ideas the novels embodied and in pursuing them further. Among the earliest of those with whom Rand became associated and who later became prominent were psychologist Nathaniel Branden and economist Alan Greenspan, later Chairman of the Federal Reserve. Her interactions with these and several other key individuals were partly responsible for Rand’s turning from fiction to non-fiction writing in order to develop her philosophy more systematically.
From 1962 until 1976, Rand wrote and lectured on her philosophy, now named “Objectivism.” Her essays were during this period were mostly published in a series of periodicals, The Objectivist Newsletter, published from 1962 to 1965, the larger periodical The Objectivist, published from 1966 to 1971, and then The Ayn Rand Letter, published from 1971 to 1976. The essays written for these periodicals form the core material for a series of nine non-fiction books published during Rand’s lifetime. Those books develop Rand’s philosophy in all its major categories and apply it to cultural issues. Perhaps the most significant of the books are The Virtue of Selfishness, which develops her ethical theory, Capitalism: The Unknown Ideal, devoted to political and economic theory, Introduction to Objectivist Epistemology, a systematic presentation of her theory of concepts, and The Romantic Manifesto, a theory of aesthetics.
During the 1960s Rand’s most significant professional relationship was with Nathaniel Branden. Branden, author of The Psychology of Self-Esteem and later known as a leader in the self-esteem movement in psychology, wrote many essays on philosophical and psychological topics that were published in Rand’s books and periodicals. He was the founder and head of the Nathaniel Branden Institute, the leading Objectivist institution of the 1960s. Based in New York City, N.B.I. published with Rand’s sanction numerous Objectivist periodicals and pamphlets, and gave many series of lectures live in New York which were then distributed on tape around the United States and the rest of the world. The rapid growth of N.B.I. and the Objectivist movement came to a halt in 1968 when, for both professional and personal reasons, Rand and Branden parted ways.
Rand continued to write and lecture consistently until she stopped publishing The Ayn Rand Letter in 1976. Thereafter she wrote and lectured less as her husband’s health declined, leading to his death in 1979, and as her own health began to decline. Rand died on March 6, 1982, in her New York City apartment.
The provocative title of Ayn Rand’s The Virtue of Selfishness matches an equally provocative thesis about ethics. Traditional ethics has always been suspicious of self interest, praising acts that are selfless in intent and calling amoral or immoral acts that are motivated by self interest. A self-interested person, on the traditional view, will not consider the interests of others and so will slight or harm those interests in the pursuit of his own.
Rand’s view is that the exact opposite is true: self-interest, properly understood, is the standard of morality and selflessness is the deepest immorality.
Self interest rightly understood, according to Rand, is to see oneself as an end in oneself. That is to say that one’s own life and happiness are one’s highest values, and that one does not exist as a servant or slave to the interests of others. Nor do others exist as servants or slaves to one’s own interests. Each person’s own life and happiness is his ultimate end. Self interest rightly understood also entails self-responsibility: one’s life is one’s own, and so is the responsibility for sustaining and enhancing it. It is up to each of us to determine what values our lives require, how best to achieve those values, and to act to achieve those values.
Rand’s ethic of self interest is integral to her advocacy of classical liberalism. Classical liberalism, more often called “libertarianism” in the 20th century, is the view that individuals should be free to pursue their own interests. This implies, politically, that governments should be limited to protecting each individual’s freedom to do so. In other words, the moral legitimacy of self interest implies that individuals have rights to their lives, their liberties, their property, and the pursuit of their own happiness, and that the purpose of government is to protect those rights. Economically, leaving individuals free to pursue their own interests implies in turn that only a capitalist or free market economic system is moral: free individuals will use their time, money, and other property as they see fit, and will interact and trade voluntarily with others to mutual advantage.
Fundamentally, the means by which we live our lives as humans is reason. Our capacity for reason is what enables us to survive and flourish. We are not born knowing what is good for us; that is learned. Nor are we born knowing how to achieve what is good for us; that too is learned. It is by reason that we learn what is food and what is poison, what animals are useful or dangerous to us, how to make tools, what forms of social organization are fruitful, and so on.
Thus Rand advocates rational self interest: one’s interests are not whatever one happens to feel like; rather it is by reason that one identifies what is to one’s interest and what isn’t. By the use of reason one takes into account all of the factors one can identify, projects the consequences of potential courses of action, and adopts principled policies of action.
The principled policies a person should adopt are called virtues. A virtue is an acquired character trait; it results from identifying a policy as good and committing to acting consistently in terms of that policy.
One such virtue is rationality: having identified the use of reason as fundamentally good, being committed to acting in accordance with reason is the virtue of rationality. Another virtue is productiveness: given that the values one needs to survive must be produced, being committed to producing those values is the virtue of productiveness. Another is honesty: given that facts are facts and that one’s life depends on knowing and acting in accordance with the facts, being committed to awareness of the facts is the virtue of honesty.
Independence and integrity are also core virtues for Rand’s account of self interest. Given that one must think and act by one’s own efforts, being committed to the policy of independent action is a virtue. And given that one must both identify what is to one’s interests and act to achieve them, a policy of being committed to acting on the basis of one’s beliefs is the virtue of integrity. The opposite policy of believing one thing and doing another is of course the vice of hypocrisy; hypocrisy is a policy of self-destruction, on Rand’s view.
Justice is another core self-interested virtue: justice, on Rand’s account, means a policy of judging people, including oneself, according to their value and acting accordingly. The opposite policy of giving to people more or less than they deserve is injustice. The final virtue on Rand’s list of core virtues is pride, the policy of “moral ambitiousness,” in Rand’s words. This means a policy of being committed to making oneself be the best one can be, of shaping one’s character to the highest level possible.
The moral person, in summary, on Rand’s account, is someone who acts and is committed to acting in his best self-interest. It is by living the morality of self interest that one survives, flourishes, and achieves happiness.
This account of self interest is currently a minority position. The contrasting view typically pits self interest against morality, holding that one is moral only to the extent that one sacrifices one’s self interest for the sake of others or, more moderately, to the extent one acts primarily with regard to the interests of others. For example, standard versions of morality will hold that one is moral to the extent one sets aside one’s own interests in order to serve God, or the weak and the poor, or society as a whole. On these accounts, the interests of God, the poor, or society as a whole are held to be of greater moral significance that one’s own, and so accordingly one’s interests should be sacrificed when necessary. These ethics of selflessness thus believe that one should see oneself fundamentally as a servant, as existing to serve the interests of others, not one’s own. “Selfless service to others” or “selfless sacrifice” are stock phrases indicating these accounts’ view of appropriate motivation and action.
The core difference between Rand’s self interest view and the selfless view can be seen in the reason why most advocates of selflessness think self interest is dangerous: conflicts of interest.
Traditional ethics takes conflicts of interest to be fundamental to the human condition, and takes ethics to be the solution: basic ethical principles are to tell us whose interests should be sacrificed in order to resolve the conflicts. If there is, for example, a fundamental conflict between what God wants and what humans naturally want, then religious ethics will make fundamental the principle that human wants should be sacrificed for God’s. If there’s a fundamental conflict between what society needs and what individuals want, then some versions of secular ethics will make fundamental the principle that the individual’s wants should be sacrificed for society’s.
Taking conflicts of interest to be fundamental almost always stems from one of two beliefs: that human nature is fundamentally destructive or that economic resources are scarce. If human nature is fundamentally destructive, then humans are naturally in conflict with each other. Many ethical philosophies start from this premise – for example, Plato’s myth of Gyges, Jewish and Christian accounts of Original Sin, or Freud’s account of the id. If what individuals naturally want to do to each other is rape, steal, and kill, then in order to have society these individual desires need to be sacrificed. Consequently, a basic principle of ethics will be to urge individuals to suppress their natural desires so that society can exist. In other words, self interest is the enemy, and must be sacrificed for others.
If economic resources are scarce, then there is not enough to go around. This scarcity then puts human beings in fundamental conflict with each other: for one individual’s need to be satisfied, another’s must be sacrificed. Many ethical philosophies begin with this premise. For example, followers of Thomas Malthus’s theory that population growth outstrips growth in the food supply fall into this category. Karl Marx’s account of capitalist society is that brutal competition leads to the exploitation of some by others. Garret Hardin’s famous use of the lifeboat analogy asks us to imagine that society is like a lifeboat with more people that its resources can support. And so in order to solve the destructive competition the lack of resources leads us to, a basic principle of ethics will be to urge individuals to sacrifice their interests in obtaining more (or even some) so that others may obtain more (or some) and society can exist peacefully. In others words, in a situation of scarcity self interest is the enemy and must be sacrificed for others.
Rand rejects both the scarce resources and destructive human nature premises. Human beings are not born in sin or with destructive desires; nor do they necessarily acquire them in the course of growing to maturity. Instead one is born tabula rasa (“blank slate”), and through one’s choices and actions one acquires one’s character traits and habits. As Rand phrased it, “Man is a being of self-made soul.” Having chronic desires to steal, rape, or kill others are the result of mistaken development and the acquisition of bad habits, just as are chronic laziness or the habit of eating too much junk food. And just as one is not born lazy but can by one’s choices develop oneself into a person of vigor or sloth, one is not born anti-social but can by one’s choices develop oneself into a person of cooperativeness or conflict.
Nor are resources scarce in any fundamental way, according to Rand. By the use of reason, humans can discover new resources and how to use existing resources more efficiently, including recycling where appropriate and making productive processes more efficient. Humans have for example continually discovered and developed new energy resources, from animals to wood to coal to oil to nuclear to solar; and there is no end in sight to this process. At any given moment, the available resources are a fixed amount, but over time the stock of resources are and have been constantly expanding.
Because humans are rational they can produce an ever-expanding number of goods, and so human interests do not fundamentally conflict with each other. Instead Rand holds that the exact opposite is true: since humans can and should be productive, human interests are deeply in harmony with each other. For example, my producing more corn is in harmony with your producing more peas, for by our both being productive and trading with each other we are both better off. It is to your interest that I be successful in producing more corn, just as it is to my interest that you be successful in producing more peas.
Conflicts of interest do exist within a narrower scope of focus. For example, in the immediate present available resources are more fixed, and so competition for those resources results, and competition produces winners and losers. Economic competition, however, is a broader form of cooperation, a way socially to allocate resources without resorting to physical force and violence. By competition, resources are allocated efficiently and peacefully, and in the long run more resources are produced. Thus, a competitive economic system is in the self interest of all of us.
Accordingly, Rand argues that her ethic of self interest is the basis for personal happiness and free and prosperous societies.
The impact of Rand’s ideas is difficult to measure, but it has been great. All of the books she published during her lifetime are still in print, have sold more than twenty million copies, and continue to sell hundreds of thousands of copies each year. A survey jointly conducted by the Library of Congress and the Book of the Month Club early in the 1990s asked readers to name the book that had most influenced their lives: Atlas Shrugged was second only to the Bible. Excerpts from Rand’s works are regularly reprinted in college textbooks and anthologies, and several volumes have been published posthumously containing her early writings, journals, and letters. Those inspired by her ideas have published books in many academic fields and founded several institutes. Noteworthy among these are the Cato Institute, based in Washington, D.C., the leading libertarian think tank in the world. Rand, along with Nobel Prize-winners Friedrich Hayek and Milton Friedman, was highly instrumental in attracting generations of individuals to the libertarian movement. Also noteworthy are the Ayn Rand Institute, founded in 1985 by philosopher Leonard Peikoff and based in California, and The Objectivist Center, founded in 1990 by philosopher David Kelley and based in New York.
Stephen R. C. Hicks
U. S. A.
Last updated: July 7, 2005 | Originally published: