Acts of recognition infuse many aspects of our lives such as receiving a round of applause from a rapt audience, being spotted in a crowded street by a long-forgotten friend, having an application for a job rejected because of your criminal record, enjoying some words of praise by a respected philosophy professor, getting pulled over by the police because you are a black man driving an expensive car, and fighting to have your same-sex marriage officially sanctioned in order to enjoy the same benefits as hetero-sexual marriages. Evidently the various ways we are recognised (and recognise others) play an important role in shaping our quality of life. Recognition theorists go further than this, arguing that recognition can help form, or even determine, our sense of who we are and the value accorded to us as individuals.
Political theories of recognition, which attempt to reconfigure the concept of justice in terms of due or withheld recognition, can be contrasted with (but set alongside) the rise of multiculturalism, which has produced an array of literature focused on recognising, accommodating and respecting difference. Although these two trajectories overlap, there are important differences between them. Multicultural politics is rooted in the identity politics underlying various social movements that gained prominence during the 1960s, such as the civil rights movement and radical/cultural feminism. These movements tend to emphasise the distinctness and value of their cultural identity and demand group-specific rights to protect this uniqueness. Without depreciating identity politics and multiculturalism, this article is primarily concerned with political theories of recognition, particularly those formulated by Charles Taylor (who is also a prominent figure in multicultural politics), Nancy Fraser and Axel Honneth. These focus on the role played by recognition in individual identity formation and the normative foundation this can provide to theories of justice.
Despite its brief history as an explicitly political concept, philosophical interest in the idea of recognition can be traced to the work of Hegel, who first coined the phrase ‘struggle for recognition’ (kampf um anerkennung). This article begins by clarifying the specific political and philosophical meaning of recognition. It will provides an overview of Hegel’s remarks on recognition before proceeding to identify the contemporary advocates of recognition. It presents the main similarities and differences between these authors before examining some important criticisms levelled at concept of recognition. The conclusion is a reflection upon the increasing influence of recognition and how it may develop in the future.
The term ‘recognition’ has several distinct meanings: (1) an act of intellectual apprehension, such as when we ‘recognise’ we have made a mistake or we ‘recognise’ the influence of religion on American politics; (2) a form of identification, such as when we ‘recognise’ a friend in the street; and (3) the act of acknowledging or respecting another being, such as when we ‘recognise’ someone’s status, achievements or rights (upon the different meanings of recognition, see Inwood, 1992: 245-47; Margalit, 2001: 128-129). The philosophical and political notion of recognition predominantly refers to (3), and is often taken to mean that not only is recognition an important means of valuing or respecting another person, it is also fundamental to understanding ourselves.
Various attempts have been made to clarify precisely what is, and is not, to count as an act of recognition (perhaps most comprehensively by Ikäheimo and Laitinen, 2007). Ikäheimo (2002: 450) defines recognition as ‘always a case of A taking B as C in the dimension of D, and B taking A as a relevant judge’. Here A and B indicate two individual persons, specifically A is the recogniser and B the recognisee. C designates the attribute recognised in A, and D is the dimension of B’s personhood at stake. For example, I may recognise you as a person possessing certain rights and responsibilities in light of your being an autonomous, rational human being (for more on defining the structure of recognition, see Laitinen, 2002). A key feature of Ikäheimo’s definition is that it requires not only that someone be recognised by another, but that the person being recognised judges that the recogniser is capable of conferring recognition. This means that we must place sufficient value in the recogniser in order for their attitude towards us to count as recognitive. Brandom (2009) approaches this idea through the idea of authority, arguing that a genuine instance of recognition requires that we authorise someone to confer recognition. Similarly, one can gain authority and responsibility by petitioning others for recognition. Consequently, one has authority only insofar as one is recognised as authoritative.
We may not consider being valued by a wilful criminal as any sort of recognition in the sense being defined here. We do not judge them capable of conferring value on us, as we do not accord any value or respect to them. Similarly, someone who is coerced into recognising us may also fail to count as a relevant judge. A king who demands recognition of his superiority from all his subjects, simply in virtue of his being king, and threatens to punish them if they disobey, does not receive any meaningful kind of recognition for the subjects do not genuinely choose to confer value on him. Thus, in recognising another, we must also be recognised as a subject capable of giving recognition. This indicates that reciprocity or mutuality is likely to be a necessary condition of appropriate recognition (for a discussion of this point, see Laden, 2007).
A further issue in defining recognition is whether it is generative or responsive (Laitinen, 2002; Markell, 2007). A generation-model of recognition focuses on the ways in which recognition produces or generates reasons for actions or self-understandings. This is to say that someone ought to act in a certain way in virtue of being recognised as, for example, recognising someone as a rational being will generate certain duties and responsibilities for both the person being recognised and those who interact with him. A response-model of recognition focuses on the ways in which recognition acknowledges pre-existing features of a person. Here, to recognise someone is to acknowledge them as they already really are (Appiah, 1994: 149). This means that there are reasons why one ought to give recognition to someone prior to the act of recognition itself. Thus, for example, we ought to recognise someone’s ability to self-determination because they possess certain features, such as rational autonomy. The demand for recognition in a response-model is produced and justified through pre-existing characteristics of a person, whilst in the generation-model it is the act of recognition itself which confers those characteristics onto a person through their being recognised as such. The former is a case of person ‘knowing’, whilst the latter is a case of person ‘making’ (see Markell, 2002).
A third issue is whether groups or collectives can count as recognisers and recognisees. For example, when speaking of recognising a particular cultural group, do we mean we recognise that group qua a group, or as a collection of individuals? Similarly, does the granting of certain rights or respect apply to the group itself or the individual members belonging to that group? (For a detailed discussion and defence of group-differentiated minority rights, see Kymlicka, 1995). These questions revolve, at least in part, around the ontological status afforded to groups or collectives. Advocates of a politics of recognition are not always clear regarding whether or not groups can be granted recognition. Debates over the legitimacy or sovereignty of a state may depend upon the extent to which we recognise it as legitimate or sovereign. Important discussions of groups as entities include Tuomela (2007), Jones (2009) and List and Pettit (2011). However, as yet there has been little analysis of the connection between recognition and the ontology of groups. Charles Taylor (1994) argues for the importance of collective rights, but gives little consideration to whether collectives are genuine subjects over-and-above the individuals that constitute them. In his more recent work, Axel Honneth (Fraser and Honneth 2003: 159ff.) appears to give consideration to the possibility of groups as the object of recognition, but his general emphasis is on individual rights and recognition.
Common to all social and political notions of recognition is the shift from an atomistic to an intersubjective, dialogical understanding of the individual. Because our identity is shaped precisely through our relations to others, our being recognised by them, feelings of self-worth, self-respect and self-esteem are possible only if we are positively recognised for who we are. To this extent, theories of political recognition, which were first formulated in the 1990s, developed out of political movements centred upon such concepts as gender, sexuality, race, ethnicity and culture. Recognition, according to Taylor (1994), is an indispensible means of understanding and justifying the demands of these identity movements, which have had a major impact on society, particularly from the 1960s onwards. Consequently, for many political theorists, recognition is an integral component of any satisfactory modern theory of justice as well as the means by which both historical and contemporary political struggles can be understood and justified. In order to understand how such theories developed, it is necessary to examine their genesis within Hegel’s philosophy.
Descartes’ dualistic philosophy of consciousness created an influential legacy in which the mind was characterised as a private theatre and knowledge of the self was achieved through introspection. This atomistic conception of self, encapsulated in Descartes’ cogito, filtered into the transcendental idealism of Kant (despite his objections to Descartes’ philosophy) and the transcendental phenomenology of Husserl, as well as being present in the contract theories of Hobbes and Locke. Against this trend there emerged a strongly intersubjective conception of selfhood that found expression through the concept of recognition, the founder of which is typically identified as Hegel. Although Hegel has undoubtedly influenced the contemporary understanding of recognition more than any other philosopher, Hegel was himself inspired by the work of Johann Fichte (see Williams, 1992). In his Foundations of Natural Right (1796/7), Fichte argues that the ‘I’ (the ego or pure consciousness) must posit itself as an individual to be able to understand itself as a free self. In order for such self-positing to occur, the individual must recognise itself as ‘summoned’ by another individual. This is to say, the individual must acknowledge the claims of other free individuals in order to understand itself as a being capable of action and possessing freedom. Hence, one’s freedom is both rendered possible and yet limited by the demands made on us by others. A key feature of this idea is that the same applies in reverse – the other can only comprehend itself as free by being recognised as such. Hence, mutual recognition is necessary for human beings to understand themselves as free individuals (as beings capable of ‘I-hood’). Through this analysis, Fichte produced a thoroughly intersubjective ontology of humans and demonstrated that freedom and self-understanding are dependent upon mutual recognition.
These ideas were developed in greater detail by Hegel. In his Phenomenology of Spirit Hegel (1807: 229) writes, ‘Self-consciousness exists in itself and for itself, in that, and by the fact that it exists for another self-consciousness; that is to say, it is only by being acknowledged or “recognized”’. Self-knowledge, including one’s sense of freedom and sense of self, is never a matter of simple introspection. Rather, understanding ourselves as an independent self-consciousness requires the recognition of another. One must recognise oneself as mediated through the other. As Sartre, who was heavily influenced by Hegel, wrote, ‘The road of interiority passes through the Other’ (Sartre, 1943: 236-7). The idea of recognition is developed further in Hegel’s mature works, particularly Elements of the Philosophy of Right (1821), where it becomes an essential factor in the development of ethical life (sittlichkeit). According to Hegel, it is through the intersubjective recognition of our freedom that right is actualised. Rights are not instrumental to freedom; rather they are the concrete expression of it. Without recognition we could not come to realise freedom, which in turn gives rise to right. The work of Hegel consciously echoes the Aristotelian conception of humans as essentially social beings. For Hegel, recognition is the mechanism by which our existence as social beings is generated. Therefore, our successful integration as ethical and political subjects within a particular community is dependent upon receiving (and conferring) appropriate forms of recognition.
The part of Hegel’s work to lay bare certain fundamental dynamics involved in recognition is the oft-discussed master-slave dialectic which appears in the Phenomenology (see Pinkard, 1996: 46ff; Stern, 2002: 83ff.). Hegel introduces the idea of a ‘struggle for recognition’, describing an encounter between two self-consciousnesses which both seek to affirm the certainty of their being for themselves (Hegel, 1807: 232ff.). Such a conflict is described as a life-and-death struggle, insofar as each consciousness desires to confirm its self-existence and independence through a negation or objectification of the other. That is, it seeks to incorporate the other within its field of consciousness as an object of negation, as something which this consciousness is not, thus affirming its own unfettered existence. Of course, the other also tries to negate this consciousness, thus generating the struggle which results in affirmation of one self-consciousness at the cost of the negation or annihilation of the other. Only in this way, Hegel observes, only by risking life, can freedom be obtained. However, there is a key moment with this struggle. Namely, consciousness realises that it cannot simply destroy the other through incorporating it within itself, for it requires the other as a definite other in order to gain recognition. Thus, it must resist collapsing the other into itself, for to do so would also be to annihilate itself. It would be starving itself of the recognition it requires in order to be a determinate self-consciousness.
Within Hegel’s radical reworking of how the individual subject is understood, autonomy becomes a contingent, social and practical accomplishment; it is an intersubjectively-mediated achievement which is never simply given or guaranteed but always dependent upon our relations with others. This co-dependency results in mutual relations of recognition which are the condition for understanding oneself as a genuinely free being, albeit a free being which acknowledges, and thus adjusts itself, to the freedom of others. Discussing the process of recognition, Hegel (1807: 230) notes that it ‘is absolutely the double process of both self-consciousnesses… Action from one side only would be useless, because what is to happen can only be brought about by means of both’. As a result, these two self-consciousnesses ‘recognize themselves as mutually recognizing one another’ (ibid: 231). Hegel characterises this mutuality, which cannot be coerced but be freely given and received, as being at home in the other. Such a relation with another is the condition for the phenomenological experience of freedom and right. Consequently, our interactions with others are not a limitation on freedom, but rather the ‘enhancement and concrete actualization of freedom’ (Williams, 1997: 59).
We see now how the master-slave dialectic of recognition is inherently unstable and unsatisfying. The master has dominion over the slave, reducing the latter to the status of a mere ‘thing’ through refusing to recognise it as a free and equal self-consciousness. The slave, realising that life as a slave is better than no life at all, accepts this relation of dominance and subservience. Whilst the slave receives no recognition from the master, the master has ‘earned’ the recognition of a slave which it considers as less-than-human. Such recognition is not ‘real’ recognition at all and yet, within this Hegel’s dialectic of recognition, the master requires the recognition of the slave in order to gain some modicum of self-understanding and freedom. The recognition of the slave is ultimately worthless, for it is not the recognition of a free self-consciousness, which alone can grant the recognition on another required for self-certainty of existence and freedom. Trapped in this fruitless relation, the slave becomes the ‘truth’ of the master, and so the master, paradoxically, becomes enslaved to the slave. For Hegel, relations of domination provide a vicious spiral of recognition. They lead nowhere but to their own destruction. Hence recognition must always take place between equals, mediated through social institutions which can guarantee that equality and thus produce the necessary mutual relations of recognition necessary for the attainment of freedom. It is precisely this last point that recent recognition theorists have seized upon and elaborated into comprehensive discussions of justice.
Much contemporary interest in recognition was undoubtedly fuelled by Charles Taylor’s essay ‘Multiculturalism and the Politics of Recognition’ (1994), first published in 1992. Taylor’s lucid and concise article is often treated as the classic expression of a theory of recognition. However, it would be more accurate to say that Taylor awoke a general interest in the idea of recognition. His short essay provides a series of reflections and conjectures which, whilst insightful, do not constitute a full-blown theory of recognition. However, its exploratory nature and non-technical language has helped install it as the common reference point for discussions of recognition.
Taylor begins with the assertion that ‘a number of strands in contemporary politics turn on the need, sometimes the demand, for recognition’ (Taylor, 1994: 25). He identifies such a demand as present in the political activities of feminism, race movements and multiculturalists (for a critical discussion of this point, see Nicholson, 1996). The specific importance of recognition lies in its relationship to identity, which he defines as ‘a person’s understanding of who they are, of their fundamental characteristics as a human being’ (Taylor, 1994: 25). Because identity is ‘partly shaped by recognition or its absence’, then ‘Nonrecognition or misrecognition can inflict harm, can be a form of oppression, imprisoning someone in a false, distorted, and reduced mode of being’ (ibid.). Underlying Taylor’s model is the Hegelian belief that individuals are formed intersubjectively (see Section II). Our individual identity is not constructed from within and generated by each of us alone. Rather, it is through dialogue with others that we negotiate our identity. Taylor refers to these others as ‘significant others’, meaning those people who have an important role in our lives (that is, family, friends, teachers, colleagues, and so forth.). The idea that our sense of who we are is determined through our interaction with others initiates a shift from a monologic to a dialogic model of the self.
Taylor is keen to stress just how important recognition is, referring to it as ‘a vital human need’ (ibid: 26) and stating that misrecognition ‘can inflict a grievous wound, saddling its victims with a crippling self-hatred’ (ibid: 26). Deploying a brief historical narrative, Taylor argues that the collapse of social hierarchies, which had provided the basis for bestowing honour on certain individuals (that is, those high up on the social ladder), led to the modern day notion of dignity, which rests upon universalist and egalitarian principles regarding the equal worth of all human beings. This notion of dignity lies at the core of contemporary democratic ideals, unlike the notion of honour which is, he claims, clearly incompatible with democratic culture. This picture is complicated by the fact that alongside this development of dignity there emerged also a new understanding of ‘individualised identity’, one in which the emphasis was on each person’s uniqueness, which Taylor defines as ‘being true to myself and my own particular way of being’ (ibid: 28). Taylor refers to this idea of uniqueness as the ideal of authenticity, writing ‘Being true to myself means being true to my own originality, which is something only I can articulate and discover. In articulating it, I am also defining myself’ (ibid: 31).
Taylor has been accused of adopting an essentialist view of the self, on the basis that there is some inner ‘me’ waiting to be uncovered and displayed to (recognised by) the world (see section V. b). However, he is quick to point out that the discovery of our authenticity is not simply a matter of introspection. Rather, it is through our interactions with others that we define who we are. Nor is there an end point to this dialogue. It continues throughout our entire lives and does not even depend upon the physical presence of a specific other for that person to influence us. Consider, for example, the way an imaginary conversation with a deceased partner might influence how we act or view ourselves. The importance of recognition lies precisely in the fact that how others see (might) us is a necessary step in forming an understanding of who we are. To be recognised negatively, or misrecognised, is to be thwarted in our desire for authenticity and self-esteem.
Taylor’s uses these insights to construct a politics of equal recognition. He identifies two different ways in which the idea of equal recognition has been understood. The first is a politics of equal dignity, or a politics of universalism, which aims at the equalisation of all rights and entitlements. In this instance, all individuals are to be treated as universally the same through recognition of their common citizenship or humanity. The second formulation is the politics of difference, in which the uniqueness of each individual or group is recognised. Rousseau bitterly noted that man, having shifted from a state of self-sufficiency and simplicity to one of competition and domination that characterises modern society, has come to crave the recognition of their difference (Rousseau, 1754). In this detrimental situation, man is rendered dependent upon the views of others, craving what Rousseau termed ‘amour propre’ through the admiration of those around him, leading to an endless competition for greater achievements and respect and thus robbing man of his independence. For Rousseau, this desire for individual distinction, achievement and recognition conflicts with a principle of equal respect
Returning to Taylor, he notes that there is also a universal basis to this second political model insofar as all people are entitled to have their identity recognised: ‘we give due acknowledgement only to what is universally present – everyone has an identity – through recognizing what is peculiar to each. The universal demand powers an acknowledgement of specificity’ (Taylor, 1994: 39). One consequence of this politics of difference is that certain rights will be assigned to specific groups but not others. The two approaches can be summed as follows. The politics of equal dignity is difference-blind, whereas the politics of difference is, as the name suggests, difference-friendly (this does not mean that a politics of equal dignity is not also ‘friendly’ towards difference, but rather that differences between individuals cannot be the normative foundation for the assignment of certain rights or entitlement to some individuals or groups but not others).
Taylor defends a politics of difference, arguing that the concept of equal dignity often (if not always) derives its idea of what rights and entitlement are worth having from the perspective of the hegemonic culture, thus enforcing minority groups to conform to the expectations of dominant culture and hence relinquish their particularity. Failure to conform will result in the minority culture being derided and ostracised by the dominant culture. As Taylor (ibid: 66) notes, ‘dominant groups tend to entrench their hegemony by inculcating an image of inferiority in the subjugated’. A clear instance of this can be seen in de Beauvoir’s claim that woman is always defined as man’s ‘other’ or ‘shadow’ (de Beauvoir, 1949). Woman exists as a lack; characterised through what she does not possess or exhibit (namely, male and masculine traits). Similarly, civil rights movements have frequently protested that the image of the ‘human’ was inevitably white, Western, educated, middle-class and wealthy. An example of how this plays out in everyday life is the recent, though now generally discarded, practice of labelling pink crayons ‘flesh’ coloured. Both feminist and race theorists have tried to convey the idea that the white male is simply another particular instance of humanity, rather than its ‘default’ image or constitutive, universal norm. This point was strongly made by Fanon (1952), who detailed how racism infiltrates the consciousness of the oppressed, preventing psychological health through the internalisation of subjection and otherness. This in turn alienates the black person from both their society and their own body, owing to the fact that the world is defined in terms of ‘whiteness’ and thus as something essentially irretrievably different (alien) to them.
Axel Honneth has produced arguably the most extensive discussion of recognition to date. He is in agreement with Taylor that recognition is essential to self-realisation. However, he draws more explicitly on Hegelian intersubjectivity in order to identify the mechanics of how this is achieved, as well as establishing the motivational and normative role recognition can play in understanding and justifying social movements. Following Hegel (1807; 1821) and Mead (1934), Honneth identifies three ‘spheres of interaction’ which are connected to the three ‘patterns of recognition’ necessary for an individual’s development of a positive relation-to-self. These are love, rights, and solidarity (Honneth, 1995: 92ff; also Honneth 2007, 129-142).
The mode of recognition termed ‘love’ refers to our physical needs and emotions being met by others and takes the form of our primary relationships (that is, close friends, family and lovers). It provides a basic self-confidence, which can be shattered through physical abuse. The mode of recognition termed ‘rights’ refers to the development of moral responsibility, developed through our moral relations with others. It is a mutual mode of recognition ‘in which the individual learns to see himself from the perspective of his [or her] partner in interaction as a bearer of equal rights’ (Honneth, 1992: 194). The denial of rights through social and legal exclusion can threaten one’s sense of being a fully active, equal and respected member of society. Finally, the mode of recognition termed ‘solidarity’ relates to recognition of our traits and abilities. It is essential for developing our self-esteem and for how we become ‘individualised’, for it is precisely our personal traits and abilities that define our personal difference (Honneth, 1995: 122). Consequently, unlike the relations of love and rights, which express universal features of human subjects, esteem ‘demands a social medium that must be able to express the characteristic differences between human subjects in a universal, and more specifically, intersubjectively obligatory way’ (ibid.). All three spheres of recognition are crucial to developing a positive attitude towards oneself:
For it is only due to the cumulative acquisition of basic self-confidence, of self-respect, and of self-esteem… that a person can come to see himself or herself, unconditionally, as both an autonomous and an individuated being and to identify with his or her goals and desires (ibid: 169).
According to Honneth, the denial of recognition provides the motivational and justificatory basis for social struggles. Specifically, it is through the emotional experiences generated by certain attitudes and actions of others towards us that we can come to feel we are being illegitimately denied social recognition. This argument makes use of Dewey’s theory of emotion as intentionally orientated. Certain emotional states, such as shame, anger and frustration, are generated by the failure of our actions. Conversely, more positive emotional states are generated through successful action. The experience of negative emotional states can, in theory, reveal to us that an injustice is taking place (namely, that we are not being given due and appropriate recognition). However, as Honneth points out, feelings of shame or anger need not (indeed, do not) necessarily disclose relations of disrespect (ibid: 138). What they provide is the potential for identifying the occurrence of an injustice which one is justified in opposing. The experience of disrespect is the raw material from which normatively justified social struggles can be formulated. Furthermore, it is only within certain social contexts, those in which the ‘means of articulation of a social movement are available’ (ibid: 139), that experiences of disrespect provide the motivational basis for political struggles (see Honneth, 2007). Presumably, disrespect in other contexts would lead to individual acts of retaliation or undirected violence, rather than coordinated resistance.
This phenomenological approach to recognition thus locates the source and justification of social struggles in the experiences and expectations of recognition. Of course, as noted, it requires the further steps of (a) locating these experiences within a socially-generated framework of emancipatory discourse; and (b) the establishment of common experiences amongst individuals for these individual frustrations to develop into social struggles. Therefore, it would be naïve to think that Honneth is blind to the importance of, say, ensuring the means and rights to collective political action within societies. But the fundamental component of any attempt to identify injustice and vindicate the necessary remedies must be located in the individual’s experiences of disrespect (Honneth, 2007) (for a potential problem with this position, see Rogers, 2009).
In order to justify these claims, Honneth ascribes an inherent expectation of recognition to humans, referring to demands generated from such an expectation as the ‘“quasi-transcendental interests” of the human race’ (Fraser and Honneth, 2003: 174). It is only through the failure of such expectations that recognition can be a motivational source, arising via negative emotional experiences. This assumption allows Honneth to assess societal change as a developmental process driven by moral claims arising from experiences of disrespect. Honneth (1995: 168) summarises his somewhat teleological account (a product of Honneth’s Hegelian and Aristotelian tendencies) as follows: ‘Every unique, historical struggle or conflict only reveals its position within the development of society once its role in the establishment of moral progress, in terms of recognition, has been grasped’.
The positing of an approximate and ideal end-state, presumably one in which full recognition reigns supreme, allows a distinction between progressive, emancipatory struggles and those which are reactionary and / or oppressive. Therefore, from this general position of enabling the self-realisation of one’s desires, characteristics and abilities, we can assess current socio-political struggles and analyse their future directions so as to ensure their promoting of the conditions for self-realisation. Honneth is careful to specify that he is not advocating a single, substantive set of universal values and social arrangements. Rather, his concept of ‘the good’ is concerned with the ‘structural elements of ethical life’ which enable personal integrity (ibid: 172). Therefore, the posited ‘end-point’ from which normative claims can be made must emanate from structural relations outlined in the three distinct patterns of recognition which foster a positive relation-to-self (for a discussion of Honneth’s conception of the good / ethical life, see Zurn, 2000). Here, Honneth is trying to retain a Kantian notion of respect and autonomy through identifying the necessary conditions for self-realisation and self-determination, akin to a Kantian kingdom of ends in which all individuals receive and confer recognition on one another. Simultaneously, in stressing the minimal or ‘bare’ conditions necessary for this, he aims to avoid committing himself to a singular, substantial conception of the good life and thus resists the dangers of reproducing an exclusivist and exclusionary conception of what constitutes the good life.
Whereas there are broad areas of agreement between Honneth and Taylor, Nancy Fraser is keen to differentiate her theory of recognition from both of their respective positions. Fraser’s overarching theme throughout her works on recognition is the dissolving of the assumed antithesis between redistribution and recognition (arguably this assumption is a consequence of critical theory’s Marxist roots, within which framework Fraser’s work undoubtedly emerges from). Thus far, the presentation of recognition and redistribution has been presented (at least implicitly) as an either/or decision. Fraser believes that this binary opposition derives from the fact that, whereas recognition seems to promote differentiation, redistribution supposedly works to eliminate it. The recognition paradigm seems to target cultural injustice, which is rooted in the way people’s identities are positively or negatively valued. Individuals exist as members of a community based upon a shared horizon of meanings, norms and values. Conversely, the distribution paradigm targets economic injustice, which is rooted in one’s relation to the market or the means of production (Fraser and Honneth, 2003: 14). Here, individuals exist in a hierarchically-differentiated collective class system which, from the perspective of the majority class who are constituted by a lack of resources, needs abolishing.
According to Fraser, both these forms of injustice are primary and co-original, meaning that economic inequality cannot be reduced to cultural misrecognition, and vice-versa. Many social movements face this dilemma of having to balance the demand for (economic) equality with the insistence that their (cultural) specificity be met. Fraser (1997: 19) gives the example of the feminist movement by posing the question, ‘How can feminists fight simultaneously to abolish gender differentiation [through economic redistribution] and to valorize gender specificity [through cultural recognition]?’. There is a clear divergence here between the monistic models of Taylor and Honneth, in which recognition is the foundational category of social analysis and distribution is treated as derivative, and Fraser’s dualistic model. Whereas Honneth thinks a sufficiently elaborated concept of recognition can do all the work needed for a critical theory of justice, Fraser argues that recognition is but one dimension of justice, albeit a vitally important one.
The disagreement over whether or not distribution can be made to supervene on recognition arises from the differing interpretations of recognition. According to Fraser (Fraser and Honneth 2003: 29), one can understand recognition as either (a) a matter of justice, connected to with the concept of a universal ‘right’ (Fraser’s position); or (b) a matter of self-realisation, connected with historically-relative cultural conceptions of the ‘good’ (Honneth’s and Taylor’s position). In (b) Fraser draws out the Aristotelian idea of eudaimonia (flourishing), which runs throughout Honneth’s teleological account. Contra Honneth and Taylor, Fraser does not look to situate the injustice of misrecognition in the retardation of personal development. Rather, she identifies it with the fact that ‘some individuals and groups are denied the status of full partners in social interaction simply as a consequence of institutionalized patterns of cultural value in whose construction they have not equally participated and which disparage their distinctive characteristics or the distinctive characteristics assigned to them’ (ibid). Addressing injustices arising from misrecognition therefore means looking at the discursive representations of identities in order to identity how certain individuals are assigned a relatively inferior social standing. Hence, on Fraser’s model, misrecognition should not be construed as an impediment to ethical self-realization (as it is for Taylor and Honneth). Instead, it should be conceived as an institutionalised relation of subordination.
Owing to her identification of recognition with social status, the evaluative element in Fraser’s account is the notion of ‘parity of participation’. According to this principle, ‘justice requires that social arrangements permit all (adult) members of society to interact with one another as peer’ (ibid: 36). In effect, recognition is required in order to guarantee that all members of society have an equal participation in social life. Crucially, participatory parity also requires material / economic redistribution in order to guarantee that people are independent and ‘have a voice’ (ibid). Because Honneth equates recognition with self-realisation, the derivative issues of redistribution are only generated to the extent that they inhibit this personal development. For Fraser, injustice in the form of both misrecognition and maldistribution is detrimental to the extent that it inhibits participatory parity.
Fraser considers two possible remedies for injustice, which transcend the redistribution-recognition divide by being applicable to both. The first is ‘affirmation’, which incorporates any action which corrects ‘inequitable outcomes of social arrangements without disturbing the underlying framework that generates them’ (ibid: 23). The second is ‘transformation’, which refers to ‘remedies aimed at correcting inequitable outcomes precisely by restricting the underlying generative framework’ (ibid). Fraser’s concept of transformation highlights her belief that certain forms of injustice are ingrained within ‘institutionalized patterns of cultural value’ (ibid: 46). Certain forms of inequality, including those of race and gender, derive from the signifying effect of socio-cultural structures. These discursive frameworks, situated within language and social arrangements, reproduce hierarchical binary oppositions such as ‘heterosexual/homosexual’, ‘white/black’ and ‘man/woman’. Thus, the solution is not simply a matter of revaluing heterosexual, female or black identities. Rather, one must attempt to deconstruct the binary logic which situates people as inherently inferior, creating a ‘field of multiple, debinarized, fluid, ever-shifting differences’ (Fraser, 1997: 24). One key aspect of this transformative approach is that, unlike the affirmative approach which aims to alter only one particular group’s sense of worth or material situation, it would change everyone’s sense of self. The proposal made by Fraser, then, is the radical restructuring of society, achieved through transformative redistribution (that is, socialism) and recognition (cultural deconstruction). It should be noted that in her more recent work on recognition (that is, Fraser 2000; 2001), she resists offering any particular remedies, arguing instead that the required response to injustice will be dictated by the specific context. Thus, she appears to distance herself from the more ‘deconstructive’ elements of her earlier work (see Zurn, 2003).
In a very important discussion, Fraser and Honneth (2003) defend their respective theories of recognition (see also Honneth, 2001). Underlying the disagreements between them is their respective positions regarding the distribution / recognition debate. As noted in Section III, Fraser believes that recognition and distribution are two irreducible elements of a satisfactory theory of justice. This is to say, they are of equal foundational importance – the one cannot be collapsed into the other. Honneth, on the other hand, contends that issues of distribution are ultimately explained and justified through issues of recognition. As he writes, ‘questions of distributive justice are better understood in terms of normative categories that come from a sufficiently differentiated theory of recognition’ (ibid: 126). He begins justifying this claim through a historical survey of political movements and unrest amongst the lower classes during the early stages of capitalism. What marked such activities was the commonly held belief that the honour and dignity of the members of the lower classes were not being adequately respected. Summarising these findings, Honneth (ibid: 132) proclaims that ‘subjects perceive institutional procedures as social injustice when they see aspects of their personality being disrespected which they believe they have a right to recognition’.
One important consequence of this view is that it undermines the received wisdom that collective identity movements are a recent ‘modern’ phenomenon. In actual fact, according to Honneth, experiences of disrespect and denigration of an individual’s or group’s identity are the constitutive feature of all instances of social discontent. Portraying ‘recognition’ as the sole preserve of cultural minorities struggling for social respect is therefore highly misleading and obscures the fact that challenges to the existing social order are always driven by the moral experience of failing to receive what is deemed to be sufficient recognition (ibid: 160). Any dispute regarding redistribution of wealth or resources is reducible to a claim over the social valorisation of specific group or individual traits. The feminist struggle over the gendered division of labour is, according to Honneth, primarily a struggle regarding the prevailing assessment of achievement and worth which has had important redistributive effects, such as a trend towards greater access to, and equality within, the workplace and the acknowledgement of ‘female’ housework. The division that Fraser makes between economic distribution and cultural recognition is, Honneth claims, an arbitrary and ultimately misleading one that ignores the fundamental role played by recognition in economic struggles, as well as implying that the cultural sphere of society can be understood as functioning independently of the economic sphere.
Fraser (ibid: 30ff.) offers four advantages of her status model over Honneth’s monistic vision of justice as due recognition (for a discussion of these, see Zurn, 2003). Arguably the most important of these is that, in locating injustice in social relations governed by cultural patterns of representations, she can move beyond both Taylor’s and Honneth’s reliance on psychology as the normative force underlying struggles for recognition. Recalling that Honneth locates the experiences of injustice in the emotional responses to frustrated expectations of due recognition, Fraser argues that she is able to ‘show that a society whose institutionalized norms impede parity of participation is morally indefensible whether or not they distort the subjectivity of the oppressed’ (ibid: 32). The ideal of participatory parity gives Fraser her normative component, for it provides the basis on which different recognition claims can be judged. Namely, a valid recognition claim is one in which subjects can show that ‘institutionalized patterns of cultural value deny them the necessary intersubjective conditions [for participatory parity]’ (ibid: 38). Honneth’s invocation of pre-political suffering, generated by the perceived withholding of recognition, as the motivating force behind social movements is thus rejected by Fraser as seriously problematic. In particular, she says, the idea that all social discontent has the same, single underlying motivation (misrecognition) is simply implausible. Honneth rejects other motivational factors such as ‘resentment of unearned privilege, abhorrence of cruelty, aversion of arbitrary power… antipathy to exploitation, dislike of supervision’ that cannot not simply be reduced down to, or subsumed by, an overarching expectation of appropriate recognition.
Another problem with Honneth’s psychological model of experiences of injustice is that, so Fraser argues, it shifts the focus away from society and onto the self, thus ‘implanting an excessively personalized sense of injury’ (ibid: 204). This can lead to the victim of oppression internalising the injustice or blaming themselves, rather than the discursive and material conditions within which they are situated as oppressed or harmed. Indeed, Fraser proceeds to point out that there can be no ‘pure’ experience of moral indignation caused by withheld or inappropriate recognition. There is no realm of personal experience that is not experienced through a particular linguistic and historical horizon, which actively shapes the experience in question (see section V. d). Thus to introduce a ‘primordial’ sense of moral suffering is, Fraser claims, simply incoherent (similar concerns are raised by McNay, 2008: 138ff.). Honneth cannot invoke psychological experiences of disrespect as the normative foundation for his theory of recognition as they cannot be treated as independent of the discursive conditions within which the subject is constituted. To do so is to rely on an ultimately unjustifiable transcendental account of the subject’s access to their sense of moral worth grounded in the right to recognition.
In his response to Fraser, Honneth points out that she can necessarily focus only on those social movements that have already become visible. By analysing the ways in which individuals and groups are socially-situated by institutionalised patterns of cultural value, Fraser limits herself to only those expressions of social discontent that have already entered the public sphere. The logic of this criticism seems to be that, if (in)justice is a matter of how society signifies subjects’ abilities and characteristics, then it can only address those collective subjectivities which are currently socially recognised. In other words, there could be a plethora of individuals and groups who are struggling for recognition which have not yet achieved public acknowledgement and thus have not been implicated within positive or negative social structures of signification. There appears some weight to this criticism, for a successful critical social theory should be able to not only critique the status quo, but identify future patterns of social resistance. If, on Fraser’s account, justice is a matter of addressing how subjects are socially-situated by existing value structures, then it seems to lack the conceptual apparatus to look beyond the present. The ability to identify social discontent must, Honneth argues, be constructed independently of social recognition, and therefore ‘requires precisely the kind of moral-psychological considerations Fraser seeks to avoid’ (ibid: 125). In ignoring the individual’s experiences of injustice as the disrespect of aspects of their personality, a social theory can only address the present situation, rather than exploring the normative directions of future social struggles. It is out of the frustration of individual expectations of due recognition that new social movements will emanate, rather than the pre-existing patterns of signification which currently hierarchically situate subjects.
Despite its influence and popularity, there are a number of concerns regarding the concept of recognition as a foundational element in a theory of justice. This article cannot hope to present an exhaustive list, so instead offers a few of the most common critiques.
Perhaps the one most frequently voiced criticism is that regarding the reification of group identity. Put simply, the concern is that, in initiating an identity politics in which one demands positive recognition for a group’s specific characteristics, specific characteristics can be seen as necessarily constitutive of this group and thus any group member who does not display these characteristics risks being ostracised. Such claims are often cloaked in a language of ‘authenticity’ which leads to demands for conformity amongst individual members of the group in order to gain acceptance and approval. This risks producing intergroup coercion and enforcing conformity at the expense of individual specificity.
To give an example, discussed by Appiah (1994) in his response to Taylor’s essay on recognition, the construction of a black politics in which black identity is celebrated can provide a sense of self-worth and dignity amongst historically denigrated black communities. However, it can also lead to a ‘proper’ way of being black, one which all members of the black community must demonstrate in order to partake in this positive self-image. Such expectations of behaviour can lead, Appiah notes (ibid: 163), to one form of tyranny being replaced by another. Specifically, individuals who fail to exemplify authentic ‘black’ identity can find themselves once again the victims of intolerance and social exclusion. Similar dynamics of exclusion can be seen in the debate within certain feminist circles about whether lesbians can be properly considered ‘women’. Extrapolating from these concerns, Markell (2003) argues that Taylor conflates individual identity with group identity with the result that agency is rendered a matter of adopting the identity one is assigned through membership of one’s community. Consequently, the critical tension between the individual and community is dissolved, which leaves little (if any) space for critiquing or resisting the dominant norms and values of one’s community (see also Habermas, 1991: 271).
The reification of group identity can also lead to separatism through generating an ‘us-and-them’ group mentality. By valorising a particular identity, those other identities which lack certain characteristics particular to the group in question can be dismissed as inferior. This isolationist policy runs counter to the ideal of social acceptability and respect for difference that a politics of recognition is meant to initiate. Reifying group identity prevents critical dialogue taking place either within or between groups. Internal group members who challenge apparently ‘authentic’ aspects of their culture or group identity can be labelled as traitors, whilst non-group members are dismissed as unqualified to comment on the characteristics of the group on the basis that they are ‘outsiders’. The result is a strong separatism and radical relativism in which intergroup dialogue is eliminated. This can mask over the ways in which various axes of identity overlap and thus ignores the commonalities between groups. For example, the focus of black feminists on ‘black culture’ and the oppression this has suffered can lead to a failure to recognise their commonality with women in other cultures. Conversely, the tendency among feminists to focus on the concept of ‘woman’ can lead them to ignore the potential alliances they might share with other oppressed groups that don’t focus on gender injustice. Underlying this critique is the idea that identity is always multilayered and that each individual is always positioned at the intersection of multiple axes of oppression. Simply reducing one’s sense of oppression to a single feature of identity (such as race or gender) fails to acknowledge the way that each feature of identity is inextricably bound up with other features, so that, for example, race and gender cannot be treated as analytically distinct modes of dominance.
Similar to the concerns over reification, there is a concern that recognition theories invoke an essentialist account of identity. This has particularly been the case with regards Taylor’s model of recognition (see McNay, 2008: 64ff). Critics accuse recognition theory of assuming that there is a kernel of selfhood that awaits recognition (see, for example, Heyes, 2003). The struggle for recognition thus becomes a struggle to be recognised as what one truly is. This implies that certain features of a person lie dormant, awaiting discovery by the individual who then presents this authentic self to the world and demands positive recognition for it. Although Taylor is keen to stress that his model is not committed to such an essentialist account of the self, certain remarks he makes do not help his cause. For example, in describing the modern view of how we create a sense of ‘full being’, he notes that, rather than connecting with some source outside of ourselves (such as God or the Platonic Good), ‘the source we have to connect with is deep within us. This fact is part of the massive subjective turn of modern culture, a new form of inwardness, in which we come to think our ourselves as beings with hidden depths’ (Taylor, 1994: 29). Taylor proceeds to note that ‘Being true to myself means being true to my own originality, which is something only I can articulate and discover’ (ibid: 31) and that authenticity ‘calls on me to discover my own original way of being. By definition, this way of being cannot be socially derived, but must be inwardly generated’ (ibid: 32).
A more radical account of intersubjectivity can be found in Arendt (1958). Examining the processes by which the subject reveals who they are, she shifts the focus away from a personal revelation on the part of the agent and into the social realm: ‘it is more than likely that the “who” , which appears so clearly and unmistakably to others, remains hidden from the person itself, like the daimōn in Greek religion which accompanies each man throughout his life, always looking over his shoulder from behind and thus visible only to those he encounters’ (Arendt, 1958: 179-80). One important consequence of this idea is that, in order to address the question of ‘who’ we are, we must be willing to relinquish control of any such answer. In so doing, we place ourselves into the hands of others. As Arendt writes, ‘This unpredictability of outcome [of personal disclosure] is closely related to the revelatory character of action and speech, in which one discloses one’s self without ever either knowing himself or being able to calculate beforehand whom he reveals’ (ibid: 192) (for an Arendt-inspired critique of recognition, see Markell, 2003).
Taylor mitigates his position and, arguably, eschews any form of essentialism, by arguing that we always work out our identity through dialogue with others. However, there is a possibility that he slips towards a subjectivist position, for it seems that it is the individual who ultimately decides what their ‘true’ identity is. For example, Taylor (1994: 32-3) states that this dialogue with others requires that we struggle with and sometimes struggle against the things that others want to see in us. However, he does not state to what we appeal to in this potential struggle with others. If it is ultimately our sense of who we are, then this would seem to undermine the very conditions of intersubjectivity that Taylor wants to introduce into the notion of personal identity. For, if one is the ultimate judge and jury on who one is, then those around us will simply be agreeing or disagreeing with our pre-existent or inwardly-generated sense of self, rather than playing an ineliminable role in its constitution.
Again, it is unlikely that Taylor would endorse any form of subjectivism. Indeed, his turn towards intersubjective recognition is precisely meant to resist the idea that one simply decides who one is and demands that others recognise oneself in such a way. Taylor would certainly seem critical of the existential tradition, which emphasised the need for one to define oneself and provide meaning to the world. Although Sartre deployed the language of intersubjectivity (see V. d) and highlighted the importance of the other, his analysis of the in-itself and the for-itself, coupled with describing how we are each born alone and must carry the weight of the world on our shoulders (with no-one able to lighten the burden), suggests an ego which negates (and hence is radically separated from) the world. This split between ‘I’ and ‘you’ renders any notion of dialogical identity construction impotent.
Recognition, contrasted with this existential picture, theories seem well equipped to resist any accusation that they slide into subjectivism. However, they must provide a criterion from which to judge whether individual and collective demands for recognition are legitimate. For example, it cannot be the case that all demands for recognition are accepted, for we are unlikely to want to recognise the claims of a racist or homophobic group for cultural protection. There is a danger that Taylor’s model does not explicitly state the conditions by which acceptable claims for recognition can be separated from unacceptable claims. His politics of difference is premised on ‘a universal respect for the human capacity to form one’s identity (Taylor, 1994: 42). Hence he seems committed to respecting difference qua difference, regardless of the particular form this difference takes. There is a sense that, as long as recourse is made to an ‘authentic’ life, then the demand for recognition should be met. But no matter how strongly the racist group insists upon their authenticity, we would be likely to resist recognising the value and worth of their identity as racists.
Certain theorists have tended to cast recognition in a far more negative, conflictual light. Typically, they interpret Hegelian recognition as evolving an inescapable element of domination between, or appropriation of, subjects. Perhaps the most notable of such thinkers is Sartre (1943), whose account of intersubjectivity appears to preclude any possibility of recognition functioning as a means of attaining political solidarity or emancipation. According to Sartre, our relations with other people are always conflictual as each of us attempts to negate the other in an intersubjective dual. The realisation of our own subjectivity is dependent upon our turning the other into an object. In turn, we are made to feel like an object within the gaze of the other. Sartre’s famous example is the shameful, objectifying experience of suddenly feeling the ‘look’ or ‘gaze’ of another person upon us when carrying out a contemptible act. In this moment of shame, I feel myself as an object and am thus denied existence as a subject. My only hope is to make the other into an object. There are no equal or stable relations between people; all interactions are processes of domination.
Whereas Sartre focuses on the problem of being recognised, Levinas (1961) turns to the ethical issues attending how one recognises others. According to Levinas, Hegelian recognition involves an unavoidable appropriation or assimilation of the other into one’s own subjectivity. By this he means that in recognising the other we render them ‘knowable’ according to our own terms, thus depriving him or her of their irreducible ‘alterity’ or difference. Levinas believes that the denying of such difference is the fundamental ethical sin as it fails to respect the other in their absolute exteriority, their absolute difference to us. In effect, to recognise someone is to render them the same as us; to eliminate their inescapable, unapprehendable and absolute alterity (Yar, 2002).
An alternative perspective on the self-other relationship can be found in Merleau-Ponty who argues that the other is always instigated within oneself, and vice-versa, through the potential reversibility of the self-other dichotomy (that is, that the self is also a potential other; seeing someone necessarily involves the possibility of being seen). Merleau-Ponty explicitly rejects the Levinasian perspective that the other is an irreducible alterity. Rather, the self and other are intertwined through their bodily imbrications in the world. He describes our respective perspectives on the world as slipping into one another and thus being brought together: ‘In reality, the other is not shut up inside my perspective of the world, because this perspective itself has no definite limits, because it slips spontaneously into the other’s’ (Merleau-Ponty, 1945: 411). Consequently, there is no ‘problem’ of the other, for the other is already contained within our being, as we are within theirs. This resonates with Heidegger’s characterisation of Being (Dasein) as being-with-others. We are always already alongside others, bound up in relations of mutuality that prevent any strict ontological distinction between self, other and world.
The Levinasian and Sartrean accounts of the self-other relationship can be criticised from a hermeneutic perspective for failing to acknowledge the fact that understanding is essentially a conversation with another, and that a simple reduction of the other to a sameness with oneself, or a pure objectification of the other, would preclude the possibility of a genuine interaction from which mutual understanding could arise (Gadamer, 1960). Levinas presents a monological account of understanding, ignoring the fundamentally dialogical nature of intersubjectivity. As Taylor (1994: 67) approvingly noted, understanding according to Gadamer is always a fusion of horizons, a coming-to-understanding between two individuals who require the perspective of the other in order to make sense of their own (and vice-versa). Neither the total incorporation of the other into the perspective of the recognisee, nor the reduction of the other to pure object, is possible on a hermeneutic account of meaning and understanding.
Concurrent with the rise of identity politics, there has been a trend towards ‘deconstructive’ or ‘destabilising’ accounts of the individual subject. Rather than representing a single critical perspective on recognition and identity politics, the post-structural challenge can be understood as a broad term incorporating various attempts at showing how the subject is always constructed through and within networks of power and discourse (e.g. Foucault, 1980; Butler, 1990; Haraway 1991; Lloyd, 2005; McNay, 2008).
Perhaps the most notable theorist in this regard is Foucault, who develops a detailed account of the way in which the subject is constituted through discursive relations of power. Within Foucault’s theory, the individual becomes the ‘site’ where power is enacted (and, importantly, resisted or reworked). Foucault’s genealogical method was employed precisely in order to explore the conditions under which we, as subjects, exist and what causes us to exist in the way that we do. According to Foucault, not only are we controlled by truth and power, we are created by it too. Concerning his genealogical method, Foucault (1980: 117) writes, ‘One has to dispense with the constituent subject, to get rid of the subject itself, that’s to say, to arrive at an analysis which can account for the constitution of the subject within a historical framework’. This leads to a far more problematic view of the subject than is generally found within recognition theories. Specifically, issues of power, coercion and oppression are seen as coeval with identity formation and intersubjective relations.
This suggests that there can be no instances of mutual recognition that do not simultaneously transmit and reproduce relations of power. As Foucault (1988: 39) notes, ‘If I tell the truth about myself… it is in part that I am constituted as a subject across a number of power relations which are exerted over me and which I exert over others’. Critics of recognition theorists argue that they ignore the fundamental relationship between power and identity formation, assuming instead that intersubjective relations can be established which are not mediated through power relations. McNay (2008) develops this critique through a discussion of Bourdieu’s concept of habitus, arguing that Taylor assumes that language is an expressive medium that functions independently of, and antecedent to, power and thus fails to analyse how ‘self-expression is constitutively shaped by power relations’ (ibid: 69).
Another important theorist in this regard is Judith Butler, whose account of gender identity develops certain key themes of Foucauldian theory as well as insights offered up by Derrida on the re-iteration of norms as fundamental to identity formation. Butler (1988: 519) begins outlining this project by arguing that gender is ‘in no way a stable identity or locus of agency from which various acts proceed; rather it is an identity tenuously constituted in time – an identity instituted through a stylized repetition of acts’. Gender is created through acts which are ‘internally discontinuous’. These acts produce the ‘appearance of substance’, but this apparition is no more than ‘a constructed identity, a performative accomplishment which the mundane social audience, including the actors themselves, come to believe and to perform in the mode of belief’ (ibid: 520; see also Butler 1990: 141). Essentially, we internalise a set of discursive practices which enforce conformity to a set of idealised and constructed accounts of gender identity that reinforce heterosexual, patriarchal assumptions about what a man and woman is meant to be like.
Turning the commonsense view of gender on its head, Butler argues that the various acts, thoughts and physical appearances which we take to arise from our gender are actually the very things which produce our sense of gender. Gender is the consequence, rather than the cause, of these individual, isolated, norm-governed acts. Because acts which constitute gender are governed by institutional norms which enforce certain modes of behaviour, thought, speech, and even shape our bodies, all positive constructions of gender categories will be exclusionary. Consequently, not only does Butler deny any ontological justification for a feminist identity politics, but she also rejects the possibility of a political justification. Identity categories ‘are never merely descriptive, but always normative, and as such, exclusionary’ (1992: 16). As a result, ‘Any effort to give universal content or specific content to the category of women… will necessarily produce factionalization’ and so, ‘“identity” as a point of departure can never hold as the solidifying ground of a feminist political movement’ (ibid: 15).
Infusing issues of power into the recognition debate therefore presents problems for existent models of recognition. Taken to its extreme, contemporary feminist accounts of gender and identity may be seen as reason to decisively reject recognition politics. If, as Butler suggests, gender identity is intrinsically connected to power, then to demand recognition for one’s identity could seen as becoming compliant with existing power structures. Such a position would have no possibility of radically critiquing the status quo and would thus potentially forfeit any emancipatory promise. Upon the relationship between the individual and power, Foucault (1980: 98) writes: ‘[Individuals] are not only its [power’s] intent or consenting target; they are always also the elements of its articulation. In other words, individuals are the vehicles of power, not its point of application’. The concern is that there is no form of self-realisation in recognition models that does not, in some way, reproduce patterns of dominance or exclusion.
Despite the above reservations regarding the concept of recognition and its political application, there is a growing interest in the value of recognition as a normative socio-political principle. The increasingly multicultural nature of societies throughout the world seems to call for a political theory which places respect for difference at its core. In this regard, recognition theories seem likely to only increase in influence. It should also be noted that they are very much in their infancy. It was only in the 1990s that theorists formulated a comprehensive account of recognition as a foundational concept within theories of justice. To this extent, they are still in the process of being fashioned and re-evaluated in the light of critical assessment from various schools of thought.
For many thinkers, the concept of recognition captures a fundamental feature of human subjectivity. It draws attention to the vital importance of our social interactions in formulating our sense of identity and self-worth as well as revealing the underlying motivations for, and justifications of, political action. It seems particularly useful in making sense of notions of authenticity and the conditions for agency, as well as mapping out the conditions for rational responsibility and authority (see Brandom, 2009). As a result, recognition can be seen as an indispensible means for analysing social movements, assessing claims for justice, thinking through issues of equality and difference, understanding our concrete relations to others, and explicating the nature of personal identity. Although there remain concerns regarding various aspects of recognition as a social and political concept, it is entirely possible that many of these will be addressed and resolved through future research.
Last updated: April 8, 2011 | Originally published: April 7, 2011
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