Reductionists are those who take one theory or phenomenon to be reducible to some other theory or phenomenon. For example, a reductionist regarding mathematics might take any given mathematical theory to be reducible to logic or set theory. Or, a reductionist about biological entities like cells might take such entities to be reducible to collections of physico-chemical entities like atoms and molecules. The type of reductionism that is currently of most interest in metaphysics and philosophy of mind involves the claim that all sciences are reducible to physics. This is usually taken to entail that all phenomena (including mental phenomena like consciousness) are identical to physical phenomena. The bulk of this article will discuss this latter understanding of reductionism.
In the twentieth century, most philosophers considered the question of the reduction of theories to be prior to the question of the reduction of entities or phenomena. Reduction was primarily understood to be a way to unify the sciences. The first section below will discuss the three traditional ways in which philosophers have understood what it means for one theory to be reducible to another. The discussion will begin historically with the motivations for and understanding of reduction to be found in the logical positivists, particularly Rudolf Carnap and Otto Neurath, and continue through more recent models of inter-theoretic reduction. The second section will examine versions of reductionism, as well as the most general and currently influential argument against reductionism, the argument from multiple realization. Although many philosophers view this argument as compelling, there are several responses available to the reductionist that will be considered. The final section will discuss two ways of reducing phenomena rather than theories. With the decline of logical positivism and the rise of scientific realism, philosophers’ interest in reduction has shifted from the unity of theories to the unity of entities. Although sometimes reduction of one class of entities to another is understood as involving the identification of the reduced entities with the reducing entities, there are times when one is justified in understanding reduction instead as the elimination of the reduced entities in favor of the reducing entities. Indeed, it is a central question in the philosophy of mind whether the correct way to view psychophysical reductions is as an identification of mental entities with physical entities, or as an elimination of mental phenomena altogether.
Table of Contents
- Three Models of Theoretical Reduction
- Reductionism: For and Against
- Reduction of Entities: Identification vs. Elimination
- References and Further Reading
In what follows, the theory to be reduced will always be referred to as the target theory (T). The theory to which one is attempting to reduce the target theory will be known as the base theory (B).
There are three main ways in which reduction has been understood since the 1920s. These may generally be stated as follows:
- Theory T reduces to theory B when all of the truths of T (including the laws) have been translated into the language of B.
- Theory T reduces to theory B when all of the laws of T have been derived from those of B.
- Theory T reduces to theory B when all of the observations explained by T are also explained by B.
The general goal of a theoretical reduction is to promote the unity of science. All of these models provide some sense in which science may become more unified. For sciences may become unified by being expressed in the same language. This allows one to see that there is only one language that is required to express all truths in the theories. Sciences may also become unified when the laws of one theory are shown to be derivable from those of another theory. This allows one to see that there is only one basic set of principles that is required to account for the other truths in the theories. Finally, sciences may become unified when the observations explained by one theory are shown to be also explainable by another theory. This allows one to see that only one of the theories is really necessary to explain the class of phenomena earlier thought to need the resources of two theories to explain.
The first section will examine three conceptually distinct models of reduction: the translation model, the derivation model, and the explanation model. These models need not compete with one another. As will be seen in the following sections, depending on how one understands translation, derivation, and explanation, these models may complement each other. Historically, the translation model is associated with the early logical positivists Carnap and Neurath, the derivation model with the later logical empiricists Carl Hempel and Ernest Nagel, and the explanation model with John Kemeny and Paul Oppenheim.
Carnap describes the translation model of reduction in the following way:
An object (or concept) is said to be reducible to one or more objects if all statements about it can be transformed into statements about these other objects. (1928/1967, 6)
In order to see why one should be interested in achieving reductions in this sense, one must first clarify what it was that the positivists, in particular, Carnap and Neurath, wanted out of reductionism.
In The Logical Structure of the World, Carnap tries to reduce all language to phenomenalist language, i.e. that of immediate experience (1928/1967). Shortly after this, influenced largely by his discussions with Neurath, Carnap changed his position regarding the sort of language into which all meaningful sentences should be translated. In his short monograph, The Unity of Science, he generally speaks of reducing all statements to a physical language, but his official position is that it does not matter which language all statements are translated into as long as they are all translated into one common, universal language (1963, 51). Carnap thought that physical language, understood as the language of objects in space and time (rather than the language of physics per se), was one salient contender for this universal language. (1934, 52).
So, Carnap’s main reductionist thesis is that:
… science is a unity, that all empirical statements can be expressed in a single language, all states of affairs are of one kind and are known by the same method. (1934, 32)
One may now ask two questions. First, why should one want to translate all statements into one common language? And second, what relationship does this translation have with the program of unifying the sciences?
For Carnap and Neurath, one common interest in unification stemmed from a frustration with the methods of philosophy and the social sciences. They argued that these disciplines too often rely on subjective methods of verification such as intuition and in the social sciences, empathy and verstehen. The positivists found these methods problematic and in need of replacement with the methods used in the physical sciences. Methods that relied on data and statements referring to the subjective states of individual observers could not be verified intersubjectively and thus could not be used to make intersubjectively testable predictions. For example, since the methodological use of empathy was rampant in actual practice, the statements (and methods) used by social scientists needed to be reinterpreted within an intersubjectively understandable framework. In his “Sociology and Physicalism,” Neurath argues that this is possible:
If someone says that he requires this experience of “organic perceptions” in order to have empathy with another person, his statement is unobjectionable … That is to say, one may speak of “empathy” in the physicalistic language if one means no more by it than that one draws inferences about physical events in other persons on the basis of formulations concerning organic changes in one’s own body … When we analyze the concepts of “understanding” and “empathy” more closely, everything in them that is usable in a physicalistic way proves to be a statement about order, exactly as in all sciences. (1931/2/1959, 298)
The idea, which Carnap also defended, was that all sciences, insofar as their statements were meaningful, could be translated into a common language. Once this translation was carried out, scientists in all disciplines could make predictions that were verifiable intersubjectively. So, following this strand of reasoning, the task of unifying (i.e. reducing) the sciences was important so that all sciences could be assimilated to a language in which it was possible to make intersubjectively understandable explanations and predictions – one of the central goals of developing scientific theories in the first place.
So far, nothing has been said that would provide motivation for reduction of all statements to the language of one science. One might grant that it is important that all theories be formulated in a language amenable to intersubjective understanding, however, why must all of the sciences be formulated in the same language? Why could the physical sciences not be formulated in one intersubjectively understandable language and psychology in another and biology in yet another? Why is reduction in the sense of translation of all statements to the one common language something anyone should care about? For these early reductionists, the main motivation was practical.
The Vienna Circle, a group of philosophers and scientists of which Carnap and Neurath formed part of the core, met and formulated their ideas at a time when Europe had just survived one war and was about to embark on another. At this time, particularly with anti-Semitism and fascism intensifying, scientists were being forced to disperse. Previously, Vienna had been a fertile center of scientific research, but political developments were making it necessary for many of the prominent scientists to scatter to other areas in Europe, the Soviet Union, and the United States. With this geographical separation, the concern was that this would prompt a rift in scientific dialogue, and that scientists both within and across disciplines would have a hard time sharing their ideas. As Jordi Cat and Nancy Cartwright have recently argued, for Neurath, this interdisciplinary sharing of ideas was crucial for several reasons (Cartwright et. al. 1995; Cartwright et. al. 1996). This discussion will focus on three.
First, it is common to look at scientists as engaged in the task of developing a complete account of the world. What is needed is a theory (or group of theories) that will be able to account for all phenomena. In other words, for each event that has occurred, this account should be able to give a complete explanation of it. And for each event that is to occur, the theory should be able to predict that it will occur. What Neurath noted was that as science developed it became more and more fragmented and as a result of ever-increasing specialization, it was impossible for any one practitioner to be versed in what was going on in all of the separate subdisciplines. This allowed for the possibility that large gaps between theories might develop, leaving events that no research program was engaged in trying to explain, thus preventing the sciences from giving a complete picture. Relatedly, Neurath was also concerned that the inability of any one researcher to see the big picture of the sciences would make room for contradictions to appear between the explanations different disciplines gave of one set of phenomena (1983, 140). If the sciences were unified in such a way that allowed scientists to see the big picture (outside of their own subdisciplines), this would begin to remedy the issues of both (a) gaps and (b) contradictions between different theories.
Another one of Neurath’s motivations for unifying the sciences was to eliminate redundancy between disciplines. He argues:
… the special sciences themselves exhibit in various ways the need for such a unification. For example, the different psychological theories employ so many different terms and phrases that it becomes difficult to know whether they are dealing with the same subject or not… One of the most important aims of the Unity of Science movement is therefore concerned with the unification of scientific language. Distinct terms occur in different disciplines which nevertheless may have the same function and much fruitless controversy may arise in trying to find a distinction between them… A large collection of terms have been gathered by the various sciences during the centuries, and it is necessary to examine this collection from time to time, for terms should not be multiplied beyond necessity. (1983, 172-3)
Two related ideas are motivating Neurath’s desire to eradicate redundancy between theories. The first is clearly expressed in the last line above. Neurath would like to minimize the number of terms used in the theory, to encourage theoretical simplicity. One should not introduce more language into our theories than is necessary, and so it is important to decide whether one can do without some of the terms used by a particular theory. This will make science as a whole simpler (and as a result, more digestible). One obvious way of eradicating such linguistic redundancy would be by translating all theories into a common language and this is precisely what Neurath proposes.
A second point that Neurath raises is a desire to see the different sciences as all describing a common subject matter. To use one of his examples, one might ask if the terms ‘stimulus’ and ‘response’ in biology are just different words for the same phenomena discussed in the physical sciences using the terms ‘cause’ and ‘effect’. Here, Neurath seems to be relying on an implicit metaphysical conviction that all of the sciences describe one world and not disparate spheres of reality. However, there may be reason to think that while Neurath professed an aversion toward asking metaphysical questions (and using metaphysical terminology like ‘world’ and ‘reality’), there does seem to be an implicit unified metaphysics underlying his desire to see scientific language unified.
It is important to noteone last aspect of Neurath’s interest in reduction of theories to a common language. This motivation is related to Neurath’s, and later Carnap’s, adoption of a coherentist picture of truth and justification. According to Neurath, statements are not justified in terms of their matching some external reality. This would require presupposing some kind of metaphysical picture of reality, which is something that Neurath would have rejected. Instead, statements are only justified insofar as they are confirmed by, or cohere with, other statements. To explain his view, Neurath appealed to his now famous metaphor of sailors having to rebuild their ship while at sea:
Our actual situation is as if we were on board a ship on an open sea and were required to change various parts of the ship during the voyage. We cannot find an absolute immutable basis for science; and our various discussions can only determine whether scientific statements are accepted by a more or less determinate number of scientists and other men. New ideas may be compared with those historically accepted by the sciences, but not with an unalterable standard of truth. (1983, 181)
Again, there is no world that one can compare statements to in order to confirm them and see that they are justified. The only basis for justification is other “historically accepted” statements. Once one understand this, it is easy to see why the translational unification of the sciences would be important. Communication of scientists across disciplines provides further confirmation of their theories. The better a theory coheres with other theories and the more theories with which it coheres, the more justified it will be. Thus, one should look for a common language so that such communication and connections can be established across disciplines.
It was previously stated that Carnap and Neurath wanted all theories to be translated into a language free of subjective terms, one that could be used to make testable predictions. In addition, it was also important that this common language could allow for communication across all disciplines. This would encourage (i) the filling in of gaps and elimination of contradictions between theories, (ii) the elimination of redundancy and enhancement of simplicity, and (iii) the possibility of a stronger justification for theories. Neurath spent the last years of his life beginning what was to be the unfinished project of the International Encyclopedia of Unified Science. This was to be a series of volumes in a common, physicalist language that could be used to encourage interaction between scientists. The first set of volumes would discuss issues in the general methodology of science, while the later volumes would include up-to-date discussions of research in all different areas of the sciences. Reading these would give researchers a better picture of science as a whole and promote the three virtues (i-iii) just mentioned.
It is important to emphasize Neurath and Carnap’s motivations for their reductionist project. This will allow us to consider the benefits of reductionism and what this perspective does not entail. Examining these previous motivations, one can see that there is very little that is required of a common language of unified science. Carnap says that, “[i]n order to be a language for the whole of Science, the physical language needs to be not only intersubjective but also universal” (1934, 67). So it must be the case that for a language to be the common language, it must not include any subjective terms, such as those referring to the intrinsic qualities of one’s own experiences. It must also be possible to translate all other statements from scientific theories into the common language. In addition, the universal language should also be nonredundant.
These minimal requirements on a universal language of science do not require that the language into which all theories are capable of being translated be the language of physics. Unlike the physicalist reductionism that is the orthodoxy of today, the thesis of reductionism advocated by Carnap and Neurath did not require that all sciences reduce to physics.
It is worth emphasizing this feature of the positivist’s conception of reductionism because it allows one an opportunity to recognize the independence of the original movement of reductionism from a need to see physics as the science to which all others reduce. Sometimes reductionism is dismissed as a theory of the world that is overly conservative, not making room for a plurality of sciences and resultant methodologies. However, this is simply not the case. What the positivists were interested in was seeing scientists of different disciplines cooperate in a way that would expedite and expand research, and better confirm theories. An attempt to translate all sciences into a common language would help achieve the goal of the unification of science. Translation of all theories into the language of physics would be preferable to a translation of all theories to phenomenalistic language since the latter fails to generally be intersubjectively understandable. However, any intersubjective language that was sufficiently universal in scope would serve their purposes.
After Carnap and Neurath, reduction as translation of terms to a common language was still discussed, but reduction also came to be understood in the two other ways mentioned above – as the explanation of all observations in terms of one base theory, and as the derivation of all theories from one base theory. For example, Carl Hempel saw the reduction of a theory as involving two tasks. First, one reduces all of the terms of that theory, which involves translation into a base language. As Hempel notes, “the definitions in question could hardly be expected to be analytic… but … may be understood in a less stringent sense, which does not require that the definiens have the same meaning, or intension, as the definiendum, but only that it have the same extension or application” (1966, 103). Then, one reduces the laws of the theory into those of a base theory by derivation (1966, 104).
The best known model of reduction as derivation is found in Ernest Nagel’s The Structure of Science. According to Nagel, a reduction is effected when the laws of the target science are shown to be logical consequences of the theoretical assumptions of a base science (1961, 345-358). Once this is accomplished, one can see that there is only one basic set of principles that is required to account for truths in both theories. For Nagel, one goal of reduction is the move science closer to the ideal of “a comprehensive theory which will integrate all domains of natural science in terms of a common set of principles” (1961, 336).
Unlike Hempel, Nagel did not think that all reductions would first require a translation of terms. He distinguished between homogeneous reductions and heterogeneous reductions, and only in the latter case does the target science include terms that are not already included in the base science (1961, 342). However, he does concede that in the cases of interest to him, the target science will contain terms that do not occur in the theory of the base discipline, so the reduction will be heterogeneous. This does not necessarily mean that one must translate terms from the target science into the language of the base science. For example, one interested in reducing psychology to physics will notice that psychological theories contain terms like ‘belief’, ‘desire’, and ‘pain’, which do not occur in the base, physical theory. In these cases, assumptions must be added to the laws of the base science (physics) stating relations between these (psychological) terms and the terms already present in the base science. These assumptions, often called ‘bridge laws’, will then allow one to derive the laws and theorems of the target science from the theory of the base discipline. They need not be thought of as providing translations, as will be explained shortly (Nagel 1961, 351-354).
Abstractly, one may consider the derivations that constitute Nagelian reductions as taking the following form. Where ‘B1’ and ‘B2’ are terms in the language of the base science and ‘T1’ and ‘T2’ are terms in the language of the science that is the target of the reduction,
The occurrence of a B1 causes the occurrence of a B2 (a law in the base science).
If something is a B1, then it is a T1. (bridge law)
If something is a B2, then it is a T2. (bridge law)
The occurrence of a T1 causes the occurrence of a T2 (a law in the target science) (Hempel 1966, 105).
The conclusion here is the law in the target science that one wanted to reduce to the laws of the base science. Some caveats are in order regarding this way of representing Nagelian reductions. First, there is nothing in the account requiring the laws to involve causal language. Causal terminology is used in the above example merely for ease of exposition. Moreover, the precise nature of the bridge laws required for a reduction is controversial. Philosophers have differed in what they regard as necessary for something to be the kind of bridge law to facilitate a legitimate reduction.
As a matter of logic, all that is required for a successful derivation are bridge laws that take the form of conditionals. However, the derivation would also be successful if the connectives in the bridge laws were not conditionals but biconditionals or identity statements. In his discussion of reduction, Nagel mentions that these bridge laws could have any one of the following statuses. They could be (1) logical or analytic connections between terms, (2) conventional assumptions created by fiat, or (3) empirical hypotheses (1961, 354). Only when the first case obtains is it usually plausible to say that the reduction is partially constituted by an act of translation. Nagel does not question whether conditional bridge laws are enough to effect legitimate reductions. In the post-positivistic, realist aftermath of Nagel’s book, most philosophers have held that in order for such derivations to help one achieve a more unified science (genuine reductions), the bridge laws may not merely have any of these statuses, but ought to have the strength of identities, e.g. Sklar (1967). So, to constitute a genuine reduction, a derivation ought to look something like the following:
The occurrence of a B1 causes the occurrence of a B2 (a law in the base science).
Something’s being a B1 = its being a T1. (bridge law)
Something’s being a B2 = its being a T2. (bridge law)
Therefore, The occurrence of a T1 causes the occurrence of a T2 (a law in the target science).
To illustrate the idea, consider a putative reduction of the theory of thermal conductivity to a theory of electrical conductivity. The Wiedemann-Franz Law is a simple physical law stating that the ratio of the thermal conductivity of a metal to the electrical conductivity of a metal is proportional to the temperature. Given this law, which one might try to take as a bridge law, it is possible to systematically derive facts about a metal’s electrical conductivity from facts about its thermal conductivity. It is inferred from the law that a metal has a certain electrical conductivity and it is a certain temperature if and only if it has such and such a thermal conductivity. If reductions could be carried out simply using conditionals or even biconditionals as bridge laws, then one would have thereby reduced the theory of electrical conductivity to the theory of thermal conductivity (and vice versa). However, some have argued that this would be the wrong result. This case serves as a counterexample to the view that derivations involving bridge laws with the status of biconditionals (or conditionals for that matter) constitute legitimate reductions. As Lawrence Sklar has put it:
Does this law establish the reduction of the theory of heat conduction to the theory of the conduction of electricity? No one has ever maintained that it does. What does explain both the electrical and thermal properties of matter, and the Wiedemann-Franz law as well, is the reduction of the macroscopic theory of matter to the theory of its atomic microscopic constitution. Although the correlation points to a reduction it does not constitute a reduction by itself. (1967, 119)
Jaegwon Kim has also argued that unless the bridge laws have the status of identities they cannot serve as part of genuine reductions:
It is arguably analytic that reduction must simplify; after all, reductions must reduce… On this score bridge laws of the form [Something is a T1 if and only if it is a B1] apparently are wanting in various ways. Since [Something is a T1 if and only if it is a B1] is supposed to be a contingent law, the concepts [T1] and [B1] remain distinct; hence bridge laws yield no conceptual simplification. Further, since we have only a contingent biconditional “iff” connecting properties [T1] and [B1], [T1] and [B1] remain distinct properties and there is no ontological simplification…. If we want ontological simplification out of our reductions, we must somehow find a way of enhancing bridge laws… into identities. (Kim 1998, 96-7)
The view is that only in cases where there are bridge laws with the status of identities do the derivations of laws constitute reductions.
This is a common point made in the philosophy of mind literature and it is due mainly to the aims of these reductionists – they want to solve the mind-body problem and thus what they are primarily interested in is not the unity of scientific theories (what drove Carnap and Neurath) but rather ontological simplification. This is why they think that bridge laws must have the status of identities. For others working in philosophy of science, there are reasons to think that theoretical reductions are valuable in themselves even if they do not lead to ontological reductions (i.e. identities). These philosophers of science endorse Nagel’s original position that reductions are legitimate even in the case where the bridge laws do not have the status of identities or even biconditionals. So long as one can establish derivations between two theories, one has unified them by establishing inter-connections. For this purpose, it is sufficient, as Nagel thought, that the bridge laws have the status of conditionals (See for example Ladyman, Ross, and Spurrett (2007, 49) who reject the suggestion that Nagelian reductions require identities.)
Before moving on, it is important to note some refinements that have been made to Nagel’s model of reduction since its original conception. In the 1960s, under the influence of the work of Thomas Kuhn, as philosophers of science began to focus more on constructing their theories with detailed study of cases from the history of science. Some suggested that Nagel’s model of reduction was implausible in at least a couple of ways. If one focused on actual examples of reductions from the history of science, like the reduction of physical optics to Maxwell’s electromagnetic theory, or even Nagel’s own example of the reduction of thermodynamics to statistical mechanics, Nagel’s model didn’t quite apply. The most compelling critique of Nagel’s account was made by Kenneth Schaffner (1967). Schaffner pointed to two specific problems with Nagel’s model of reduction.
The first problem with Nagel’s model was that it presupposed the simple deducibility of the target theory from the base theory and bridge laws, whereas in fact, in order for a derivation to be successful, the target theory often had to be modified somewhat. This might be because the target theory said some things that, in light of the base theory, one could now see were false. For example, Schaffner points out that once Maxwell’s theory was developed, one could see that a central law of physical optics, Fresnel’s law of intensity ratios, was not exactly correct (the ratios were off by a small but significant factor owing to the magnetic properties of the transmitting medium). In addition, in order to effect a reduction, target theories are often modified by incorporating certain facts about the range of phenomena to which the theory applies. In the case of physical optics, one must add to the theory the fact that it does not apply to all electromagnetic phenomena, but only those within a certain frequency range. So, in reducing physical optics to electromagnetic theory, what actually gets derived is not the target theory itself, but a slightly corrected version into which certain limiting assumptions are built.
The second worry Schaffner had about Nagel’s model of reduction was that it assumed what he called a ‘conceptual invariance’ between the target and base theories, while he noted that a certain amount of concept evolution always occurs in the process of reduction. Certain concepts in the target theory may turn out to be understood in a new manner or even rejected once one considers the base theory. Schaffner charts the evolution of the concept of ‘gene’ in Mendelian genetics as a result of the reduction of the theory to biochemistry (1967, 143). Thus, the theory that is actually derived from the base theory in the case of an actual reduction may not have all of the same laws or assumptions as the original theory and the derived theory may also contain a different set of concepts from the original target theory.
With these points in mind, Schaffner proposed a revised version of the derivation model of reduction intended to be more faithful to actual reductions in the history of science. According to Schaffner, reduction of a theory T to another theory B involves the formulation of a corrected, reconceptualized analog of the target theory: T*. Bridge laws are formulated linking all terms in T* with terms in the base theory B. Then T* is derived from B and these bridge laws. Indeed, even this model is perhaps not dynamic enough because as Schaffner himself notes, in reductions the base theory itself is also often modified as it is being considered as reduction base for T (or T*). So likely, there are two new theories developed: T* which is the corrected analog of the original target theory, and B*, a modified version of the base theory. Then it is B* that is used to derive T* with the aid of bridge laws.
Although this model is clearly intended as a correction to Nagel’s model, it shares much in common with the original model, and is often what is referred to when considering “Nagelian” reduction. Schaffner’s account agrees with Nagel’s on this important point: inter-theoretic reduction is the derivation of one theory from another theory, with the aid of bridge laws tying any terms in the derived theory that do not appear in the base theory to terms in that theory. Section 2 will consider the main reason that many philosophers reject reductionism, since they think that such bridge laws are impossible to find. But, first one other influential model of reduction will be considered.
There is one last model of reduction that was very influential in the past century. This explanatory model of reduction is historically associated with John Kemeny and Paul Oppenheim and is defended in their article, “On Reduction” (1956). The definition of ‘reduction’ that Kemeny and Oppenheim defend says that:
A theory T is reduced to another theory B relative to a set of observational data O if:
(1) The vocabulary of T contains terms not in the vocabulary of B.
(2) Any part of O explainable by means of T is explainable by B.
(3) B is at least as well systematized as T (paraphrased from their 1958, 13).
The set of observational data O is understood as relativized to that which requires explanation at the particular moment the reduction is attempted.
There are several elements of this definition that need explanation, particularly the notion of systematization that is employed by Kemeny and Oppenheim. The systematization of a theory is a measure of how well any complexity in the theory is compensated for by the additional strength of the theory to explain and predict more observations. It is clear why (3) is needed then in an account of theory reduction. If it was not the case, then one could just introduce the observations of T into the base theory, and create a new theory, T+o, thereby effecting an ad hoc reduction. Of course, this is not how reductions work. Instead, the base theory is expected to have the virtues typical of scientific theories, and be at least as systematized as the target.
This aspect of reduction is crucial to Kemeny and Oppenheim’s view regarding the motivations for reduction within science. They say that “the role of a theory is not to give us more facts but to organize facts into a practically manageable system” (1958, 11). The goal of a reduction is to streamline our overall scientific picture of the world and cast out theories whose observational domain can be just as systematically covered in a more encompassing theory. Thus, it is easy to see how the results of a Kemeny/Oppenheim reduction would serve well the stated aims of their predecessors in the unified science movement, Carnap and Neurath. They state the main motivation for reduction in the following way:
Anything we want to say about actual observations can be said without theoretical terms, but their introduction allows a much more highly systematized treatment of our total knowledge. Nevertheless, since theoretical terms are in a sense a luxury, we want to know if we can get along without some of them. It is, then, of considerable interest to know that a set of theoretical terms is superfluous since we can replace the theories using these by others in which they do not occur, without sacrificing the degree of systematization achieved by science to this day. (1958, 12)
Reduction helps one eliminate those terms and theories that are explanatorily superfluous. So, a direct justification for pursuing reduction in science is to achieve a greater level of theoretical parsimony.
This eliminative aspect of the Kemeny and Oppenheim proposal is something that need not be taken up by all philosophers who endorse the general idea of the explanatory model of reduction. Many later philosophers who built on this approach rejected the eliminative aspect of the model while retaining the idea that reductions essentially involve showing that all of the observations explained by a reduced theory can also be explained by the base theory. For example, in Paul Oppenheim and Hilary Putnam’s paper “Unity of Science as a Working Hypothesis,” this model of reduction is employed in the context of a larger metaphysical scheme that is not eliminative. The phrase ‘reduction of theories’ may seem to imply the idea that what one is doing is reducing the number of theories by getting rid of some, but this is not essential, nor is it obviously desirable. This issue of elimination versus retention of reduced theories (or entities) will be explored more fully in the last section of the present entry.
One familiar with the metaphysics and philosophy of mind literature will notice that the Kemeny/Oppenheim model is not one that is often discussed when philosophers are concerned with reductionism. One reason for this seems to be issues with the distinction on which it relies between theory and observation. This is a distinction that has been called into question in post-positivist philosophy of science owing to the purported theory-ladenness of all observation. It is worth considering the issue of whether the spirit of the Kemeny/Oppenheim model really requires maintaining this discredited distinction. Likely, a version of the view could be refined that replaced the notion of explaining observations with an appeal to explaining phenomena more generally.
John Bickle’s recent work, defending what he calls a ‘ruthless reductionism’, appeals to a notion of reduction that bears many similarities to the Kemeny/Oppenheim account without relying on a strict theory/observation dichotomy (Bickle 2006, 429). Considering the case of the reduction of psychology to neuroscience, Bickle describes reduction as involving the following simple practice: intervene neurally, and track behavioral effects (2006, 425). Bickle’s view is that in practice, reductions are accomplished when an experimenter finds a successful way of intervening at the chemical or cellular level, to cause a change in behavior that manifests what one would ordinarily recognize as cognitive behavior. He then argues:
When this strategy is successful, the cellular or molecular events in specific neurons into which the experiments have intervenes… directly explain the behavioral data. These explanations set aside intervening explanations, including the psychological, the cognitive/information processing, even the cognitive-neuroscientific… These successes amount to reductions of mind to molecular pathways in neurons… (2006, 426)
For Bickle, as for Kemeny and Oppenheim, reductions work when we find a theory (in this case a neural theory describing molecular or cellular mechanisms) that can explain the data of another theory (in this case, some aspect of psychology).
One might wonder about the relationship between the Kemeny/Oppenheim and derivation models of reduction. It is not obvious that the two accounts are in competition. Indeed, Schaffner (1967) argued that his own version of the derivation model allowed it to subsume the Kemeny/Oppenheim model in certain cases. Recall that according to Schaffner, Nagel’s derivation model must be augmented to accommodate the fact that in real cases of theory reduction, what actually gets derived is not the original version of the target theory T, but instead a corrected analog of the original theory, T*. Schaffner notes that in some cases to facilitate a derivation, the original theory will have to be corrected so much that the analog only very remotely resembles T. In these cases, what occurs is something very much like a Kemeny/Oppenheim reduction: an initial theory T is replaced by a distinct theory T* which is able to play an improved explanatory role.
It is now time to examine the prospects for reductionism. Is it plausible to think that the various special sciences could be reduced to physics in any of these senses? The term ‘special sciences’ is usually taken to refer to the class of sciences that deal with one or another restricted class of entities, such as minds (psychology) or living things (biology). These sciences are distinguished from the one most general science (physics) that is supposed to deal with all entities whatsoever. In the metaphysics and philosophy of mind literature, reductionism is usually taken to be the view that all sciences are reducible to physics, or even that all entities are reducible to entities describable in the language of physics.
Reductionism is no longer understood as the view that makes use of the logical positivist’s sense of reduction as translation. One reason for this is probably that a comprehensive translation of all terms into the language of physics is standardly understood as a lost cause. Although one might allow that physical science contains many terms that are correlates of terms in the special sciences (to use Nagel’s example, ‘heat’ and ‘mean molecular motion’), it is rarely supposed that these correlates are synonymous. Nagel, as discussed above, already noted this point. Even in the case where one might find two terms that refer to the same phenomenon, the terms themselves may differ somewhat in meaning, the identity of their referents being established empirically.
When one claims that a special science is reducible to physics today, sometimes this is intended in the sense of the derivation model of reduction. The view of the reductionist is often that the laws of all of the special sciences are derivable from physics (with the help of bridge laws). This then requires the discovery of physical correlates of all terms that appear in the laws of the special sciences. ‘Cell’, ‘pain’, ‘money’: all of these must have their physical correlates, so that one may formulate bridge laws to facilitate the derivations (of biology, psychology, economics). Reductionists in metaphysics and philosophy of mind, following the points of Sklar and Kim discussed above, typically believe that these bridge laws must have the status of identities. Thus, the reduction of all special science theories to physics is thought to bring with it the reduction (qua identification) of all entities to entities describable in the language of physics.
There is also a large class of philosophers thought of as reductionists who do not think of their view as entailing theoretical reductions in any of the senses described above. Those identity-theorists like U.T. Place (1956) or J.J.C. Smart (1959) who believe that mental phenomena (in Place’s case: processes, in Smart’s: mental types) are identical to physical phenomena (processes or types) are often thought of as reductionists in virtue of accepting such identities, whatever they may think of reduction in the traditional sense of theory reduction. Though they do not speak of reduction in the sense of Nagel (indeed their work predates Nagel’s seminal The Structure of Science) Place and Smart are explicit about denying the plausibility of reductions in the sense of translations; they deny that sentences involving psychological terms in general may be translated into sentences involving purely physical terms. As Smart puts it:
Let me first try to state more accurately the thesis that sensations are brain-processes. It is not the thesis that, for example “after-image” or “ache” means the same as “brain process of sort X”… It is that, in so far as “after-image” or “ache” is a report of a process, it is a report of a process that happens to be a brain process. It follows that the thesis does not claim that sensation statements can be translated into statements about brain processes. (1959, 144)
For Smart and Place, the truth of reductionism about the mind is something that one learns through observation. It isn’t something that one can simply come to by reflecting on the meanings of psychological terms. Although they might reject reductionism in the translational sense and do not discuss theoretic reduction in the sense of either the Nagel or Kemeny/Oppenheim models, their account does involve an ontological reductionism – mental phenomena just are physical phenomena.
Not everyone however thinks that the mere obtaining of identities is sufficient for the success of reductionism. As Jaegwon Kim has argued, even if one had a complete set of identity claims linking terms in the special sciences with physical science terms such that one could complete a derivation of the special sciences from physical science or facilitate reductions, one would still not have truly reduced the special sciences to physical science (1998, 97-9). The problem is that reductions are supposed to be explanatory, and the completion of all of the derivations would not have shown one why it is that the bridging identities obtain.
To see Kim’s worry, consider the reduction of thermodynamics to statistical mechanics described by Nagel. Assume that in order to derive thermodynamics from statistical mechanics, physicists utilized the following bridge law:
Heat = mean molecular motion
This then allowed them to derive the heat laws of thermodynamics from the laws of statistical mechanics governing the motion of molecules. Kim’s worry is that even if this Nagel reduction succeeds, one will still not understand how thermodynamics is grounded in statistical mechanics because the identity statement is not explained. As he puts it:
I don’t think it’s good philosophy to say, as some materialists used to say, “But why can’t we just say that they are one and the same? Give me good reasons why we shouldn’t say that!” I think that we must try to provide positive reasons for saying that things that appear to be distinct are in fact one and the same. (1998, 98)
What needs to happen according to Kim (and for many others in the literature including Frank Jackson (1998) and David Chalmers (1996)), is that these identities need themselves to be grounded in what is known as a functional reduction.
Functional reductions work in two stages. In the first stage, one takes the special science phenomenon that is supposed to be reduced and “primes” it for reduction. One does this by construing it relationally. For example, if one is trying to reduce a chemical phenomenon like boiling, one might construe it as the property a substance has when there are bubbles on its surface and a resulting vapor. In the second stage of a functional reduction, one seeks the property figuring in the base science that could ground the obtaining of this relational description. Once this is accomplished, one is able to identify the phenomenon in the special science with the phenomenon in the base science. Continuing with the same example, it might be found in physics (and obviously this is to oversimplify) that when the atoms in a substance reach a certain average momentum, and the pressure in the substance is less than the atmospheric pressure in the substance’s environment, they are able to escape the surface. One can then see how this would produce bubbles on the substance’s surface and a resulting vapor. Once this explanation has been given, one can identify x’s boiling as identical with x’s being such that x’s atoms have reached a certain momentum, and x’s internal pressure is less than the pressure of x’s external environment. And it will be clear why this identity obtains. This is because the latter is just the physical phenomenon that is required for x to boil, given how boiling was construed in the first stage of the reduction.
In sum, functional reductions allow one to see why it is the case that identities obtain. They can be used therefore to supplement an identity theory of the kind endorsed by Smart and Place, or to supplement a Nagelian reduction to explain bridge laws with the status of identities. Many discussions of reductionism assume that the view requires functional reductions of this kind. Bickle has noted that this is most often the case in discussions of reductionism by anti-reductionists .
The following section will discuss the main argument that has been thought to refute reductionism of this kind, as well as any kind based on the notion of reduction centrally involving identity statements: the argument from multiple realization. The focus will be on this particular argument because it provides the most general critique of reductionism, applying to many different sciences. That is, unlike other arguments against reductionism, the argument from multiple realization is thought to show that for any special science (or special science phenomenon), it cannot be reduced to physical science (or a physical phenomenon). There are also many less general arguments that have been advanced to show that one particular kind of science cannot be reduced, for example, the arguments of Thomas Nagel (1979), Frank Jackson (1982), and David Chalmers’ (1996) against the physical reducibility of consciousness. These arguments will not be discussed in this entry.
The multiple realization argument is historically associated with Hilary Putnam and Jerry Fodor (Putnam 1975; Fodor 1974). What Putnam and Fodor argued was that in general it would not be possible to find true identity statements of the kind required for reductions of the special sciences. For simplicity, the present discussion will focus on the case of reducing psychology to physical science. If this reduction is going to be successful, then one must find physical correlates for all psychological terms such that there are true identity statements linking each psychological term with a physical term. For example, for some physical property P, there must be a true identity statement of the form:
For all x (x’s being in pain = x’s instantiating physical property P),
Or more generally:
For all x (x’s instantiating special science property S = x’s instantiating physical property P)
As Putnam points out, it is a great challenge for the reductionist to find physical properties that will serve this purpose. He says:
Consider what the [reductionist] has to do to make good on his claims. He has to specify a physical-chemical state such that any organism (not just a mammal) is in pain if and only if (a) it possesses a brain of a suitable physical-chemical structure; and (b) its brain is in that physical-chemical state. This means that the physical-chemical state in question must be a possible state of a mammalian brain, a reptilian brain, a mollusc’s brain…, etc… Even if such a state can be found, it must be nomologically certain that it will also be a state of the brain of any extra-terrestrial life that may be found that will be capable of feeling pain… it is at least possible that parallel evolution, all over the universe might always lead to one and the same physical “correlate” of pain. But this is certainly an ambitious hypothesis. (Putnam 1975, 436)
The problem for the reductionist is that too many very physically different kinds of things satisfy the predicate ‘is in pain’ for one to have the hope of specifying a kind of physical property P that all and only the things that are in pain instantiate. This is not only a problem for the reductionist who requires that there be identities linking terms in the special sciences with terms in the language of physics. Putnam’s point works equally well against the obtaining of bridge laws with biconditional form, for example:
For all x (x is in pain if and only if x instantiates physical property P) Putnam, and later Fodor, argued that this argument generalizes to show that one would not be able to find true identity statements linking special science predicates with predicates from physical science. The types of things satisfying a given special science predicate are just too physically diverse. The view Putnam and Fodor advocated, instead of reductionism, was (a nonreductive version of) functionalism. They claimed that special science predicates typically denote causal or functional properties. That is, what it is for something to fall within the extension of a particular special science predicate is for it to play some specific causal role. So, for example, to fall under the psychological predicate ‘pain’ is roughly to be in an internal state that is caused by tissue damage and tends to cause withdrawal behavior, moans, and so on. If this functionalism about ‘pain’ is true, then anything that instantiates this causal role will fall under the extension of the predicate ‘pain’. The metaphysical upshot of this is that pain is a functional property that has many different realizers. These may include states of humans, mollusks, and Martians, whatever is the type of thing that has an internal state caused by tissue damage and which tends to cause withdrawal behavior, moans, and so on. But there is no one physical property with which the property of being in pain may be identified.
Reductionists have tried several ways of responding to the argument from multiple realization. To begin, it must be noted that this argument only succeeds against a version of reductionism claiming that there are identities or assumptions with the status of biconditional linking terms in the special sciences with physical terms. As was noted above, many philosophers of science, including Nagel himself, do not believe that the reduction of a theory to physical science requires that there be bridge laws with the status of identities or biconditionals, so long as assumptions strong enough to facilitate derivations obtain. The arguments of Putnam and Fodor do nothing to undermine claims of the following form:
For all x (if x instantiates physical property P, then x instantiates special science property S),
where ‘P’ denotes some actual realization of a special science property in humans or some other creature. Thus, reduction of all special sciences to physical science may still be carried out in the sense of Nagel reduction.
Alternatively, the reductionist may point to the fact that there are derivation models of reduction that do away with the appeal to bridge laws altogether. For example, C.A. Hooker (1981) developed a derivation model of reduction that builds on the insights of Nagel and Schaffner. Like Schaffner (1967), Hooker argued that in actual cases of reduction what gets derived from the base theory is not the original target theory, but instead a corrected analog T* of the original theory. On Hooker’s model however, this analog is formulated instead within the linguistic and conceptual framework of the base theory B. Thus, no bridge laws are required in order to derive T* from B. He then notes that once T* has been derived from B, one can claim that T has been reduced in virtue of an analog relation A that T* bears to T (1981, 49). It is of course a difficult matter to spell out what these analog relations must come to for there to have been a legitimate reduction of T to B, in virtue of the derivation of T* from B. Still the fact that it is T* that is derived from B, a theory in B’s own language implies that bridge laws of any form (be they identity statements, biconditionals, or conditionals) are not required for reductions in Hooker’s sense. Therefore, if one holds a theory of reductionism based on Hooker reduction (as in Bickle (1998), for example), one is immune to objections from multiple realization.
Still, it has been noted that many reductionists, for example Place and Smart, argue that there are identities linking the entities of the special sciences with physics. Indeed for many reductionists, such identities are a central part of their views. Still, there are ways even for these reductionists to respond to the arguments of Putnam and Fodor. Jaegwon Kim (1998), for example, has made two suggestions.
One suggestion is for the reductionist to hold onto the claim that there are truths of the form:
For all x (x’s instantiating special science property S = x’s instantiating physical property P)
However, she may maintain that P is a disjunctive property. For example, if pain is realized in humans by C-fiber stimulation, in octopi by D-fiber stimulation, in Martians by E-fiber stimulation, and so on, then P will be:
the property of instantiating C-fiber stimulation in humans or D-fiber stimulation in octopi or E-fiber stimulation in Martians or .…
This approach is generally unpopular as reductionists (e.g. D.M. Armstrong (1997)) and anti-reductionists (e.g. Fodor (1997)) alike are skeptical about the existence of such disjunctive properties.
A second approach suggested by Kim (1998, 93-94) has been more popular. This approach is also associated with David Lewis following his suggestions in his “Mad Pain and Martian Pain” (Lewis 1980). The response concedes to Putnam and Fodor that there is no property of pain simpliciter that can be identified with a property from physical science. However, there are true “local” identity statements that may be found. Kim suggests that there may be a physical property discovered that is identical to pain-in-humans, another discovered that is identical to pain-in-octopi, so on. What motivates the multiple realization argument is the compelling point that there is little physically similar among different realizers of pain across species. However, within a species, there are sufficient physical similarities to ground a species-specific (this is what Kim means by ‘local’) reduction of pain. Or so the reductionist may argue. Kim himself does not endorse reductionism about pain, even if he thinks most other special science properties can be reduced in this way.
Up to now, reduction has been treated as involving unification of theories or identity of phenomena (properties, types, or processes). In the case of theoretical reductions, according to the Nagelian models, it has been assumed that when a reduction is effected, previously disunified theories become unified and in the case of entities, when a reduction is effected, entities that were previously seen as distinct are shown to be identical.
However, this is not how reductions always proceed. Indeed this is implied by the term ‘reduction’ itself. Shouldn’t reduction involve a decrease in the number of theories or entities in the world? Doesn’t the reduction of psychology to physics analytically entail the elimination of psychology? Doesn’t the reduction of pain to a physical phenomena analytically entail its elimination? Several authors have emphasized the eliminative aspects of many reductions in practice (especially Schaffner (1967), Churchland (1981), Churchland (1986), Bickle (2003)).
Return to the derivation model of theoretical reduction. It was noted earlier that to effect reductions in the derivation sense, it is often necessary to create a new, modified version of the target theory in order to get something actually derivable from something like the base theory. In the Schaffner model, this proceeds by formulating a new version of the target theory, in its original language, supplemented by bridge laws. In the case of the Hooker model, this proceeds by formulating a new version of the target theory, but in the language of the base theory, thus avoiding the need for bridge laws. Either way, the result is that it is not entirely clear whether what has been reduced is a legitimate version of the original target theory T (in other words, whether a retentive reduction has been achieved), or a different theory altogether (whether what has been achieved is instead a replacement reduction) (Hooker 1981, Bickle 1998). In the move to unification, in accomplishing the reduction, has one been able to retain the original target theory? Or has one instead been forced to replace it with a different theory? There is surely a continuous spectrum of possible reductions from those of the more retentive kind to those that are clearly replacements (see Bickle 1998, for a diagram charting this spectrum). At a certain point, the theory that actually gets derived may be so different from the original target theory, that one may be forced to say that the reduction of the original has instead proceeded by something more like the Kemeny/Oppenheim model. The original theory is being replaced with another able to accommodate the original’s phenomena. In the history of science, there have been reductions of many different kinds. The standard example of the reduction of chemistry to atomic physics was an example of a retentive reduction. Most if not all of the claims of chemistry before the reduction are still taken to be true, even if some had to be modified for a derivation of the theory from atomic physics to go through. On the other hand, the reduction of phlogiston theory to modern chemistry was a replacement reduction. Enough of the claims of the phlogiston theory were forced to be changed that one can justifiably say that that theory was replaced altogether, not retained.
The hope in the philosophy of mind is that whatever psychological theory actually gets reduced to physics, it will be sufficiently similar to the original psychological theory that the psychophysical reduction is retentive. However, there are some reductionists, in particular Churchland (1986) and Churchland (1981), who think this hope is unlikely to be fulfilled.
The spectrum from theoretical reductions that are retentive to theoretical reductions that are eliminative parallels another spectrum of kinds of reductions of phenomena. In some cases where the reduction of a phenomenon is carried out, one is justified in characterizing this as an identification. In other cases, one wants to say that the phenomenon has rather been eliminated as a result of the reduction. It is plausible that whether reductions should be seen as eliminative or not has to do with whether or not the theory that mentioned that entity has been reduced in a more or less retentive manner. Whether or not a reduction of all mental phenomena can be achieved that most philosophers will view as retentive is still very much up in the air. However, for the reductionist, the hope is that for all phenomena, they will either be identified with entities of physical science or eliminated altogether in favor of the entities of a superior theory.
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Last updated: November 10, 2008 | Originally published: November/10/2008