Reformed Epistemology

Reformed epistemology is a thesis about the rationality of religious belief. A central claim made by the reformed epistemologist is that religious belief can be rational without any appeal to evidence or argument. There are, broadly speaking, two ways that reformed epistemologists support this claim. The first is to argue that there is no way to successfully formulate the charge that religious belief is in some way epistemically defective if it is lacking support by evidence or argument. The second way is to offer a description of what it means for a belief to be rational, and to suggest ways that religious beliefs might in fact be meeting these requirements. This has led reformed epistemologists to explore topics such as when a belief-forming mechanism confers warrant, the rationality of engaging in belief forming practices, and when we have an epistemic duty to revise our beliefs. As such, reformed epistemology offers an alternative to evidentialism (the view that religious belief must be supported by evidence in order to be rational) and fideism (the view that religious belief is not rational, but that we have non-epistemic reasons for believing).

Reformed epistemology was first clearly articulated in a collection of papers called Faith and Rationality edited by Alvin Plantinga and Nicholas Wolterstorff in 1983. However, the view owes a debt to many other thinkers.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
  2. The Origins of Reformed Epistemology
    1. Reformed
    2. Epistemology
  3. Key Figures in Reformed Epistemology
    1. William Alston
    2. Alvin Plantinga
    3. Nicolas Wolterstorff
  4. Evidence and Rational Belief in God
  5. Classical Foundationalism
    1. Rejecting Classical Foundationalism
  6. The Positive Case in Reformed Epistemology
    1. The Christian Mystical Practice
    2. The Parity Argument
    3. Warranted Christian Belief
  7. Objections to Reformed Epistemology
    1. Great Pumpkin Objection
    2. Disanalogies
    3. Religious Diversity
      1. Religious Belief is Epistemically Arbitrary
      2. Competing Belief Forming Practices
    4. Sensible Evidentialism
  8. References and Further Reading

1. Introduction

Here is an argument against the rationality of belief in God:

(1) Belief in God requires the right kind of evidence in order to be rational.

(2) No such evidence exists for belief in God.

(3) Therefore, belief in God is not rational.

The idea here is that in order for belief in God to be rational, there needs to be an appropriate relationship between belief and evidence. What is appropriate, according to those who endorse the above argument, is that the belief in question be based on good evidence. This argument is sometimes referred to as the evidentialist objection to believe in God. According to the reformed epistemologist, philosophers have historically taken premise 1 to be rather intuitive. As a result, discussion involving the rationality of belief in God focused almost entirely on premise 2. Thus, philosophers who defended the rationality and justification of belief in God would have done so by responding to premise 2 and providing evidence for God's existence. The evidentialist objection fails, they claim, because sufficient evidence does exist for rational belief in God. According to the reformed epistemologist, then, theists (historically anyway) who reject premise 2 would simply endorse the following argument:

 (1) Belief in God requires the right kind of evidence in order to be rational.

(2*) Such evidence does exist for rational belief in God.

(3*) Therefore, belief in God is rational.

For the theist who defends this argument, finding the right kind of evidence that is sufficient for rational belief in God becomes their chief aim. The problem, according to the reformed epistemologist, is that such a move is unnecessary. There is, in other words, a much easier way around the evidentialist objection—the rejection of premise 1. Thus, for the reformed epistemologist the problem with the evidentialist objection lies not with 2, but with 1. Why assume that belief in God is in any way subject to the demands of 1? Belief in God, argues the reformed epistemologist, can be rational without inference from evidence or argument. If this central claim is true, 1 is undermined and the evidentialist objection (as it stands) fails.

2. The Origins of Reformed Epistemology

Reformed epistemology first appeared in the early 1980s but the view owes a debt to many other thinkers. The influences on reformed epistemology can be divided into two groups: reformed influences and influences from within epistemology.

a. Reformed

Reformed epistemology was first clearly articulated in a collection of papers called Faith and Rationality edited by Alvin Plantinga and Nicholas Wolterstorff in 1983. The reason for “reformed” in reformed epistemology is a result of the clear influences from the reformed theological tradition on this view. Two of the leading proponents—Plantinga and Wolterstorff—taught at Calvin College and they take inspiration from important reformed thinkers such as John Calvin and Abraham Kuyper.

The most explicit appeal to the reformed tradition is found in Alvin Plantinga’s work. Plantinga, when wondering how theistic belief might be grounded, suggests that we consider that Calvin may have been right when he said that God has created humans with an inner awareness of himself and it is this sensus divinitatis that is responsible for theistic belief. Plantinga also engages with and criticizes reformed thinkers who reject natural theology such as Karl Barth (See Plantinga 1983).

Despite the important role that reformed thought has played in the early days of reformed epistemology, and, in particular, in the thinking of some of its key proponents, the central tenets of reformed epistemology do not depend on this tradition. Plantinga has tried to make this more explicit. In Warrant and Christian Belief he argues that the ideas he finds in Calvin are also found in Thomas Aquinas. In fact, there is no reason to believe that there won’t be numerous traditions within Christian thought that could also adopt something like the view defended by reformed epistemologists. Furthermore, the view could be easily adapted by other religions—particularly monotheistic religions.

In light of this, the word “reformed” in reformed epistemology is best thought of as describing the inspiration behind the position rather than its core claims. Objections to reformed thought, or to Christianity more generally, may leave reformed epistemology unscathed.

b. Epistemology

As well as being influenced by the reformed tradition, reformed epistemology draws on work in epistemology. The philosopher who has most clearly been influential to reformed epistemologists is Thomas Reid, a Scottish Presbyterian minister. Reid’s epistemology is distinctive because of the importance he places on describing the belief forming faculties that give rise to our beliefs. These faculties are dispositions to form certain beliefs in response to being triggered in certain ways. These dispositions can vary over time and we can gain some and lose others through training or habit. But some of our belief dispositions are innate—we are simply born with them. According to Reid these innate dispositions cannot ultimately be rationally grounded by us, but we must rely on them nonetheless.

This Reidian picture of epistemology has had a significant influence on reformed epistemology. Accordingly, reformed epistemologists argue that in order to understand whether or not our religious beliefs are rational we must consider what sorts of being we are and the innate belief dispositions that we have.

3. Key Figures in Reformed Epistemology

Though perhaps not a sufficient condition, the rejection of premise 1 above is at least a necessary condition when it comes to identifying key figures within reformed epistemology. Below, then, we discuss three philosophers who reject the idea that belief in God is rational only when inferred from good evidence. These philosophers—William Alston, Alvin Plantinga, and Nicholas Wolterstorff—are key figures within religious epistemology and were central in the development of reformed epistemology.

a. William Alston

William Alston’s first major contribution to reformed epistemology comes in a pair of essays “Religious Experience and Religious Belief” and “Christian Experience and Christian Belief” (the latter of these appears in Faith and Rationality, which is edited by Alvin Plantinga and Nicholas Wolterstorff). His aim is to argue that Christian Practice (CP) is justified. CP is the practice of forming certain kinds of beliefs in response to certain experiences. The sorts of beliefs in question are those such as “God will provide for his people” or “God will forgive the sins of the truly repentant.” They are beliefs about God and his activities and Alston calls these beliefs “M-beliefs” where M stands for manifestation (Alston 1983: 104-105).

Alston wishes to show that those who engage in CP are justified in much the same way that we are justified in engaging in a different practice—perceptual practice (PP). PP is the very familiar practice of forming certain perceptual beliefs in response to perceptual experiences.

Alston argues that there is no non-circular justification available for PP; this is because our only access to the physical world, that PP gives us knowledge of, is through PP itself. The only justification we have for PP is that we do not have sufficient reason for believing that it is unreliable. CP, claims Alston, is justified by the same standard. Those who claim that we need some independent reason for trusting CP are holding it to a higher epistemic standard than PP.

Alston went on to offer a book-length defense of these ideas in Perceiving God. In Perceiving God Alston spends significant time discussing objections to what he is now calling Christian Mystical Practice (CMP). He concludes that all the objections fail and that they are guilty of one of two things: epistemic imperialism or double standards. He describes epistemic imperialism as requiring that CMP be like PP in some way, if it is to be justified, without any epistemic support for that requirement. Objections are guilty of double standards when they seek to apply a standard to CMP that PP would not meet (Alston 1991: 248-250).

b. Alvin Plantinga

Alvin Plantinga has authored and edited a number of books and essays on reformed epistemology. Plantinga’s earliest work on the topic, God and Other Minds, represents an initial attempt to undermine the evidentialist objection. In God and Other Minds, Plantinga assumes that (2) is generally correct. There isn’t, according to Plantinga, sufficiently good evidence for belief in God—at least not in the way that is demanded by the evidentialist. Plantinga’s approach at this point, then, is to argue that there is a double standard with regard to (1). So while the evidence and arguments for belief in God are far from conclusive, they are, in fact, on par with other beliefs that we take to be rational. For example, as the argument goes, we take the belief that other minds exist to be rational despite the fact that philosophical arguments in its favor suffer many of the same problems that plague traditional theistic arguments. Thus, concludes Plantinga, “if my belief in other minds is rational, so is my belief in God. But obviously the former is rational; so, therefore, is the latter” (1967: 271). This is the first of Plantinga’s so called parity arguments.

In more recent literature, however, Plantinga abandons this earlier parity argument as a way to deal with the evidentialist objector. This is due in part to the fact that in God and Other Minds Plantinga assumed, like the evidentialist objector, that the way to go about discussing the rationality of religious belief was to first consider the evidence in its favor. Here is Plantinga discussing this assumption:

I was somehow both accepting but also questioning what was then axiomatic: that belief in God, if it is to be rationally acceptable, must be such that there is good evidence for it. This evidence would be propositional evidence: evidence from other propositions you believe, and it would have to come in the form of arguments. This claim wasn’t itself argued for: it was simply asserted, or better, just assumed as self-evident or at least utterly obvious. What was taken for granted has now come to be called ‘evidentialism’ (a better title would be ‘evidentialism with respect to belief in God’, but that’s a bit unwieldy). (2000: 70)

Plantinga, then, initially attempted to confront the evidentialist objection by merely pointing out its inconsistent nature. In more recent literature, however, Plantinga adopts a new, bolder approach in response to the evidentialist objection. He directly confronts the evidentialist by showing that it is motivated by a failed theory of justification—namely, classical foundationalism. Crucial to the argument, then, is the belief that the evidentialist objection arises from the influence of classical foundationalism. A detailed response to classical foundationalism is found in chapter 3 of Warranted Christian Belief. The idea presented in WCB is not that (1) is applied inconsistently, but that there is no good reason to think that (1) is true.

As well as this negative approach to challenging the evidentialist objection Plantinga also seeks to offer something more positive. In his book, Warrant and Proper Function, Plantinga seeks to offer an account of warrant—his term for whatever it is that makes the difference between true belief and knowledge. In Warranted Christian Belief Plantinga applies his account of warrant to religious belief and argues that there is no way to show that religious belief is not warranted without first assuming that it is false.

c. Nicolas Wolterstorff

Nicholas Wolterstorff’s defense of some of the central claims of reformed epistemology is perhaps less significant than the previous two figures that we looked at, but his contributions are certainly more wide reaching. His earliest contribution is his book Reason within the Bounds of Religion. In this book Wolterstorff is grappling with the question of how to be a Christian and a scholar and how one’s faith ought to relate to and impact upon one’s reasoning. Though we find no explicit formulation of reformed epistemology here, it is clear that he is attempting to develop a view in which religious beliefs are neither subordinate to nor independent of our other beliefs.

His most explicit contribution to reformed epistemology comes in the collection of essays that he edited with Alvin Plantinga called Faith and Rationality. In his paper entitled “Can belief in God be rational?” he considers what obligations rationality places upon us, and in particular whether rationality requires that we only believe in God on the basis of evidence. Wolterstorff argues that:

A person is rationally justified in believing a certain proposition which he does believe unless he has adequate reason to cease from believing it. Our beliefs are rational unless we have reason for refraining; they are not nonrational unless we have reason for believing. They are innocent until proved guilty, not guilty until proved innocent. (Wolterstorff 1983: 163)

He then turns to applying this to belief in God. He observes that people come to believe that God exists in a variety of ways such as from their parents, or in response to an overwhelming sense of guilt, or by finding peace in the midst of suicidal desperation. In many cases, belief in God seems to be immediate (that is, not based upon other beliefs) and so long as the person who forms the belief has no adequate reason to give up their belief then that belief will be rational.

More recent contributions from Wolterstorff come in his books Divine Discourse and Justice. In the former he is engaged in a philosophical discussion of the claim that God speaks, and in the latter, he is defending an account of human rights. Although these books are not about reformed epistemology they are informed by it. Wolterstorff is still engaged in showing how certain religious beliefs can be rational. Furthermore, Wolterstorff is clearly putting into practice some of the key claims of reformed epistemology. In Justice it is clear that Wolterstorff is seeking to show how some religious claims interact with the discussion of human rights—in doing this, Wolterstorff treats the religious claims as standing on equal footing with the non-religious claims. What this means in practice is that he does not attempt to justify religious claims on grounds acceptable to the non-religious, but neither does he treat religious claims as immune to criticism.

4. Evidence and Rational Belief in God

According to the reformed epistemologist, objections to the rationality of belief in God often revolve around the claim that belief in God lacks the appropriate evidence. In order to see this, we can, following Plantinga, identify two distinct types of objections—namely, the de facto and de jure objections. The de facto objection, historically anyway, is the form many religious objections traditionally take. That is, the religious skeptic often questions the reality or truth of the religious conviction before directly considering epistemic questions. De facto objections take many forms, with perhaps the problem of evil being the most well-known and discussed in philosophical literature. As the argument goes, a benevolent and omnipotent God cannot possibly exist given the amount of unnecessary or gratuitous evil.

In contrast to the de facto objection, there is an epistemic objection—or as Plantinga calls it, the de jure objection. The de jure objection ignores the ontological status of God’s existence and instead focuses on the justification and rationality of belief in God. The de jure objector asks whether belief in God is irrational, unjustifiable, or epistemically irresponsible. This objection comes in various forms as well. For some, belief in God is irrational as it is the result of some cognitive malfunction. Belief in God is so irrational, it is claimed, that it could have only been invented by mad, deluded people who base their belief on insufficient justification or argument. For others, this cognitive malfunction is akin to belief in Santa Claus and not the kind of belief an adult could justifiably believe in. Belief in Santa Claus, for which there is no evidence, is akin to belief in God, for which there is no evidence. No matter which line the de jure objector takes, what seems to unite these objectors is the idea that belief in God lacks the kind of epistemic justification necessary for rational belief. And for many de jure objectors there is the assumption, as Plantinga notes, that having a rational belief in God requires (propositional) evidence in order to have adequate epistemic support. Call this the evidentialist de jure objection. So what motivates the de jure objection, then, is the idea that belief in God both requires and lacks the appropriate evidence. The central claim of the evidentialist position is that one ought to believe only when one has the appropriate evidence. Thus if theism is indeed similar to belief in Santa Claus (for which there is no good evidence), then it seems that belief in God is indeed dubious and the nature of the evidentialist de jure objection becomes a bit clearer: belief in God is rational only if its justification depends on evidence. Theism, however, lacks the appropriate evidence and is therefore irrational.

What makes reformed epistemology unique here is the response that is given in reply to this critcism. The assumed move here would be to try and show that there is adequate evidence for theism. Instead, though, the reformed epistemologist rejects the evidentialist assumption (and on some accounts might even grant that there is insufficient inferential evidence). While there are perhaps several ways to get around the evidentialist assumption, the most well-known account is offered by Plantinga. Plantinga argues, for example, that the evidentialist assumption is undermined given that it is motivated by a failed theory of justification—namely, classical foundationalism.

5. Classical Foundationalism    

In order to undermine the evidentialist objection, reformed epistemologists have sought to argue against what they take to be the underlying epistemological view that motivates the objection. The view that they identify as playing this role they call Classical Foundationalism.

Classical Foundationalism holds that there are two kinds of belief: basic beliefs and non-basic beliefs. The basic beliefs are rational even when not held on the basis of other beliefs, whereas non-basic beliefs are only rational when supported by basic beliefs. The reason why classical foundationalism motivates the evidentialist objection against belief in God is because of the restrictions it puts on what can reasonably be a basic belief—on what is a properly basic belief.

According to the classical foundationalist, the only beliefs that are properly basic fall into to one of the three following categories:

evident to the senses,

incorrigible, or

self-evident.

This means that any belief that does not fall into one of these categories can only be rational if it is supported by beliefs that do fall into these categories. With this framework in place it seems quite easy to formulate the evidentialist objection against belief in God. This is because belief in God does not seem to be evident to the sense, incorrigible or self-evident. Given this, then, we can claim that belief in God is only rational if it is supported by adequate evidence—that is, by other beliefs that are evident to the senses, incorrigible or self-evident.

It is possible to find historical examples of arguments along these lines. For example, here is J. L. Mackie discussing the rationality of belief in God:

If it is agreed that the central assertions of theism are literally meaningful, it must also be admitted that they are not directly verifiable. It follows then that any rational consideration of whether they are true or not will involve arguments… it [whether God exists] must be examined by either deductive or inductive reasoning or, if that yields no decision, by arguments to the best explanation; for in such a context nothing else can have any coherent bearing on the issue. (Mackie 1982: 4, 6)

Mackie is not alone is these demands. John Locke placed similar demands on religious belief by boldly claiming that those who do assent to (religious) belief without evidence “transgress against their own light” and disregard the very purpose of those faculties which are designed to evaluate the evidence necessary for belief.

The reformed epistemologist contends that this view has been the dominant one among both theists and atheists alike, and so the question of whether or not belief in God is rational has focused on whether or not there is adequate evidence for that belief. It is for this reason that reformed epistemologists have seen their first task as being to show why classical foundationalism fails as account of what it takes for a belief to be rational.

a. Rejecting Classical Foundationalism

The case for rejecting classical foundationalism rests on two key arguments. First, classical foundationalism classes a large number of beliefs that we typically take ourselves to know as irrational. Second, classical foundationalism is self-referentially incoherent.

The first problem raised against classical foundationalism is that it classes beliefs such as ‘the world has existed for more than five minutes’, ‘other persons exist’ and ‘humans can act freely’ as not properly basic. These beliefs, claims Plantinga, (along with a great many others) are accepted by the vast majority of rational humans; yet, the arguments for these beliefs are remarkably weak. Most people who believe these things can offer no arguments for their belief, and those who can, still seem to hold the belief with a greater degree of certainty than the argument would seem to warrant. Plantinga writes that the problem of other minds is to explain how it is that the very common belief that other humans have a mental life could be justified. Plantinga thinks that the best argument is the argument from analogy—that we observe that our own mental events such as being in pain are accompanied by certain behaviors, such as grasping the area where the pain is located, and then infer from this that when others are exhibiting similar behavior, they are also having the associated mental event. This inference from a single case hardly seems to justify the belief that there are other minds, but if it can be shown to be sufficient it would still be implausible to claim that only those who have knowledge of the argument are rational in their belief that other minds exist. This, perhaps, would not be so troubling if it were not the case that so many beliefs that do not meet the requirements set down by classical foundationalism are believed in a basic way by most rational humans. Anthony Kenny has pointed out that there are many beliefs that, although we can find some evidence for them, should not be thought of as being based upon that evidence because the evidence is believed with less strength than what it is evidence for. He suggests that the belief that Australia exists is just such a belief:

If any one of the ‘reasons’ for believing in Australia turned out to be false, even if all the considerations I could mention proved illusory, much less of my noetic structure would collapse than if it turned out that Australia did not exist. (Kenny 1983: 19)

The same goes for beliefs such as ‘I am awake’ or ‘human beings die’. If these beliefs can be rational only if they are based upon evidence then the classical foundationalism seems to suggest that we should hold many of our beliefs with much less certainty, and give up many other very strongly held beliefs.

Plantinga’s second objection is that classical foundationalism is self-referentially incoherent. Classical foundationalism itself is not self-evident, neither is it incorrigible, and it is certainly not evident to the senses. This means that if it is to meet its own standards there must be an argument from premises that are self-evident, incorrigible, or evident to the senses. No argument presents itself, and it is certainly difficult to see where one would start, especially in light of some of the counterintuitive consequences of the classical foundationalism highlighted above.

It’s worth noting here that not all reformed epistemologists think the connection between classical foundationalism and evidentialism is so obvious. There are two main lines of criticism that can be made to Plantinga’s arguments against classical foundationalism. The first is to question the link between classical foundationalism and the evidentialist objection, and the second is to claim that Plantinga has failed to show that classical foundationalism is an untenable position.

This first criticism can be found among Plantinga’s fellow reformed epistemologists:

[I]f [Plantinga] is saying that no one has explicitly presented [the evidentialist objection] as following from some other developed and articulated position that is probably true, but it remains to be shown that anyone has done that with respect to classical foundationalism either. But if the claim is that no other epistemological theory could plausibly serve as a reason for the evidentialist denial, that is palpably false. (Alston in Tomberlin and van Inwagen 1985: 296)

[Plantinga’s] discussion puts us in the position of seeing that the most common and powerful argument for evidentialism is classical foundationalism, and of seeing that classical foundationalism is unacceptable. But to deprive the evidentialist of his best defense is not yet to show that his contention is false. (Wolterstorff 1983: 142)

The criticism from Alston and Wolterstorff is that Plantinga has done nothing to persuade us that the evidentialist objection has no force; at best he has shown that no previous articulation of the objection is successful (supposing that it is correct that all previous versions of the argument rely on something very much like classical foundationalism).

The second response to Plantinga can again be found in Alston (Alston in Tomberlin and van Inwagen 1985: 296-299). Alston observes that Plantinga has not shown that the defender of classical foundationalism cannot argue for classical foundationalism from premises that are properly basic by her lights. Alston agrees that it is hard to see how this might be done but denies that this supports the conclusion that it cannot be done.

Plantinga’s critique of classical foundationalism noted above might be understood as a negative approach. The responses from Alston and Wolterstorff, then, are directed at this negative approach. Plantinga, however, also offers a different, more positive approach to the issue of proper basicality. He asks us to reconsider what might be classified as properly basic. Rather than select criteria, and then categorize our beliefs accordingly, we should amass examples of beliefs that we take to be properly basic, and the circumstances in which they are considered properly basic. After this process, Plantinga suggests that one could then propose criteria following reflection on these examples. Though, it’s important to keep in mind that not all of the example beliefs will qualify as genuinely properly basic (despite any initial appearances to the contrary).

But who is to decide the set of examples, and how do we weed out bad examples without any criteria? Plantinga deliberately gives no definitive answers to these questions. According to Plantinga, it is the responsibility of each community to decide what it considers to be properly basic and to take that as a starting point; there can then be an exchange between the examples and the criteria that they are used to justify, each refining the other. The claim is not that those beliefs that are held by one’s own community to be properly basic are properly basic; rather, the claim is that this is the best starting point for enquiry. It may be that your community has got it wrong about what beliefs are properly basic, but hopefully this will be revealed by further reflection.

According the reformed epistemologist, there is no neutral starting point for philosophical enquiry, so it is up to each community to assess their own starting point, and take that as a defeasible foundation for inquiry. Communities are not free, however, to decide what beliefs are basic for them. What we believe is rarely within our own control—for example, one cannot simply decide to believe that the moon does not exist. This means that there is an objective fact about what each community does take as its starting point.

It might be objected that this is arbitrary, but Plantinga contends that there is no set of beliefs that will be entirely uncontroversial, and there is no criteria of proper basicality that is more convincing than the beliefs that most people take as properly basic. Or perhaps some will agree that although this method is correct, it is still implausible that belief in God should be properly basic. In the case of perceptual beliefs the ground for them is obvious, even if how they are grounded is not clear. God, if he exists, is surely much more remote, and his existence is not the sort of thing that can be known in the basic way.

Plantinga responds by pointing out that, within the Reformed tradition at least, belief in God is considered to be grounded. According to John Calvin, one of the important figures in the Reformation, humans each have a natural tendency to believe that God exists when placed in certain circumstances, in fact he claims that God “daily discloses himself in the whole workmanship of the universe” (Plantinga 2000: 66). Plantinga does not argue for the truth of such a position, rather, he mentions it to show that his claim that belief in God can be properly basic is not ad hoc, but is in fact implicitly the view held by a large number of people, and the Reformed tradition more specifically. It is not necessary that Plantinga know, or even have good reason to believe the claims made by Calvin and others, as long as it is true that there are experiences that serve to ground belief in God then that belief will be properly basic on those occasions. It is due to this appeal to reformed thinkers that this view has come to be known as reformed epistemology.

On the surface, reformed epistemology bears some similarity to fideism. Fideism is the claim that belief in God is not rational, but must be accepted upon faith; it is usually claimed that this belief is independent of reason, or in more extreme cases that it is opposed to reason. The reformed epistemologist will agree with the fideist that arguments are not needed to justify belief in God, but what about the relationship between reason and belief in God?

It is clear from what has already been discussed that the reformed epistemologist will not subscribe to the more extreme fideism because to believe what is properly basic is not to believe what is opposed to reason. What is, at first, less clear is whether to believe in God in the basic way is to believe independently of reason. Plantinga considers a distinction between reason and faith suggested by Abraham Kuyper (Plantinga 1983: 88), that the deliverances of reason are those beliefs that are based on argumentation and inference, whereas the deliverances of faith are beliefs that are held independently of argument and inference. On this understanding of faith, anything held in the basic way will be taken on faith. For example, this definition would suggest that 2+1=3, external objects exist and I am awake, are all held on faith. This is not the understanding of faith that the fideist has in mind, since it does not serve to draw a distinction between faith and reason. Plantinga explains that there is no reason for the reformed epistemologist to think that belief in God is independent of, or opposed to, reason:

Belief in the existence of God is in the same boat as belief in other minds, the past, and perceptual objects; in each case God has so constructed us that in the right circumstances we form the belief in question. But then the belief that there is such a person as God is as much among the deliverances of reason as other beliefs. (Plantinga 1983: 90)

Reformed epistemologists, unlike fideists, hold that religious belief is rational, but unlike the evidentialist, they deny that this rationality is due to the beliefs being based upon evidence.

6. The Positive Case in Reformed Epistemology

So far, much of what has been said here has been focused on undermining a certain sort objection to the rationality of religious belief. The second significant strand to reformed epistemology concerns providing a description of the way in which religious beliefs can be rational.

a. The Christian Mystical Practice

In Perceiving God William Alston seeks to describe and defend what he calls the Christian Mystical Practice (CMP). This is the practice of forming beliefs about God in response to certain kinds of experiences.

Alston first argues that there are no non-question-begging way to show that any basic belief forming practice is reliable—one will always have to appeal to the practice itself. In light of this we cannot require that belief forming practices enjoy independent support before we engage in them because this support will never be available. It may be that some practices can be ruled out due to being inconsistent, but no adequate reason can be found for thinking that any of our basic belief forming practices are reliable.

Instead Alston argues that it is reasonable to accept socially established practices; those practices that have demonstrated stability over a number of generations and which are deeply embedded in our psyche. Such practices provide prima facie justification for the beliefs that they produce. Furthermore, if these practices are not shown to be unreliable then the beliefs that result from them are rational.

Alston claims that CMP is one of these practices. Christians have been forming beliefs in this way for centuries, and the practice is deeply embedded in the culture. This means that engaging in the practice is prima facie justified. And as long as there are no adequate reasons for thinking that CMP is unreliable then the beliefs that result from this practice will be justified.

Alston goes on to argue that many of the reasons for thinking that CMP is unreliable exhibit one or both of two flaws: imperialism and double standards. Objections such as that CMP must be unreliable because most normal adults do not practice it is, Alston argues, guilty of imperialism. It imposes a standard on CMP that requires it to be more like the Sense-perceptual Practice (SP) for no good epistemic reason. Why should we expect practices that are used by all the population to be the only ones that are reliable? An example of an objection that imposes a double standard would be requiring that the outputs of CMP be independently verifiable. Alston argues that no basic belief forming practice meets this requirement including SP, so requiring something like this of CMP is to apply a standard that one would not apply across the board.

b. The Parity Argument

The beginnings of the parity argument can be seen in Plantinga’s early writings as far back as God and Other Minds. There, Plantinga argues that belief in other minds and belief in God are in the same epistemological dilemma; all of the arguments in their favor fall short when it comes to philosophical scrutiny. Yet, as Plantinga states, “if belief in other minds is rational, so is my belief in God. But obviously the former is rational; so, therefore, is the latter.” As Plantinga’s thinking has developed, so has his parity argument as it relates to rational belief in God. The key difference in his thinking, as he notes in Warranted Christian Belief, is that he no longer takes proofs as the only way to justify belief in God. This major shift in Plantinga’s thinking opens the door for a more daring parity argument, namely that in the same way that perceptual experiences are justified, belief in God—through the divine sense—is also justified and should thus enjoy the same epistemic status as ordinary perceptual experiences.

Plantinga’s parity argument for rational belief in God follows a specific pattern. The first goal is to highlight those beliefs that we take to be both rational and basic. In other words, it needs to be the kind of belief that is rational despite not being inferred from any evidence or argument. Further, it must be the sort of belief that if held hostage to evidential demands it would have devastating epistemological results; perceptual beliefs, it is thought, are specifically what Plantinga is looking for. Consider for example the belief that I see a clock hanging on the wall. It would be difficult to present any non-circular or non-question begging evidence to justify my belief. Yet, this is what the evidentialist demands. So if we can disregard the demands of the evidentialist in the case of perceptual beliefs, then perhaps the demands the evidentialist places on belief in God should be reconsidered as well; neither can produce the required (non-question begging) evidence, but surely in the case of our perceptual beliefs it can’t be said that we as agents are unjustified, epistemically irresponsible, or irrational in our belief. This of course raises further questions about evidential demands. This, then, is the first parallel that Plantinga and other reformed epistemologists make. The second parallel deals with the similarities between perceptual and religious experiences.

Perceptual beliefs arise from some perceptual experience; the belief arises suddenly with the cognizer having no control over the initial belief. The perceptual belief that arises from the experience is prima facie justified. Thomas Reid, whose influence on reformed epistemology is of note, argued that what we perceive is not “only irresistible, but it is immediate; that is, it is not by train of reasoning and argumentation that we come to be convinced of the existence of what we perceive.” Perceptual beliefs, according to Reid, are not inferred but immediately known by the perceiver. The parallels between perceptual beliefs and belief in God, on Plantinga’s account anyway, are important. The idea is that belief in God and perceptual beliefs are both immediate and the result of our cognitive faculties. Thus, if some perceptual belief like “I see a tree” is prima facie justified, then belief in God, if it arises in the same manner (for example, the result of some cognitive faculty), is also prima facie justified.                 

So what is this special faculty that gives rise to belief in God in an immediate non-inferential fashion? Plantinga uses a term that is well known to most in the reformed tradition called the sensus divinitatis. Calvin, who Plantinga credits with the sensus divinitatis, claimed that one can accept and know that God exists without any argument or evidence. As a result of the workings of the sensus divinitatis, belief in God is properly basic and is not inferred from any evidence or argument. Plantinga’s position is summed up nicely here:

Calvin’s claim, then, is that God has created us in such a way that we have a strong tendency or inclination toward belief in him. This tendency has been in part overlaid or suppressed by sin. Were it not for the existence of sin in the world, human beings would believe in God to the same degree and with the same natural spontaneity that we believe in the existence of other persons, an external world, or the past. This is the natural human condition; it is because of our presently unnatural sinful condition that many find belief in God difficult or absurd. The fact is, Calvin thinks, one who does not believe in God is in an epistemically substandard position—rather like a man who does not believe that his wife exists, or thinks she is likely a cleverly constructed robot and has no thoughts, feelings, or consciousness. Although this belief in God is partially suppressed, it is nonetheless universally present. (Plantinga 1983: 66)

From this, Plantinga concludes that “there is a kind of faculty or cognitive mechanism, what Calvin calls sensus divinitatis or a sense of divinity, which in a wide variety of circumstances produces in us beliefs about God.” So in the same way that perceptual beliefs such as “I see a table” are non-inferential and properly basic, belief in God, when occasioned by the appropriate circumstances (such as one feeling a sense of guilt, dependence, beauty, and so forth), can also be properly basic because of the cognitive working of the sensus divinitatis.

On Plantinga’s reformed account then, belief in God can now be added to the list of properly basic beliefs:

  1. I see a tree (known perceptually),
  2. I am in pain (known introspectively),
  3. I had breakfast this morning (known through memory), and
  4. God exists (known through the sensus divinitatis).

This belief can be taken as properly basic if the agent’s belief has sufficient warrant.

There is another important question to be asked, however. Does it follow from this that belief in God is groundless? If I come to believe in God on the reformed model, can it be said that my belief is groundless? Plantinga argues that in the same way that “I see a tree” is properly basic but not groundless, belief in God is not groundless. Understanding what Plantinga means by “groundless” is important in realizing the distinction between evidence and grounds for belief. Perceptual experiences, such as those caused by visual experiences, are not considered to be groundless because of their reliance on the senses. Likewise, Plantinga claims that belief in God is not groundless, because it is rooted in the experience of the sensus divinitatis. These experiences, however, do not entail that the belief in question is inferential. The belief is merely occasioned by the circumstance (for example, the circumstance of beholding some majestic mountains or desert sunset) which triggers the working of the sensus divinitatis. Those who believe in God simply find themselves with this belief.

Another important point concerns defeaters against belief in God. Plantinga argues that while belief in God is properly basic, it is also open to defeat. Suppose that someone offers a defeater for the belief that God exists; then, claims Plantinga, that particular belief would have to be abandoned. It is possible however, for one to offer a defeater-defeater, which would obviously entail the belief being justifiably maintained. This is an important point in that we can now see that a properly basic belief, for Plantinga, is not some incorrigible or indubitable belief that one can always believe despite defeating evidence. It is, in other words, properly basic but open to defeat.

c. Warranted Christian Belief

Alvin Plantinga has developed an important account of how religious belief could amount to knowledge. This view is discussed in his trilogy: Warrant: The Current Debate, Warrant and Proper Function, and finally, Warranted Christian Faith. In this Warrant trilogy, Plantinga is interested in the question “What is knowledge?”, and more specifically in what it is that makes the difference between mere true belief and knowledge. He calls this, whatever it is, warrant.

Warrant is just one of a number of epistemic terms that are used in epistemology; others include justification, rationality and evidence. Warrant is of particular importance, however, because if we can answer the question “What is warrant?” then we will have an answer to the question “What is knowledge?”

Plantinga argues that warrant results from the proper functioning of your cognitive faculties:

[A] belief has warrant for me only if (1) it has been produced in me by cognitive faculties that are working properly (functioning as they ought to, subject to no cognitive dysfunction) in a cognitive environment that is appropriate for my kinds of cognitive faculties, (2) the segment of the design plan governing the production of that belief is aimed at the production of true beliefs, and (3) there is a high statistical probability that a belief produced under those conditions will be true. (Plantinga 1993: 46-47)

Key to Plantinga’s analysis of warrant is that a belief can only be warranted if it is produced by a cognitive faculty that is functioning properly, which means that it must not be diseased or broken or hindered. In order to make sense of what it means for our cognitive faculties to be functioning properly we must introduce the notion of a design plan, which determines the way our cognitive faculties are supposed to work. Just as the human heart is supposed to beat at 50-80 beats per minute while at rest, so too, there is a way that our cognitive faculties are supposed to function. This, claims Plantinga, should not be thought to necessarily invoke the notion of conscious design (by God, or anyone else), rather he means to invoke the common idea shared by many theists and non-theists, that parts of our bodies have a function, such as one of the functions of our legs being to allow us to move through our environment.

As well as having cognitive faculties that are functioning properly those faculties must also be operating in the right cognitive environment—the one for which they are designed. This means that one might have warrant for a perceptual belief that is formed about a nearby medium sized object on a clear day, but not for a perceptual belief about a far-away object in a badly lit, smoke-filled room. It must also be that the part of the design plan governing the production of the belief in question must be aimed at truth. Our faculties are designed for a number of different purposes, not just the production of true beliefs, which means that it may be that there are times when our cognitive faculties are functioning properly in the correct environment, and yet produce a false belief, or a belief that is only accidentally true. For example, it may be the case that when a person discovers that they have a life-threatening illness that they are designed in such a way that they will come to believe that they will recover, even if this unlikely to be true—this may perhaps be the case because one is more likely to recover if one believes that this is true. That would be a case of cognitive faculties functioning properly in the correct environment, but not a case of the belief being warranted because the design plan, in this instance, does not aim at truth.

The final requirement is that there is a high statistical probability that a belief that is produced by the cognitive faculty in question is likely to be true when it is functioning properly in the environment for which it was designed—which is to say that the design must be a good one. Plantinga imagines a situation in which our faculties have been designed by some lesser deity, and that this deity has done such a poor job, that even when our faculties are functioning properly, in the correct environment, according to a design plan that is aimed at truth, we still form mostly false beliefs because the design is so poor. If this was the case then our beliefs would not have warrant, even in cases where they did turn out to be true. For this reason a reliability condition is required as well.

One important point to note is that Plantinga’s account is an externalist one. This means that, on Plantinga’s view, warrant involves, not just facts that the agent is aware of, but also facts that the agent may not be aware of; such as, for example, whether one’s faculties are functioning properly and facts about the environment. This point is crucial to Plantinga’s account given that whether or not a theist has warrant for her religious beliefs may depend on facts that she is unaware of.

Plantinga claims that given this view in epistemology there is no good reason to think that religious belief is not warranted. Plantinga claims that, following John Calvin, we may have been created by God with a faculty called the sensus divinitatis. Any beliefs that result from this faculty will be in a position to be warranted. So long as the faculty was designed by God for the purpose of producing true beliefs about him then this faculty will meet the requirements described above and the resulting beliefs will be warranted.

It is not Plantinga’s intention to show that this faculty exists or that this really is the way that religious beliefs come about. Instead his claim is that since this is true for all we know then one cannot reasonably claim that religious beliefs are not rational without first showing that this account is false.

7. Objections to Reformed Epistemology

Reformed epistemology has received a significant amount of attention and attracted many objections. Some of the most significant ones are described below.

a. Great Pumpkin Objection

There is a family of objections known as Great Pumpkin objections. These objections get their name from the Peanuts comic strip. In peanuts the character Linus is a child who believes that each Halloween the Great Pumpkin will come to visit him at the pumpkin patch. What these objections have in common is that they claim that, if reformed epistemology is correct, then belief in God is no more rational than belief in the Great Pumpkin.

This kind of objection is first mentioned by Plantinga in “Reason and Belief in God” (74-78). One of the claims of reformed epistemology is that the religious believer need not offer any criteria for deciding which beliefs are reasonable starting points for forming further beliefs. Instead each community is responsible for determining its own starting points and reasoning on that basis. Plantinga supposes that someone might object to this by claiming that this method means that the community in question will have no reason to accept any belief over any other. This community could take belief in God to be properly basic, but they might instead take the belief that the earth is flat or that I can run at the speed of light if I try really hard, or the belief that the Great Pumpkin will return at Halloween to the most deserving pumpkin patches. There is no reason, so the objection goes, to choose one belief over another without first offering some criteria for determining which beliefs are rational starting points and which are not.

Plantinga points out that in other areas we are able to discriminate between two things even if we are not able to give criteria for how that discrimination is to be done. The example he gives is the meaningfulness of sentences. Plantinga observes that we can easily tell that the sentence “T’was brillig; and the slithy toves did gyre and gymble in the wabe” is meaningless even if we cannot appeal to some general criteria of meaning. Likewise, claims Plantinga, there is no reason to think that something similar will not be possible for beliefs. This example shows that there is nothing mysterious about the suggestion that we might be able to tell which candidates belong to a certain class, and which do not, without also being able to state criteria for inclusion. For these reasons this objection need not trouble the reformed epistemologist.

Michael Martin offers a more troubling version of the argument. He does not label his objection as a Great Pumpkin objection, but Plantinga refers to it as the Son of the Great Pumpkin objection. Here is how Martin phrases the objection:

Although reformed epistemologists would not have to accept voodoo beliefs as rational, voodoo followers would be able to claim that insofar as they are basic in the voodoo community they are rational and, moreover, that reformed thought was irrational in this community. Indeed, Plantinga’s proposal would generate many different communities that could legitimately claim that their basic beliefs are rational. (Martin 1990: 272)

This second objection concerns whether or not a community can make judgments about the basic beliefs of other communities in a principled way. They may be able to argue that the believers in some other community are not justified in holding some of their non-basic beliefs, because they are not adequately supported by their basic beliefs, but since the basic beliefs are not supported by other beliefs, there seems to be no way for those outside the community to criticize them. If this is correct, it is a very strange and counter-intuitive result. There are various beliefs that we think are objectionable, even if they are held in the basic way; for example, belief that the Great Pumpkin will return every Halloween, that the Earth is flat and the claims of astrology all seem to be objectionable from the epistemic point of view, whether or not they are held in the basic way.

The reformed epistemologist regards the process of assembling examples of properly basic beliefs to be the responsibility of each community, and so, it would seem, at least at first, that she is committed to a sort of epistemic relativism whereby the most one can do to criticize the beliefs of a person from a different community is to point out internal inconsistencies. This wouldn’t necessarily be a major problem, except for the fact that the sorts of communities that seem to be included are ones that hold bizarre, irrational or superstitious beliefs—beliefs like astrology, voodoo or perhaps even the Great Pumpkin belief.

The reformed epistemologist can respond to this objection by pointing out that one could challenge the basic beliefs of another community by finding a defeater. Our basic beliefs are defeasible, and therefore open to revision in light of further information. This means that just because you are permitted to treat a belief as properly basic if it seems to you that it is, it does not follow that you will continue to be permitted to hold that belief no matter what. You may gain a defeater for that belief and come to believe that it is no longer true. A person may be justified in taking a belief such as the Great Pumpkin belief as basic if she has been raised to believe that the Great Pumpkin exists, but when she comes to learn more about the world—for example, when, yet again, the Great Pumpkin fails to arrive on Halloween—she will obtain a defeater for that belief, and it will no longer be reasonable for her to hold that belief.

The reformed epistemologist is therefore not endorsing an epistemic free-for-all, since just because a belief is basic does not mean that it is immune to epistemic appraisal. It is still perfectly possible for anyone to argue against the basic beliefs of another community, and to show them that one of their beliefs is false or unjustified.

The third, and final, version of this objection claims that reformed epistemology places belief in God beyond epistemic appraisal and that its methods could be adapted to place other beliefs beyond epistemic appraisal—beliefs that are clearly irrational like belief in the Great Pumpkin. If the methods of reformed epistemology can be used to defend beliefs like these then it cannot be successful in establishing the rationality of religious belief.

Linda Zagzebski has offered an objection like this one. She claims that reformed epistemology has failed to meet the requirements of what she calls the “Rational Recognition Principle (RRP): If a belief is rational, its rationality is recognizable, in principle, by rational persons in other cultures” (Zagzebski in Plantinga et al. 2002: 120). Zagzebski directs her objection against Plantinga and writes that reformed epistemology

violates the Rational Recognition principle. It does not permit a rational observer outside the community of believers in the model to distinguish between Plantinga’s model and the beliefs of any group, no matter how irrational and bizarre—sun-worshippers, cult followers, devotées of the Greek gods . . . , assuming, of course, that they are clever enough to build their own epistemic doctrines into their models in a parallel fashion. But we do think that there are differences in the rationality of the beliefs of a cult and Christian beliefs, even if the cult is able to produce an exactly parallel argument for a conditional proposition to the effect that the beliefs of the cult are rational if true. Hence, the rationality of such beliefs must depend upon something other than their truth. (Zagzebski in Plantinga et al. 2002: 122)

A similar objection is offered by Keith DeRose in his unpublished essay “Voodoo Epistemology.” DeRose argues that the real worry for reformed epistemology is that it could be adapted to defend some very strange and clearly irrational beliefs. This, claims DeRose, shows that there is something wrong with reformed epistemology even if we cannot say exactly what it is.

This objection is not completely devastating for reformed epistemology but it does make the achievements of reformed epistemology look much less significant. Work in this area by Kyle Scott (2014) has suggested that we ought to consider the historical and social environments that beliefs occur in, arguing that only beliefs that occur in stable and enduring communities are viable candidates for being defended in the way that reformed epistemologists defend religious belief.

b. Disanalogies

An important claim made by reformed epistemology is that religious belief can be rationally held in the basic way, similar to perceptual beliefs. An objection to this is that it cannot be reasonable to hold religious beliefs in the basic way because of significant differences between perceptual beliefs and religious beliefs. The objection has been most forcefully put by Richard Grigg (1983). He does not think that theistic beliefs will turn out to be basic because of the disanalogies between theistic beliefs and more widely recognized basic beliefs.

Grigg interprets reformed epistemology as arguing that the Christian community is within its epistemic rights in holding that certain theistic beliefs are basic because these beliefs are analogous to other beliefs that are more widely regarded to be basic. Examples of these include: (1) I see a tree, (2) I had breakfast this morning, and (3) That person is angry. Grigg identifies three important disanalogies between these beliefs and theistic beliefs.

Firstly, Grigg points out that although beliefs such as (1)-(3) will often be basic, they are still constantly being confirmed:

For example, when I return home this evening, I will see some dirty dishes sitting in my sink, one less egg in my refrigerator than was there yesterday, etc. This is not to say that (2) is believed because of evidence. Rather, it is a basic belief grounded immediately by memory. But one of the reasons that I take such memory beliefs as properly basic is that my memory is almost always subsequently confirmed by empirical evidence. (Grigg 1983: 126)

This, on the other hand, is not true of theistic belief. Beliefs, such as that God created the world, Grigg suggests, are not confirmed by observation, and may even be disconfirmed if the problem of evil is a successful argument.

The second disanalogy is that there is a certain universality enjoyed by beliefs such as (1)-(3), but not by theistic beliefs. That is, when a person has a perceptual experience such as being appeared to treely, they will naturally believe something like “I see a tree”; and this is the case, claims Grigg, for the vast majority of people. The situation is not the same for theistic beliefs; take, for example, Plantinga’s suggestion that one might have an experience of being awed by the beauty of the universe and form the belief that God created the universe. Grigg claims that many people have this experience yet there is no universally shared belief that typically comes with this experience, unlike in the case of perceptual beliefs.

The third, and final, disanalogy that Grigg raises is that people have a bias towards theistic beliefs, but not usually with less controversial examples of properly basic beliefs. Grigg points out that there is a psychological benefit to be gained from believing that God exists, whereas, there will not usually be any obvious benefit for beliefs like (1)-(3).

Each of these disanalogies can be challenged. Mark Macleod points out that it is not obvious that these are genuine disanalogies. For example, religious beliefs may receive confirmation from multiple sources such as sacred writings, the testimony of other believers and further religious experiences. Although these sources are not independent of each other it is not clear that the experiences in the breakfast example above are independent either since all the supporting evidence relies on perceptual experience at some point.

The second disanalogy is problematic as well because when a person has an experience of seeing a tree they may form a wide variety of belief such as “I see a tree” or “that tree is about to fall over” or “it is very windy today”. Contrary to what Grigg argues the beliefs that are formed in response to perceptual experiences are not uniform.

The third disanology is also not clearly a genuine disanology. I may derive psychological benefit from many of my perceptual beliefs such as believing that the computer screen is showing a positive number next to my bank account.

Even if the case for disanalogies between perceptual experiences and religious experience can be proved, then, this may not be a problem for reformed epistemology. Reformed epistemology should not be understood as relying on the claim that religious experience is just like perceptual experience. Rather what reformed epistemologists have been arguing for is that we ought to judge religious experience by the same standards as we judge perceptual experiences, and that religious experience stands up well when judged by those standards. Given the difference in subject matter and the alleged faculties involved, then, it should not be surprising to find disanalogies between religious experience and perceptual experience. To develop any disanalogies into an objection to reformed epistemology it must also be shown that the disanalogies are sufficient to show that such beliefs are not rational unless supported by further evidence.

c. Religious Diversity

According to reformed epistemology religious belief can be rational even if it is not supported by evidence. What reformed epistemologists do not claim is that these beliefs will be immune to defeat. It may be that a person’s religious beliefs are initially irrational, but when they discover some new piece of information they cease to be. Some have suggested that, even if reformed epistemology is correct, there is a defeater for religious belief that ought to be apparent to most competent adults in the world today. This defeater comes from considering the facts of religious diversity. In this section we will consider two attempts to advance this sort of objection.

i. Religious Belief is Epistemically Arbitrary

Suppose, for the sake of argument at least, that all of the major religions might be equally well supported by arguments and that its adherents might all have the same sort of internally available markers for their beliefs. The scenario would be one where whatever the theist can offer in support of her beliefs, those who disagree can offer the same considerations. For example, suppose that Anne believes p and Bill believes ¬p, and that whatever evidence or arguments Anne can offer in support of p Bill can offer equally good evidence and arguments in support of ¬p. Suppose further that their beliefs are alike in all other respects, so that if Anne finds p intuitive, Bill finds ¬p intuitive; or if Anne takes p as foundational Bill takes Øp as foundational; and so on for any other considerations that might be epistemically relevant. John Hick claims that if this is the case then it is intellectually arbitrary for the religious believer to hold that her own beliefs are true while those of other religions are false because she has no reason to treat the beliefs differently.

Richard Feldman also offers a similar objection by arguing for the following principle:

If (i) S has some good reasons (‘internal markers’) to believe P, but (ii) also knows that other people have equally good reasons (‘internal markers’) for believing things incompatible with P, and (iii) S has no reason to discount their reasons and favor her own, then S is not justified in believing P. (Feldman 2003: 88)

This principle states that even if you have good reasons for believing p, if you know that others have equally good reasons for believing something incompatible with p, and you have no reason to discount their reason then you are not justified in accepting p. This is because, claims Feldman, learning that others have equally good reasons for their incompatible beliefs undercuts your justification for p.

Alvin Plantinga has responded to this objection by trying to show that there is nothing inconsistent about holding onto your beliefs in the face of disagreement—even in the circumstances described above.

His first point is that the internal support that a belief enjoys does not exhaust everything that can be said about the epistemic status of a belief. Two beliefs can have all the same “internal markers” and yet still not be equal from the epistemic point of view. Other relevant features include whether or not the faculty that produced the belief is functioning properly, and whether or not the belief was produced in an environment for which the faculty was designed. Furthermore, one does not need to endorse Plantinga’s epistemology in order to agree with this point. Others have suggested that external factors are relevant to the epistemic standing of a belief; such as reliability of the source of the belief, whether the belief is safe or whether the belief is sensitive. What this means is that there is no inconsistency in thinking that two incompatible beliefs are alike in purely internal support and yet for us to treat them differently. This is a very modest claim and supplies no reason to think that judging two such beliefs differently in the sorts of cases described can be justified, only that it is not contradictory to do so. This point is supposed to lay the basis for his following two points.

The second point is that if disagreement is a defeater then it would defeat too many beliefs. Plantinga labels it a “philosophical tar baby,” claiming that it would be a problem not just for him, but for his objectors as well. This is because whatever position one adopts in this debate there will be others who disagree. The Christian will believe certain claims knowing that others in similar epistemic situations disagree, as will the Hindu or the Muslim. An atheist or a pluralist will be in no better a situation since she will think that the claims of these religions are false, and know that there others who disagree. Plantinga does not think that withholding belief avoids the problem either since if one withholds belief there will still be disagreement concerning whether or not withholding belief is the correct epistemic attitude to adopt. This worry also extends to other areas as well, such as politics and philosophy where there is also widespread disagreement. What this is supposed to show is that claiming that disagreement is a defeater has potentially disastrous consequences leading to a sort of skepticism. This, of course, does not show that it is wrong that disagreement defeats belief, it is only meant to show that this problem is a problem for everyone, and it is not one that is solely a problem for the religious believer.

Plantinga’s third point is offered by way of a thought experiment:

Perhaps you have always believed it deeply wrong for a counselor to use his position of trust to seduce a client. Perhaps you discover that others disagree; they think it more like a minor peccadillo, like running a red light when there’s no traffic; and you realize that possibly these people have the same internal markers for their beliefs that you have for yours. You think the matter over more fully, imaginatively recreate and rehearse such situations, become more aware of just what is involved in such a situation (the breach of trust, the breaking of implied promises, the injustice and unfairness, the nasty irony of the situation in which someone comes to a counsellor seeking help but receives only hurt) and come to believe even more firmly the belief that such an action is wrong... (Plantinga 2012: 653)

Plantinga claims that in moral cases, such as this one, it is clear that it is reasonable to continue believing in the face of disagreement even when you believe that those who disagree enjoy the same internal markers as yourself. If it is reasonable in this case to continue to hold on to your beliefs then it cannot be true in general that one is required to give up beliefs in the face of disagreement.

Plantinga thinks that these three considerations are sufficient to diffuse the charge of arbitrariness. His claim is that if we endorse something like Feldman’s principle above then we will be forced to give up many of our beliefs (possibly including beliefs about the principle itself) and in particular this does not fit with our intuitions about what it is rational to do in the case of moral disagreements like the one Plantinga describes above.

These responses do something to help neutralize the arbitrariness charge but they do not adequately deal with it. What Plantinga has achieved is to show that we cannot always be rationally required to give up our beliefs in the face of disagreement. But that is not sufficient to respond to the problem because there are examples where it does seem to arbitrary to hold on to your belief. An example often discussed in the literature is the restaurant case.

Suppose that Anne and Bill are in a restaurant with friends. The time comes to pay the bill and they both decide to figure out how much everyone owes. Anne believes that everyone owes $23, but Bill believes everyone owes $24. Each considers the other to be just as good at mental arithmetic and they have no reason to suspect that one of them is impaired on this occasion. In this example it seems clear that it would be irrational for Anne to hold on to her belief that everyone owes $23 even if it turns out that she is correct. She seems to have no good reason to prefer her own belief other than that it is her own.

What this suggests is that it cannot be either that disagreement always requires us to revise our beliefs or that it never requires us to revise our beliefs. What is needed is a more sophisticated epistemology of disagreement that lies somewhere between these two extremes. But Plantinga has given us no reason to think that religious beliefs will remain rational in the face of disagreement under this more reasonable epistemology of disagreement. What is needed here is a better understanding of the epistemic implications of disagreement and how that relates to religious disagreement. Fortunately, there is an active debate on this topic and it is likely that one’s opinion on that debate will determine whether or not one believes that this is a successful objection.

ii. Competing Belief Forming Practices

One of the central claims of reformed epistemology is that what determines whether religious belief is rational is not the evidence that a believer can present, but facts about the faculty that produced the belief. The facts of religious diversity offer a way to mount an argument that concludes that we have good reason to think that the faculty that produces religious belief is unreliable.

Before looking at a serious version of this argument it will be instructive to look at a naïve version of the argument and why it fails. This version of the argument observes the wide variety of religious beliefs in the world and notes that many of them contradict each other. Given this disagreement it seems clear that religious belief forming methods are unreliable because, even if some of the beliefs are correct, most of them must be false. Given the wide diversity of religious beliefs, most of these beliefs must be false. This objection is not too troubling since it assumes that there is a single religious belief forming practice. That is, however, implausible. There are significant differences in the practices of different religious practitioners, so the diversity of belief is not evidence that all religious belief forming practices are unreliable.

This objection can be developed further by observing that when it comes to religious matters there are competing methods. These competing methods frequently produce contradictory beliefs. At most, one of these methods can be reliable, but if we have no independent (that is, independent of religious belief forming methods) reason to prefer one over the others then we ought to refrain from engaging in any of them.

William Alston raises this objection against his own view. He compares it to the following situation:

Consider ways of predicting the weather: various 'scientific' meteorological approaches, going by the state of rheumatism in one's joints, and observing groundhogs. Again, if one employs one of these methods but has no non-question-begging reason for supposing that method to be more reliable than the others, then one has no sufficient rational basis for reposing confidence in its outputs. (Alston 1991: 271)

It seems clear, when it comes to choosing between methods for predicting the weather, that if we have several competing methods we ought not accept any of them until we find some reason to prefer one over the other.

Alston responds to this objection by pointing out that there is an important difference between the religious case and the weather prediction case. When it comes to predicting the weather we know what sort of evidence we would need to choose between these methods—we can observe which one is getting it right. Things are different for the religious case because we do not know what reasons we could have for choosing one of these methods over another. The methods in question in the religious case are our only access to the topic—independently of these methods it is difficult to see what reasons we could have for preferring one over another. In light of this, Alston suggests that one cannot be faulted for lacking reasons to prefer one’s own religious belief forming methods.

d. Sensible Evidentialism

One of the central claims of reformed epistemology is that evidentialism with respect to belief in God is misguided. Stephen Wykstra argues that reformed epistemologists (or basicalists, as he calls them) have poorly framed the debate between themselves and evidentialists. He has sought to relocate the debate about the proper basicality of belief in God by contrasting reformed epistemology not with what he calls Extravagant Evidentialism (EE) but with Sensible Evidentialism (SE).

EE is the claim that a person’s belief is only rational if it is either basic, or that person can present propositional evidence for their belief. If we use this to define basic and non-basic beliefs then beliefs that arise from testimony or memory will often be basic. Since these beliefs are basic and belief in God often derives from memory or testimony, then in most cases the EE Objection to belief in God will not amount to much.

Wykstra, however, claims that EE is not the best way to understand the notion of needing evidence. He highlights this by using the example of belief in electrons. Most adults believe in electrons, but very few hold this belief on the basis of evidence. Most of us believe in electrons because we have been told that they exist by scientists, or teachers or some other knowledgeable person. According to the reformed epistemologist this belief will often be basic, and so it will be immune to the evidentialist objection. This is only true if we understand evidentialism as a demand that evidence be produced for each belief by the believer. This fails to take into account that, although the believer in electrons need not be able to produce evidence, the belief is still in some sense in need of evidence. Wykstra asks us to consider the following possible situation:

Suppose we were to discover that no evidential case is available for electrons—say, that the entire presumed case for electrons was a fraud propagated by clever con-men in Copenhagen in the 1920s. Would we, in this event, shrug our shoulders and continue unvexedly believing in electrons? Hardly. We would instead regard our electron belief as being in jeopardy, in epistemic hot water, in (let us put it) big doxastic trouble. (Wykstra 1989: 485)

The electron belief may not need evidence to be rational in an individualistic sense, but evidence must be available somewhere in the community. The testimony is defective if it does not connect you to a person, or persons, who do have evidence for the existence of electrons. This is what Wykstra refers to as a much more sensible way of construing the notion of needing evidence. EE requires that evidence is possessed by the individual, whereas SE requires that the evidence is possessed by the believer’s community.

SE gives us a much more plausible evidentialist objection to belief in God. The sensible evidentialist constraint will be that belief in God is only epistemically adequate if the religious community has sufficient evidence for the belief that God exists. The “interesting basicalist” will then be someone who claims that belief in God is not in need of evidence even in this sense; that belief in God is based upon our native faculties. Wykstra observes that even if belief in God is derived from some God-given faculty it may still be the case that belief in God is in need of evidence. Belief in electrons is in need of evidence because our native faculties do not give us access to them, but beliefs based upon our native faculties, such as testimony, are also sometimes in need of evidence in a rather different way. Wykstra draws attention to some of the insights of Thomas Reid concerning testimony:

When brought to maturity by proper culture … [reason] learns to suspect testimony in some case, and to disbelieve it in others … But still, to the end of life, she finds a necessity of borrowing light from testimony … And as, in many instances, Reason even in her maturity, borrows aid from testimony, so in others she mutually gives aid to it, and strengthens its authority. For, as we find good reason to reject testimony in some cases, so in others we find good reason to rely upon it with perfect security… (Wykstra 1989: 489)

According to Reid, we each have a natural tendency to believe testimony, however, over time we learn that not all testimony is reliable and we learn to find reasons to give some testimony greater weight and others much less. Although inferences are playing a role in forming testimonial belief, it is still testimony that gives support to the belief; inference only plays a refining role.

In light of varied religious beliefs and experiences, both across and within particular religious traditions, we must conclude that evidence is needed to discriminate between different religious beliefs. This does not mean that religious experience cannot ground belief in God. It may be that some religious faculty grounds the belief, but that the faculty is in need of refinement, just like testimony can be a basic source of knowledge, but still in need of refinement. This continues to draw on the teachings of the Christian tradition because although some Christians hold that we have access to God through our native faculties, they have been marred by sin, so it should not be surprising that we can err in our knowledge of God, or that our native faculties alone are not sufficient.

This sensible evidentialist objection should not really be called an objection; perhaps the sensible evidentialist problem would be better. That is because Wykstra is not urging the reader to give up belief in God, but rather to properly acknowledge the role that evidence can and does play in knowing God. This problem seems to have played some role in motivating the later work of Alvin Plantinga where he is attempting to set out a positive account of how religious beliefs could amount to knowledge, rather than simply responding to an objection.

8. References and Further Reading

  • Alston, William. “Religious Experience and Religious Belief”. In Nous 16 (1982): 3-12.
    • An early essay by one of the central proponents of reformed epistemology.
  • Alston, William. Perceiving God. Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press, 1991.
    • An important work on the epistemology of religious experience.
  • Baker, Deane-Peter. Tayloring Reformed Epistemology. London: SCM Press, 2007.
    • An attempt to bring together the work of Charles Taylor and certain aspects of reformed epistemology. Includes a helpful description and critique of arguments for reformed epistemology.
  • Beilby, James. Epistemology as Theology. Burlington, VA: Ashgate Publishing, 2005.
    • A detailed account of Alvin Plantinga’s reformed epistemology.
  • DeRose, Keith. “Voodoo Epistemology” unpublished manuscript.
    • A well-known essay – despite being unpublished – that criticizes Alvin Plantinga’s reformed epistemology.
  • Feldman, Richard. “Plantinga on Exclusivism”. In Faith and Philosophy 20 (2003): 85-90.
    • A paper arguing that it cannot be rational to hold religious beliefs when one is aware of the widespread disagreement about religion.
  • Grigg, Richard. “Theism and Proper Basicality: A response to Plantinga”. In International Journal for Philosophy if Religion 14 (1983): 123-127.
    • An essay challenging the reformed epistemologist’s claim that there is a parity between perceptual belief and theistic beliefs.
  • Kenny, Anthony. Faith and Reason. New York: Columbia University Press, 1983.
    • Much of this book is on religious epistemology and it engages with reformed epistemology.
  • Mackie, J.L. The Miracle of Theism. New York: Oxford University Press, 1982.
    • An important book providing many arguments against theism.
  • Martin, Michael. Atheism: A Philosophical Justification. Philadelphia: Temple University Press, 1990.
    • This book presents numerous arguments in favour of atheism and against theism – including against reformed epistemology.
  • Plantinga, Alvin. God and Other Minds. Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 1967.
    • An early account of Plantinga's parity argument which lays the foundation for reformed epistemology.
  • Plantinga, Alvin. Warrant and Proper Function. New York: Oxford University Press, 1993.
    • A discussion of proper function which also lays the foundation for Plantinga’s Warranted Christian Belief.
  • Plantinga, Alvin. Warranted Christian Belief. New York: Oxford University Press, 2000.
    • Arguably the most important work in reformed epistemology to date. Plantinga articulates and defends his version of the view at great length. It engages with many important debates in Philosophy of Religion.
  • Plantinga, Alvin. “A Defense of Religious Exclusivism” in Louis Pojman and Michael Rae (eds) Philosophy of Religion: An Anthology. Boston: Wadsworth, 2012.
    • Plantinga argues that it can be reasonable to believe that your religion is correct and that others are wrong.
  • Plantinga, Alvin and Nicholas Wolterstorff. Faith and Rationality. Notre Dame, Indiana: University of Notre Dame Press, 1983.
    • Contains many important early essays articulating and defending reformed epistemology.
  • Plantinga, A., Sudduth, M., Wykstra, S. and Zagzebski, L. “Warranted Christian Belief”. In Philosophical Books 43 (2002): 81-135.
    • A collection of essays critically engaging with Warranted Christian Belief, along with a reply from Alvin Plantinga.
  • Scott, Kyle. “Return of the Great Pumpkin”. In Religious Studies 50 (2014): 297-308.
    • A recent formulation of an objection to reformed epistemology along with a new response.
  • Sudduth, Michael. The Reformed Objection to Natural Theology. London: Ashgate, 2009.
    • Deals with the objections to natural theology that are typically posed by the reformed epistemologist.
  • Tomberlin, James and Peter van Inwagen (eds.). Alvin Plantinga. Dordrecht: D. Reidel, 1985.
    • A collection of essays examining the work of Alvin Plantinga, one of the central figures in reformed epistemology.
  • Wolterstorff, Nicholas. Reason within the Bounds of Religion. Grand Rapids, MI: Eerdmans, 1976.
    • An exploration of how his Christian faith ought to relate to his work as a scholar.
  • Wolterstorff, Nicholas. Lament for a Son. Grand Rapids, MI: Eerdmans, 1987.
    • Though not an academic book, some important points are made about reformed epistemology and religious epistemology in general.
  • Wolterstorff, Nicholas. Divine Discourse. Cambridge University Press, 1995.
    • A Philosophical exploration of claims that God speaks.
  • Wolterstorff, Nicholas. Justice: Rights and Wrongs. Princeton University Press, 2010.
    • Offers an account of rights and of justice. Engages significantly with Christian thought.
  • Wykstra, Stephen. "Toward a sensible evidentialism: on the notion of ‘needing evidence’." In Philosophy of Religion, New York: Harcourt Brace Jovanovich (1989): 426-437.
    • An analysis of Plantinga’s critique of evidentialism.
  • Zagzebski, Linda (ed.). Rational Faith: Catholic Responses to Reformed Epistemology, Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press, 1993.
    • A response to reformed epistemology from various Catholic philosophers.

 

Author Information

Anthony Bolos
Email: ABolos@vcu.edu
Virginia Commonwealth University
U. S. A.

and

Kyle Scott
Email: k.scott@heythrop.ac.uk
Heythrop College
United Kingdom