Hans Reichenbach was a leading philosopher of science, a founder of the Berlin circle, and a proponent of logical positivism (also known as neopositivism or logical empiricism). He is known for his philosophical investigations of Einstein’s theory of relativity, quantum mechanics, the theory of probability, the nature of space and time, the character of physical laws, and conventionalism in physical science.
He was a critic of the Kantian theory of the synthetic a priori. Reichenbach complained that Kant and Poincaré should more carefully have distinguished mathematical geometry [that is, pure, a priori geometry] from physical geometry [that is, applied, synthetic geometry]. Mathematical geometry is about abstract objects in mathematical space; physical geometry is about physical objects in physical space. Kant and Poincaré failed to appreciate that it is the complete package of physics, coordinating definitions, and mathematical geometry that is compared to observation in order to select the appropriate physical geometry, said Reichenbach. This geometry cannot be selected a priori, as Kant wanted, nor by convention, as Poincaré wanted. When the package is in fact compared to observation the proper geometry is non-Euclidean geometry, as Einstein was the first to discover. In addition, developing an idea of Leibniz’s, Reichenbach created a detailed theory whose goal is to explain the direction of time in terms of the direction from causes to their effects.
His methods of teaching philosophy were something of a novelty; students found him easy to approach (this fact was uncommon in German universities); and his courses were open to discussion and debate. In 1930, he and Carnap became the editors of the influential philosophical journal Erkenntnis.
Hans Reichenbach was born on September 26th 1891 in Hamburg, Germany. He was a leading philosopher of science, a founder of the Berlin circle, and a proponent of logical positivism (also known as neopositivism or logical empiricism). He studied physics, mathematics and philosophy at Berlin, Erlangen, Gottingen and Munich in the 1910s. Among his teachers were the neo-Kantian philosopher Ernst Cassirer, the mathematician David Hilbert, and the physicists Max Planck, Max Born and Albert Einstein. Reichenbach received his degree in philosophy from the University at Erlangen in 1915; his dissertation on the theory of probability was published in 1916. He attended Einstein’s lectures on the theory of relativity at Berlin in 1917-20; at that time Reichenbach chose the theory of relativity as the first subject for his own philosophical research. He became a professor at Polytechnic at Stuttgart in 1920. In the same year he published his first book on the philosophical implications of the theory of relativity, The Theory of Relativity and A Priori Knowledge, in which Reichenbach criticized Kantian theory of the synthetic a priori. In the following years he published three books on the philosophical meaning of the theory of relativity: Axiomatization of the theory of Relativity (1924), From Copernicus to Einstein (1927) and The Philosophy of Space and Time (1928); the last in a sense states logical positivism’s view on the theory of relativity. In 1926 Reichenbach became a professor of philosophy of physics at the University at Berlin. His methods of teaching philosophy were something of a novelty; students found him easy to approach (this fact was uncommon in German universities); his courses were open to discussion and debate. In 1928 he founded the Berlin circle (named Die Gesellschaft fur empirische Philosophie, “Society for empirical philosophy”). Among the members of the Berlin circle were Carl Gustav Hempel, Richard von Mises, David Hilbert and Kurt Grelling. In 1930 Reichenbach and Carnap undertook the editorship of the journal Erkenntnis (“Knowledge”).
In 1933 Adolf Hitler became Chancellor of Germany. In the same year Reichenbach emigrated to Turkey, where he became chief of the Department of Philosophy at the University at Istanbul. In Turkey, Reichenbach promoted a shift in philosophy courses; he introduced interdisciplinary seminars and courses on scientific subjects. Then in 1935 he published The theory of Probability.
In 1938 he moved to the United States, where he became a professor at the University of California at Los Angeles; in the same year he published Experience and Prediction. Reichenbach’s work on quantum mechanics was published in 1944 (Philosophic foundations of quantum mechanics). Afterwards he wrote two popular books: Elements of symbolic logic (1947) and The rise of scientific philosophy (1951). In 1949 he contributed an essay on The philosophical significance of the theory of relativity to Albert Einstein: philosopher-scientist edit by Paul Arthur Schillp. Reichenbach died on April 9th 1953 at Los Angeles, California, while he was working on the philosophy of time. Two books Nomological statements and admissible operations (1954) and The direction of time (1956) were published posthumously.
Euclidean geometry is based on the set of axioms stated by Greek mathematician Euclid who developed geometry into an axiomatic system, in which every theorem is derivable from the axioms. Euclid’s work revealed that the truth of geometry depends on the truth of axioms and therefore the question arose whether the axioms were true. Many Euclidean axioms were self-evident, but the axiom of parallels, which states that there is one and only one parallel to a given line through a given point, was considered not self-evident, and many mathematicians tried to derive it from the other axioms. Eventually it was proved the axiom of parallels is not a logical consequence of the remainder. As a result of this research non-Euclidean geometries were discovered and mathematicians became aware of the existence of a plurality of geometries, namely:
In Reichenbach’s opinion, it must be realized that there are two different kinds of geometry, namely mathematical geometry and physical geometry. Mathematical geometry, a branch of mathematics, is a purely formal system and it does not deal with the truth of axioms, but with the proof of theorems. That is, it only produces the consequences of axioms. Physical geometry is concerned with the real geometry, that is, the geometry which is true in our physical world: it searches for the truth (or falsity) of axioms, using the methods of empirical science: experiments, measurements, and so forth; it is a branch of physics.
How can physicists discover the geometry of the real world? Look at the following example, which Reichenbach analyses in The philosophy of space and time. Two-dimensional intelligent beings live in a two-dimensional world, on the surface of a sphere, but they do not know where they live; in their opinion, they might live on a plane, a sphere or whatever surface. How can they discover where they live? They could use some mathematical properties that characterize a geometry; for example, in Euclidean geometry the ratio of the circumference of a circle to its diameter equals pi (3.14…) while in elliptical geometry the ratio is variable and it is less than pi; also in hyperbolic geometry the ratio is variable but greater than pi. Therefore they could measure the circumference and the diameter of a circle; if the ratio equals pi the surface is a plane; if the ratio is less than pi the surface is a sphere. Thus they could discover where they live with the help of such measurements. This method, invented by Gauss (Karl Friedrich Gauss, b 1777 d 1855, German mathematician, was the first to discover a non-Euclidean geometry although he did not published his work) is suitable for a two-dimensional world. Riemann (Bernhard Riemann, b 1826 d 1866, German mathematician, developed both the elliptical geometry and the generalized theory of metric space in any number of dimension which Einstein used in his general theory of relativity) invented a method suitable for a three-dimensional world. There is no reason in principle why physicists could not use Riemann’s method to discover the geometry of our world.
Riemann’s method is based on physical measurements. Reichenbach carefully examines the epistemological implications of measuring geometrical entities. The empirical measurement of geometrical entities depends on physical objects or physical processes corresponding to geometrical concepts. The process of establishing such correlation is called a co-ordinative definition. Usually, a definition is a statement that gives the exact meaning of a concept; this kind of definition is called an explicit definition. There is another kind of definition, namely the co-ordinative definition; it is not a statement, but an ostensive definition. The co-ordinative definition of a concept is a correlation between a real object or a physical process and the concept itself. Some geometrical entities cannot be defined by an explicit definition but they require a co-ordinative definition. For example, the unit of length, ie the metre, is defined by a co-ordinative definition; the physical object corresponding to the metre is the standard rod in Paris (Museum of weights and measures in Paris houses the units of measure for International System of Units). Another example is the definition of straight line which is co-ordinated with a physical process, namely the path of a light ray.
What is the philosophical meaning of a co-ordinative definition? Reichenbach proposes the following problem, discussed in The philosophy of space and time. A measuring rod is moved from one point of space (say A) to another point (say B). When the measuring rod is in B, is its length altered? Many physical circumstances can alter the length, for example, if temperature in A differs from temperature in B. In this example, we can discover whether the temperature is the same by means of a metallic rod and a wooden rod which are of equal length when they are in A. Move the two rods to B: if their length becomes different then the temperature is also different, otherwise the temperature is the same. This method is suitable because temperature is a differential force, ie a force that produces different effects on different substances. But there are universal forces, which produce the same effect on all type of matter. The best known universal force is gravity: its effect is the same on all bodies and therefore all bodies fall with the same acceleration. Now suppose a universal force alters the length of the measuring rods when they are moved from A to B; in this instance, we do not observe any difference between the measuring rods and we cannot know whether the length is altered. Consequently, if a rod stays in A and the other is moved to B where a universal force alters its length, we cannot know their length is different. So we must acknowledge that there is not any way of knowing whether the length of two measuring rods, which are equal when they are in the same point of space, is the same when the two rods are in two different points of space. We can define the two rods equal in length if all differential forces are eliminated and disregard universal forces. But we can adopt a different definition, of course. Thus we must accept – Reichenbach says – that the geometrical form of a body is not an absolute fact, but depends on a co-ordinative definition. There is an astonish consequence of this fact. If a geometry G was proved to be the real geometry by a set of measurements, we could arbitrarily choose a different geometry G’ and adopt a different set of co-ordinative definitions so that G’ would become the real geometry. This is the principle of relativity of geometry, which Reichenbach examines, from a mathematical point of view, in Axiomatization of the theory of relativity and, from a philosophical point of view, in The philosophy of space and time. This principle states that all geometrical systems are equivalent; it falsifies alleged a priori character of Euclidean geometry and thus it falsifies the Kantian philosophy of space too.
At a first glance, the principle of relativity of geometry proves it is not possible to discover the real geometry of our world. This is true if we limit ourselves to metric relationships. Metric relationships are geometric properties of bodies depending on distances, angles, areas, and so forth; examples of metric relationships are “the ratio of circumference to diameter equals pi” and “the volume of A is greater than the volume of B.” But we can study not only distances, angles, areas but also the order of space, the topology of space, i.e., the way in which the points of space are placed in relation to one another; an example of a topological relationship is “point A is between points B and C”. A consequence of the principle of relativity of geometry is, for instance, that a plane and a sphere are equivalent with respect to metric. From a topological point of view, a sphere and a plane are not equivalent (in topology, two geometrical objects are equivalent if and only if there is a continuous transformation that assign to every point of the first object a unique point of the second and vice versa; there is not any transformation of this kind between a sphere and a plane). What is the philosophical significance of topology?
Reichenbach examines the following example (The philosophy of space and time). Measurements of space, performed by a two-dimensional being, suggest that he lives on a sphere, but, in spite of such measurements, he believes he lives on a plane. There is not any difficult, when he limits himself to metric relationships: he could adopt appropriate co-ordinative definitions and those measurements would become compatible with a plane. But the surface of a sphere is a finite surface and he might do a round-the-world tour, that is he could walk along a straight line from a point A and eventually he would arrive to the point A itself. Really this is impossible on a plane and he therefore should assert that this last point is not the point A, but a different point B which, in all other respects, is identical to A. Now there are two possibilities: (i) he changes his theory and acknowledges that he lives on a sphere or (ii) he maintains his position, but he needs to explain why point B is identical to A although A and B are different and distant points of space; he could accomplish his task only fabricating a fictitious theory of pre-established harmony: everything that occurs in A, immediately occurs in B.
Reichenbach says the second possibility entails an anomaly in the law of causality. If we assume normal causality, topology become an empirical theory and we can discover the geometry of the real world. This example is another falsification of Kantian theory of synthetic a priori. Kant believed both the Euclidean geometry and the law of causality were a priori. But if Euclidean geometry were an a priori truth, normal causality might be false; if normal causality were an a priori truth, Euclidean geometry might be false. We arbitrarily can choose the geometry or we arbitrarily can choose the causality; but we cannot choose both. Thus the most important implication of the philosophical analysis of topology is that the theory of space depends on normal causality.
Normal causality is the main principle that underlies not only the theory of space but also the theory of time. The solution to the problem of an empirical theory of space was found when we acknowledged the priority of topological relationships over metric relationships. Also in the philosophy of time we must recognize the priority of topology. We must distinguish between two different concepts which are fundamental to the theory of time, namely the order of time and the direction of time. Time order is definable by means of causality (see The philosophy of space and time). The definition is: event A occurs before event B (and, of course, event B occurs after event A) if event A can produce a physical effect on event B. When can event A affect event B? The theory of relativity states that a finite time is required for an effect to go from event A to event B. The required time is finite because the velocity of light is a speed limit for all material particles, messages or effects, and because this velocity is finite. Suppose A and B are two events occurring in point PA and PB. Event A can affect event B if a light pulse emitted from PA when event A occurs reaches the point PB before event B occurs. If the light pulse reaches point PB when event B already occurred, event A cannot affect event B. If event A cannot affect event B and event B cannot affect event A, the order of the two events is indefinite and we could arbitrarily choose the event that occurs first or we might define the two event simultaneous; therefore simultaneity depends on a definition.
Reichenbach examines the consistency of this definition. Suppose an event A occurs before an event B and, from another point of view (reference frame), the event A occurs after the event B. In this circumstance there is a closed causal chain so that the event A produces an effect on the event B and the event B produces an effect on the event A. The definition is consistent only if we assume that there are not closed causal chains: the order of time depends on normal causality.
Reichenbach asserts that the relativity of simultaneity is independent of the relativity of motion. The relativity of simultaneity is due to the finite velocity of causal propagation. So it is a mistake – Reichenbach asserts in The philosophy of space and time and From Copernicus to Einstein – to derive the relativity of simultaneity from the relative motion of observers. Reichenbach also cautions against a possible misunderstanding of the multiplicity of observers in some expositions of the theory of relativity: observers are used only for convenience; the relativity of simultaneity has nothing to do with the relativity of observers. We must recognize – Reichenbach asserts – that the theory of an absolute simultaneity is a consistent theory although it is a wrong one. Absolute simultaneity and absolute time does not exist, but they are clever concepts.
Reichenbach also faces the problem of the direction of time. All mechanical processes are reversible: if f(t) is a solution of the equations of classical mechanics then f(-t) is also an admissible solution; also in the theory of relativity f(-t) is an admissible solution. Thus neither theory gives a consistent definition of the direction of time. In fact the direction of time is definable only by means of irreversible processes, that is, processes that are characterized by an increase of entropy. But the definition is not straightforward. The second law of thermodynamics, which states the principle of increase of entropy, is a statistical law, not a deterministic law. Really the elementary processes of statistical thermodynamics are reversible, because they are controlled by the laws of classical mechanics. In fact all macroscopic processes are theoretically reversible because statistical thermodynamics asserts that, in an isolated system, after an extremely large amount of time, the entropy will diminish to infinitesimally close to the initial value. In an isolated system, in an infinite time, there are as many downgrades as upgrades of the entropy. Thus if we observe two states A and B, and the entropy of B is greater than the entropy of A, we cannot assert that B is later than A. But if we consider not an isolated system, but many isolated systems over relatively short durations compared to the duration required for a return to the same value of entropy, then the probability that we observe a decrease of entropy is less than the probability we observe an increase of entropy. We can therefore use “many-system probabilities” to define a direction of time. Reichenbach asserts that it is possible to define an entropy for the whole universe, and statistical theory proves that the entropy of the universe first increases and then decreases; thus we can define a direction of time, but only for sections of time, not for the whole time. Reichenbach notes that this theory of time was stated in 19th century by Boltzmann (Ludwig Boltzmann, 1844-1906, Austrian physicist who formulated the statistical theory of entropy).
The special theory of relativity gives an unified theory of space and time in the absence of gravitational field. One example of the necessity of an unified theory of space and time is the length contraction, an effect predicted by the theory; this effect shows that the length of a moving rod depends on simultaneity. The special theory of relativity states that the length of a rod measured using a metre that is at rest with respect to the rod is different from the length measured using a metre which is moving with respect to the rod. In the first instance we measure the length of the rod by means of the well-known method used by classical mechanics. But we use a different method when the measuring rod is not at rest with respect to the metre. We measure the length of the moving rod by means of the distance between the two points occupied at a given time by the two ends of the moving rod, ie we mark the simultaneous positions of the two ends and we measure the distance between those positions; thus this method depend on the definition of simultaneity, which also depends on a definition. It must be acknowledged that the length of a moving rod is a matter of definition, but the length contraction is a genuine physical hypothesis confirmed by experiments. We must also recognize the priority of time over space: the ability to measure time is a requisite for the theory of space. Therefore only an unified theory of space and time is suitable. In spite of the necessity for an unified theory of space and time, Reichenbach states (in The philosophy of space and time) that space and time are different concepts which remain distinct in the theory of relativity. The real space is three-dimensional and the real time is one-dimensional: the four-dimensional space-time used in the theory of relativity is a mathematical artefact. Also the mathematical formulation of the special theory of relativity acknowledges the difference between space and time: the equation that defines the metric is dx^2 + dy^2 + dz^2 – dt^2 = ds^2 and the time coordinate is distinguishable from the space coordinates by the negative sign. How can we know the space is three-dimensional? and how can we recognize the difference between a real space and a mathematical space?
A physical effect is not immediately transmitted from one point to another distant point but it passes through every point between the source and the destination. This principle is known as the principle of local action and it denies the existence of action at a distance. In three-dimensional space the principle of local action is true while in a four-dimensional space it is false, so we can recognize that the real space is three-dimensional. We can also distinguish between a mathematical space and the real space because in a mathematical space the principle of local action is false. Reichenbach says that the truth of the principle of local action is an empirical fact, not an a priori truth: it could be false. But if this principle is true then there is only one n-dimensional space in which it is true; this n-dimensional space is the real space and n is the number of the dimensions of space. So we recognize that the real space is three-dimensional while the four-dimensional space used in the theory of relativity is a mathematical space, not a real one. We also recognize that the unified theory of space and time depends on normal causality.
Among the results of the special theory of relativity is time dilation: the period of a moving clock is greater than the period of a clock at rest and therefore the moving clock slows. Time dilation is an empirical hypothesis and Reichenbach says its physical meaning is that a clock does not measure the time coordinate but it measures the interval, ie the space-time distance between two events. In classical mechanics space is Euclidean and Pythagoras’ theorem gives the distance ds between two points: ds^2 = dx^2 + dy^2 + dz^2; x,y,z are the space coordinates. The distance ds is measured by rod. Time is an independent coordinate and is measured by clock. The mathematical formulation of the special theory of relativity uses a four-dimensional space-time known as the Minkowski space (mathematician Hermann Minkowski, b 1864 d 1909, gave a mathematical formulation of Einstein’s special theory of relativity), in which three coordinates are the space coordinates and one coordinate is the time coordinate. The distance ds between two points of Minkowski space is: ds^2 = dx^2 + dy^2 + dz^2 – dt^2; t is the time coordinate and ds (or ds^2) is the interval. A positive (negative) ds^2 is called a spacelike (timelike) interval. Suppose A and B are two events, interval ds^2 is negative and S is an inertial frame of reference moving with constant velocity v so that both events A and B occurs at the origin O of S, and suppose there is a clock in O; the time measured by the clock, called characteristic time, equals the interval ds. When the interval is positive, there is an inertial frame of reference S’ with respect to which the two events are simultaneous; in this instance, the interval ds is realized by a measuring rod with the two ends coinciding with the events A and B and at rest with respect to S’. Time dilation shows an important difference between the special theory of relativity and classical mechanics; the special theory asserts that clocks and rods measure the interval while classical mechanics asserts they measure coordinates.
I briefly mention also Reichenbach’s view on the velocity of light. He asserts that there is no way of measuring the velocity of light and proving it is constant, because the measurement of the velocity of light requires the definition of simultaneity which depends on the speed of light. Einstein – Reichenbach says – does not prove the speed of light is constant, but the special theory of relativity assumes it is constant, ie it is constant by definition.
Newton’s second law of motion states that the acceleration a of a body is proportional to the force F applied, so that F = m * a, where m is the inertial mass which represents the resistance to acceleration (force and acceleration are vectors and I use bold face as indicator of vector). Newton’s law of gravitation asserts that every particle attracts every other particle with a force F proportional to the product of gravitational masses: F = G (m * m’) / r^2; r is the distance between the two particles, m and m’ are the gravitational mass which represent the response to the gravitational force. In classical mechanics, gravitational mass and inertial mass are equivalent; this principle of equivalence accounts for the law of free fall which states that the acceleration of every falling body is the same. The principle of equivalence is one of the principle of the general theory of relativity and its consequences are very important.
Suppose a physicist is into a closed elevator and he observers a body attached to a spring; he find the spring is stretched. There are two different although equivalent explanations.
The two explanation are indistinguishable because of the equivalence between gravitational and inertial mass. This thought experiment shows that an accelerated frames of reference can simulate a gravitational field. Now suppose that in another thought experiment the body does not exert any force on the spring. Also in this instance there are two explanations.
The consequence of this second thought experiment is that a gravitational field can be eliminated by means of an accelerated frame of reference. The theory of general relativity states that free falling accelerated frames of reference are inertial systems. Reichenbach says that this hypothesis is not a consequence of the principle of equivalence; it is a genuine physical hypothesis which goes beyond experience. There is an important consequence of this hypothesis. The special theory of relativity is true in inertial frames of reference, so in every inertial system the motion of a light ray is represented by a straight line. But the general theory of relativity states that a free falling frame of reference is an inertial system, so the light moves in a straight line with respect to this frame of reference; with respect to a frame of reference which is at rest on Earth (in this system there is a gravitational field) the light rays are curved. The consequence is that light is curved by gravity. Another consequence of the hypothesis that a free falling frame of reference is an inertial system is the time dilation in the presence of a gravitational field.
The general theory of relativity gives an unified theory of space, time and gravitation; it requires a non-Euclidean four-dimensional geometry, known as Riemannian geometry. Reichenbach explains the main properties of this kind of geometry and the main differences between Euclidean geometry and Riemannian geometry. In Euclidean geometry the distance between two points is given by a simple function of coordinates; also in Minkowski four-dimensional space-time the interval is calculable by means of coordinates. In Euclidean geometry the coordinates have both a metric and topological significance; this is true also in the special theory of relativity. In Riemannian geometry the four coordinates perform a topological function, not a metric one. This means that we cannot calculate the distance between two points by means of coordinates. The metric functions is performed by the metric tensor g; it is a mathematical entity represented by 16 components. The geometry of four-dimensional space-time depends on the metric tensor g; for example, if the components of g are
then the geometry is a Minkowski geometry (ie the geometry of the special theory). Thus the tensor g expresses the geometry. But g is determined by the gravitational field, because the metric tensor also expresses the acceleration of the frame of reference and the effects of an acceleration are equivalent to the effects of a gravitational field. The metric tensor g expresses both the physical geometry and the gravitational field. The consequence is astonishingly: the geometry of the universe is produced by gravitational fields. Therefore the general theory of relativity does not reduce gravitation to geometry; on the contrary, geometry is based on gravitation. The properties of space and time are empirical properties caused by gravitational fields.
Reichenbach asserts (in The philosophy of space and time) that the reality of space and time is an unquestionable result of the epistemological analysis of the theory of relativity. With respect to the problem of reality, space and time are not different from the other physical concepts. But the reality of space and time does not imply the concept of an absolute space and time. Space and time are relational concepts and we can study their properties because of the existence of physical objects, for example, clocks, that realize relationships between space-time entities. Reichenbach also emphasizes the causal theory of space and time: causality is the basis of both philosophical and physical theory of space and time.
The main thesis of Reichenbach’s work on quantum mechanics (Philosophic foundations of quantum mechanics) is that there is not any exhaustive interpretation of quantum mechanics which is free from causal anomalies. A causal anomaly is a violation of the principle of local action; this principle states that the action at a distance does not exist. We have found the principle of local action and causal anomalies in Reichenbach’s philosophy of space and time.
Two main interpretations of quantum mechanics are involved with the wave-particle duality. Wave interpretation states that atomic entities are waves or things that resemble waves; it grew out of the discovery of the wave-like nature of light and it is supported by many experiments, for example the two-slit experiment. In this experiment a beam of electrons is direct towards a screen with two slits and an interference pattern is produced behind the screen, showing that electrons act as waves. The corpuscolar interpretation regards atomic entities as particles; it is supported by a long standing tradition and by the fact that atomic entities show corpuscular properties, for example, mass and momentum. Both wave and corpuscular interpretation entail causal anomalies. For example corpuscular interpretation cannot fully explain the two-slit experiment. An electron acting as a particle goes through only one slit and its behaviour is independent of the existence of another slit in a different point of space. In fact, if one slit is open and the other is close, the interference pattern is not produced: electrons behave as if they were informed whether the other slit is open. But wave interpretation cannot fully explain a slightly different experiment. An electron can be localized by a detector put near a slit and the electron is detected as particle. However for every event in quantum realm there is an interpretation by means of particles or waves but there is not a unique interpretation for all events. Both corpuscular and wave interpretation are not verifiable; they are not matter of experience but they are matter of definition.
There are two models that are free of causal anomalies; they are restricted interpretations, ie they exclude the admissibility of certain statements. One is Bohr-Heisenberg interpretation (Niels Bohr, b 1885 d 1962, Danish physicist winner of Nobel prize in 1922, gave the first account of the quantum theory of atoms; Werner Karl Heisenberg, b 1901 d 1976, German physicist winner of Nobel prize in 1932, formulated matrix mechanics and proved the principle of indeterminacy according to which there is no way of measuring both position and momentum of atomic particles). This interpretation states that speaking about values of not measured physical quantities is meaningless. In the two-slit experiment, when the two slits are open and electrons interfere with themselves, the position of electrons cannot be measured; thus a statement about the position of electrons is meaningless and the particle interpretation is forbidden. There are two main faults – Reichenbach says – in Bohr-Heisenbergh interpretation: (i) Heisenberg indeterminacy principle becomes a meta-statement on the semantics of the language of physics and (ii) it implies the presence of meaningless statements in physics.
The other interpretation depends on three-valued logic, ie a formal system that acknowledges three truth values: true, false and indeterminate.
Reichenbach carefully examines and explains the mathematical formulation of quantum mechanics. It is based on the notion of quantum operator; a quantum operator is a mathematical entity corresponding to a given classical quantity. For example, the quantum operator energy correspond to the energy in classical physics. A quantum operator can only assume discrete values while the corresponding classical quantity assumes continuous values. Note that an operator is not a function; it indicates a set of operation to be performed on a function.
Let U be a classical quantity; U depends on position Q and momentum P, that is U=F[Q,P] (position and momentum are vectors and I use bold face as indicator of vector; I use square brackets to show that a function depends on given quantities). The quantum operator corresponding to U is called Uop and is defined by the following statements.
Let T be the kinetic energy; in classical mechanics, the kinetic energy is given by the ratio of the square of momentum P to twice the mass m, that is T=P^2 / 2m. Quantum operator Top is given by Top=C^2 * (1/2m) * D” (I use symbol D’ to indicate the first partial derivative with respect to position and D” to indicate the second partial derivative with respect to position).
Let H be the mechanical energy, ie the sum of the kinetic energy T and the potential energy V: H=T+V[Q]; therefore Hop=Top+Vop=C^2 * (1/2m) * D” + V[Q]. If F is a given function, the result (indicated by Hop F) of performing the operations described by operator Hop on function F is C^2 * (1/2m) * D” F + V * F.
Let Pop and Qop the quantum operator corresponding to momentum and position. It is easy to verify that for every function F
(H) Pop Qop F – Qop Pop F = C * F
and the equation H is a mathematical formulation of Heisenberg indeterminacy principle. The proof of equation H is straightforward.
Pop Qop F – Qop Pop F =
Pop (Q * F) – Qop (C * D’ F) =
C * (D’ (Q * F) – Q * (D’ F) =
C * (D’ Q * F + Q * D’ F – Q * D’ F) =
C * F
Reichenbach explains the physical meaning of equation H. Equation H proves that the eigenvalues of position and momentum are different. Now suppose a physicist measures both position and momentum of a particle; let Fp be the eigenfunction corresponding to the measured momentum and Fq be the eigenfunction corresponding to the measured position. From the measurement of position: PSI = Fp; from the measurement of momentum: PSI = Fq. Therefore Fp = Fq and the eigenvalues are the same; but the eigenvalues are different. So position and momentum of a particle cannot be simultaneously measured. Reichenbach asserts that Heisenberg indeterminacy principle is not due to the alleged interference an observer exerts on particles (the explanation of indeterminacy principle in terms of an interference is due to Heisenberg). This principle is an objective law of nature, and it can be stated without reference to observers.
After the mathematical formulation of quantum mechanics, Reichenbach states the basic assumption of the different interpretation of quantum mechanics. Corpuscolar interpretation relies on the following definition. If a measurement of U equals Um, then Um is the values of U not only at the time of measurement but also immediately before and immediately after. If a physicist measures the position of an electron and immediately after its momentum, than he know both position and momentum of the electron. In this interpretation atomic particles have both momentum and position, so they are real particles; a physicist can also measure both momentum and position. The knowledge of both position and momentum is unusable because of the difference between the eigenfunctions: if PSI equals the eigenfunction “position” the knowledge of momentum is totally unused while if PSI equals the eigenfunction “momentum” the knowledge of position is totally unused.
Wave interpretation states that the value of a measured quantity exists after the measurement but before the measurement the quantity assumes simultaneously all possible values. The effect of the measurement is the collapse of wave function.
Bohr-Heisenberg interpretation asserts that the value of a physical quantity exists only after the measurement; a statement about this value before the measurement is therefore meaningless.
The interpretation based on three-valued logic states that a statement about a not measured physical quantity can be neither true nor false: it can be indeterminate. The following tables show the properties of logical connectives in the three-valued logic suggested by Reichenbach (symbols used in these tables differ from symbols used by Reichenbach).
negation: cyclic (-) diametrical (?) complete (^))
or (v) and (&)
implication: standard (>) alternative (#) quasi (*)
equivalence: standard (=) alternative ()
Suppose P is the statement “the momentum of the particle is p” and Q is the statement “the position of the particle is q”; then Heisenberg indeterminacy principle is expressed by the following statement: (Pv-P) # –Q. The following table is the truth-table of this sentence.
|P||Q||-P||Pv-P||-Q||–Q||(Pv-P) # –Q|
The truth of (Pv-P) # –Q implies that the situations described in 1st, 3rd, 7th and 9th row of the truth-table are forbidden. Reichenbach explains how the three-valued interpretation hides causal anomalies. Look at the two-slit experiment. Suppose the two slits are open and the interference pattern is produced. Let P(A) be the probability that an electron goes through the first slit; let P(B) be the probability that an electron goes through the second slit; let P(A,C) be the probability that an electron gone through the first slit hits the screen in point C; let P(B,C) be the probability that an electron gone through the second slit hits the screen in point C; let P(C) the probability that an electron hits the screen in point C. Corpuscular interpretation suggests that
In fact P(C) is not given by equation E2: this is the origin of causal anomalies. Equation E2 can be expressed by the following statement: (AvB)#C, where A is “the electron goes through the first slit”, B is “the electron goes through the second slit” and C is E2. We know that (i) if an electron goes through the first slit then it does not go through the second slit and vice versa, ie A # -B and B # -A; (ii) if an electron does not go through a slit then it goes through the other slit, ie -A # B and -B # A. In classical logic, (i) and (ii) imply AvB, ie [(A # -B)&(B # -A)&(-A # B)&(-B # A)] # AvB is true (look at the following table).
|A||B||[((A # -B)||&||(B # -A))||&||((-A # B)||&||(-B # A))]||#||AvB|
|F||F||F T T||T||F T T||F||T F F||F||T F F||T||F|
The truth-table is restricted to one combination of truth-values because in the other combinations the consequence AvB is true and the statement Z # (AvB) is true for all Z. In corpuscular interpretation of two-slit experiment the statement (A # -B)&(B # -A)&(-A # B)&(-B # A) is true; in classical logic the statement [(A # -B)&(B# -A)&(-A # B)&(-B # A)] # AvB is true and thus also AvB is true; therefore E2 is true. But E2 does not give the correct formula for the probability and so there is a causal anomaly. In three-valued logic, (i) and (ii) do not imply AvB; this fact is proved by means of the following table.
|A||B||[((A # -B)||&||(B # -A))||&||((-A # B)||&||(-B # A))]||#||AvB|
|I||I||I T F||T||I T F||T||F T I||T||F T I||F||I|
Thus we cannot assert E2 and there is not any causal anomaly.
A scientific theory is a formal system which requires a physical interpretation by means of co-ordinative definitions. Reichenbach’s philosophical research on the theory of relativity and quantum mechanics implicitly depends on this view. For example, the distinction between mathematical geometry and physical geometry entails the distinction between a purely formal system and a system interpreted by means of definitions. Co-ordinative definitions are true by convention and cannot be verified, but they are not meaningless; in fact scientific theories require them to acquire an empirical significance. The acknowledgement of the existence of meaningful and not verifiable sentences is very important for a right interpretation of the epistemology of logical positivism. The verifiability principle is often regarded as the most important principle of logical positivism; it states that the meaning of a sentence is its method of verification and a sentence which cannot be verified is meaningless. According to this principle, co-ordinative definitions might be meaningless; on the contrary, in Reichenbach opinion, they are not only meaningful but also required by scientific theories. Note that Reichenbach explicit agrees with verifiability principle. In ‘The philosophical significance of the theory of relativity’ (1949) he says that the meaning of a sentence is reducible to its method of verification; he also says that a physicist can fully understand the Michelson’s experiment only if he adopts the verifiability theory of meaning. In the same essay, Reichenbach says that the logic foundation of the theory of relativity is the discovery that many problems are not verifiable; these problems can be solved by means of co-ordinative definitions. Thus co-ordinative definitions are meaningful and not verifiable. So we must acknowledge that Reichenbach agrees with the verifiability principle and, at the same time, asserts that in scientific theories there are meaningful sentences, namely co-ordinative definitions, that are not verifiable. Why these sentences are not meaningless? Because they belong to scientific theories that are verifiable. For example, Reichenbach states that (i) the Euclidean geometry is not verifiable, (ii) the co-ordinative definitions of geometrical entities are not verifiable but (iii) the Euclidean geometry plus the co-ordinative definitions of geometrical entities is verifiable. The theory must be verifiable, the individual statements belonging to the theory can be not verifiable.
In Reichenbach opinion, among the purposes of the philosophy of science is the search for a distinction between empirical and conventional sentences. The separation of empirical from conventional sentences is not only possible but also necessary for a full understanding of scientific theories. Philosophical research on modern science clearly shows that conventional elements are present in scientific knowledge. The description of our world is not uniquely determined by observations, but there is a plurality of equivalent descriptions; for example, we can use different geometry for describing the same space. But conventionalism is in error. For example, conventionalism states that we can always adopt the Euclidean geometry by means of appropriate definitions. But if we adopt a set of definitions so that the geometry on the Earth is Euclidean, it is possible that in another point of the universe the same set of definitions entails a non-Euclidean geometry; so we can discover an objective difference between different points of space. Note that Reichenbach does not state that scientific knowledge can be proved by means of experience. On the contrary, he asserts that scientific theories are based on physical hypotheses which are not a logical consequence of experiments, for example, the general theory of relativity is based on Einstein’s hypothesis that free falling frames of reference are inertial systems; we cannot prove this hypothesis, but we can verify its consequences. Scientific theories cannot be proved, but we can test their forecasts.
Causality plays a central role in Reichenbach’s philosophy of science. Reichenbach uses the theory of causality as a key to provide access to modern physics and understanding of the philosophical significance of both the theory of relativity and quantum mechanics. According to Reichenbach, the causal theory of space and time is the basis for both the theory of relativity and the philosophy of space and time. In the theory of relativity it is always possible to choose a set of co-ordinative definitions satisfying normal causality. Therefore different geometrical systems are not equivalent and they can be divided into two groups, one group satisfying normal causality while the other entails causal anomalies. Only geometrical systems belonging to the first group are admissible. It is the experience that decides whether a given geometry belongs to the first group; thus conventionalism’s view on geometry is wrong. In quantum mechanics there is not any set of co-ordinative definitions which is free from causal anomalies and satisfies classical logic. In fact, a three-valued logic is required to give an interpretation satisfying normal causality.
First of all, we must acknowledge his scientific seriousness and physical-mathematical skill. His deep knowledge of modern physics is unquestionable. Reichenbach’s positive attitude towards scientific knowledge was influenced not only by his teachers but also by his own philosophical views. In his opinion, modern physics is concerned with problems that, until the late 19th century, were regarded as philosophical problems, for example, the nature of space and time, the source of gravitation, the real extent of causality. In 17th and 18th century – Reichenbach says – philosophers were usually interested in science and many of them were also mathematicians and physicists, for example, Descartes and Leibniz; Kant’s epistemology was based on scientific knowledge. But since 18th science became extraneous to philosophy. Nowadays – Reichenbach wrote in 1928 – there is an almost complete separation of philosophy from physical sciences; philosophical researches into epistemology are fruitless, because of this separation. On the other hand, scientists cannot explicitly help the progress of epistemology: they are too much involved in technical researches. There is only one way to overcome this difficulty: philosophers, who are not concerned with technical subjects but deal with genuine philosophical problems, must dedicate themselves to the philosophical analysis of modern physics, so they can clearly express the implicit philosophical content of scientific theories. In fact, modern physics is rich in philosophical consequences: there is more philosophy in Einstein’s work than in many philosophical systems.
Reichenbach’s Main Works, arranged in Chronological Order..
Collected works (in German).
Last updated: May 1, 2005 | Originally published: