The relation between religion and politics continues to be an important theme in political philosophy, despite the emergent consensus (both among political theorists and in practical political contexts, such as the United Nations) on the right to freedom of conscience and on the need for some sort of separation between church and state. One reason for the importance of this topic is that religions often make strong claims on people’s allegiance, and universal religions make these claims on all people, rather than just a particular community. For example, Islam has traditionally held that all people owe obedience to Allah’s will. Thus, it is probably inevitable that religious commitments will sometimes come into conflict with the demands of politics. But religious beliefs and practices also potentially support politics in many ways. The extent and form of this support is as important to political philosophers as is the possibility for conflict. Moreover, there has been a growing interest in minority groups and the political rights and entitlements they are due. One result of this interest is substantial attention given to the particular concerns and needs of minority groups who are distinguished by their religion, as opposed to ethnicity, gender, or wealth.
This article surveys some of the philosophical problems raised by the various ways in which religion and politics may intersect. The first two main sections are devoted to topics that have been important in previous eras, especially the early modern era, although in both sections there is discussion of analogs to these topics that are more pressing for contemporary political thought: (1) establishment of a church or faith versus complete separation of church and state; and (2) toleration versus coercion of religious belief, and current conflicts between religious practice and political authority. The second pair of sections is devoted to problems that, for the most part, have come to the fore of discussion only in recent times: (3) liberal citizenship and its demands on private self-understanding; and (4) the role of religion in public deliberation.
While the topic of establishment has receded in importance at present, it has been central to political thought in the West since at least the days of Constantine. In the wake of the Protestant Reformation, European societies wrestled with determining exactly what roles church and state should play in each other’s sphere, and so the topic of establishment became especially pressing in the early modern era, although there was also substantial discussion in the Middle Ages (Dante, 1995). The term “establishment” can refer to any of several possible arrangements for a religion in a society’s political life. These arrangements include the following:
Note that these options are not mutually exclusive—a state could adopt some or all of these measures. What is central to them is they each involve the conferral of some sort of official status. A weaker form of an established church is what Robert Bellah (1967: 3-4) calls “civil religion,” in which a particular church or religion does not exactly have official status, and yet the state uses religious concepts in an explicitly public way. For an example of civil religion, he points to Abraham Lincoln’s use of Christian imagery of slavery and freedom in justifying the American Civil War.
Contemporary philosophical defenses of outright establishment of a church or faith are few, but a famous defense of establishment was given by T. S. Eliot in the last century (1936, 1967). Trained as a philosopher (he completed, but did not defend, a dissertation at Harvard on the philosophy of F. H. Bradley) and deeply influenced by Aristotle, Eliot believed that democratic societies rejected the influence of an established church at their peril, for in doing so they cut themselves off from the kind of ethical wisdom that can come only from participation in a tradition. As a result, he argued, such a society would degenerate into tyranny and/or social and cultural fragmentation.
Even today, there are strains of conservatism that argue for establishment by emphasizing the benefits that will accrue to the political system or society at large (Scruton, 1980). According to this line of thought, the healthy polis requires a substantial amount of pre- or extra-political social cohesion. More specifically, a certain amount of social cohesion is necessary both to ensure that citizens see themselves as sufficiently connected to each other (so that they will want to cooperate politically), and to ensure that they have a common framework within which they can make coherent collective political decisions. This cohesion in turn is dependent on a substantial amount of cultural homogeneity, especially with respect to adherence to certain values. One way of ensuring this kind of homogeneity is to enact one of the forms of establishment mentioned above, such as displaying religious symbols in political buildings and monuments, or by including references to a particular religion in political ceremonies.
Rather than emphasizing the distinctively political benefits of establishment, a different version of this argument could appeal to the ethical benefits that would accrue to citizens themselves as private individuals. For example, on many understandings of politics, one of the purposes of the polis is to ensure that citizens have the resources necessary for living a choiceworthy, flourishing life. One such resource is a sense of belonging to a common culture that is rooted in a tradition, as opposed to a sense of rootlessness and social fragmentation (Sandel, 1998; MacIntyre, 1984). Thus, in order to ensure that citizens have this sense of cultural cohesion, the state must (or at least may) in some way privilege a religious institution or creed. Of course, a different version of this argument could simply appeal to the truth of a particular religion and to the good of obtaining salvation, but given the persistent intractability of settling such questions, this would be a much more difficult argument to make.
Against these positions, the liberal tradition has generally opposed establishment in all of the aforementioned forms. Contemporary liberals typically appeal to the value of fairness. It is claimed, for example, that the state should remain neutral among religions because it is unfair—especially for a democratic government that is supposed to represent all of the people composing its demos—to intentionally disadvantage (or unequally favor) any group of citizens in their pursuit of the good as they understand it, religious or otherwise (Rawls, 1971). Similarly, liberals often argue that fairness precludes devoting tax revenues to religious groups because doing so amounts to forcing non-believers to subsidize religions that they reject. A different approach for liberals is to appeal directly to the right to practice one’s religion, which is derivable from a more general right to freedom of conscience. If all people have such a right, then it is morally wrong for the state to force them to participate in religious practices and institutions that they would otherwise oppose, such as forcing them to take part in public prayer. It is also wrong, for the same reason, to force people to support financially (via taxation) religious institutions and communities that they would not otherwise wish to support.
In addition, there are liberal consequentialist concerns about establishment, such as the possibility that it will result in or increase the likelihood of religious repression and curtailment of liberty (Audi, 2000: 37-41). While protections and advantages given to one faith may be accompanied by promises to refrain from persecuting adherents of rival faiths, the introduction of political power into religion moves the state closer to interferences which are clearly unjust, and it creates perverse incentives for religious groups to seek more political power in order to get the upper hand over their rivals. From the perspective of many religious people themselves, moreover, there are worries that a political role for their religion may well corrupt their faith community and its mission.
As European and American societies faced the growing plurality of religious beliefs, communities, and institutions in the early modern era, one of the paramount social problems was determining whether and to what extent they should be tolerated. One of the hallmark treatises on this topic remains John Locke’s A Letter Concerning Toleration. A political exile himself at the time of its composition, Locke argues (a) that it is futile to attempt to coerce belief because it does not fall to the will to accept or reject propositions, (b) that it is wrong to restrict religious practice so long as it does not interfere with the rights of others, and (c) that allowing a wide range of religious groups will likely prevent any one of them from becoming so powerful as to threaten the peace. Central to his arguments is a Protestant view of a religious body as a voluntary society composed only of those people who choose to join it, a view that is in sharp contrast to the earlier medieval view of the church as having authority over all people within a particular geographic domain. It is perhaps unsurprising, then, that the limits of Locke’s toleration are coextensive with Protestantism; atheists and Catholics cannot be trusted to take part in society peacefully because the former do not see themselves as bound by divine law and the latter are beholden to a foreign sovereign (the Pope). Still, Locke’s Letter makes an important step forward toward a more tolerant and pluralistic world. In contrast to Locke, Thomas Hobbes sees religion and its divisiveness as a source of political instability, and so he argues that the sovereign has the right to determine which opinions may be publicly espoused and disseminated, a power necessary for maintaining civil peace (see Leviathan xviii, 9).
Like the issue of establishment, the general issue of whether people should be allowed to decide for themselves which religion to believe in has not received much attention in recent times, again because of the wide consensus on the right of all people to liberty of conscience. However, despite this agreement on liberty of belief, modern states nevertheless face challenging questions of toleration and accommodation pertaining to religious practice, and these questions are made more difficult by the fact that they often involve multiple ideals which pull in different directions. Some of these questions concern actions which are inspired by religion and are either obviously or typically unjust. For example, violent fundamentalists feel justified in killing and persecuting infidels—how should society respond to them? While no one seriously defends the right to repress other people, it is less clear to what extent, say, religious speech that calls for such actions should be tolerated in the name of a right to free speech. A similar challenge concerns religious objections to certain medical procedures that are necessary to save a life. For example, Jehovah’s Witnesses believe that their religion precludes their accepting blood transfusions, even to save their lives. While it seems clearly wrong to force someone to undergo even lifesaving treatment if she objects to it (at least with sufficient rationality, which of course is a difficult topic in itself), and it seems equally wrong to deny lifesaving treatment to someone who needs it and is not refusing it, the issue becomes less clear when parents have religious objections to lifesaving treatment for their children. In such a case, there are at least three values that ordinarily demand great respect and latitude: (a) the right to follow one’s own religion, not simply in affirming its tenets but in living the lifestyle it prescribes; (b) the state’s legitimate interest in protecting its citizens (especially vulnerable ones like children) from being harmed; and (c) the right of parents to raise their children as they see fit and in a way that expresses their values.
A second kind of challenge for a society that generally values toleration and accommodation of difference pertains to a religious minority’s actions and commitments which are not themselves unjust, and yet are threatened by the pursuit of other goals on the part of the larger society, or are directly forbidden by law. For example, Quakers and other religious groups are committed to pacifism, and yet many of them live in societies that expect all male citizens to serve in the military or register for the draft. Other groups perform religious rituals that involve the use of illegal substances, such as peyote. Does the right to practice one’s faith exempt one from the requirement to serve in the military or obey one’s country’s drug policies? Is it fair to exempt such people from the burdens other citizens must bear?
Many examples of this second kind of challenge are addressed in the literature on education and schooling. In developed societies (and developing ones, for that matter), a substantial education is necessary for citizens to be able to achieve a decent life for themselves. In addition, many states see education as a process by which children can learn values that the state deems important for active citizenship and/or for social life. However, the pursuit of this latter goal raises certain issues for religious parents. In the famous case of Mozert v. Hawkins, some parents objected for religious reasons to their children being taught from a reading curriculum that presented alternative beliefs and ways of life in a favorable way, and consequently the parents asked that their children be excused from class when that curriculum was being taught. Against the wishes of these parents, some liberals believe that the importance of teaching children to respect the value of gender equality overrides the merit of such objections, even if they appeal directly to the parents’ religious rights (Macedo, 2000).
Similarly, many proposals for educational curricula are aimed at developing a measure of autonomy in children, which often involves having them achieve a certain critical distance from their family background, with its traditions, beliefs, and ways of life (Callan, 1997; Brighouse, 2000). The idea is that only then can children autonomously choose a way of life for themselves, free of undue influence of upbringing and custom. A related argument holds that this critical distance will allow children to develop a sufficient sense of respect for different social groups, a respect that is necessary for the practice of democratic citizenship. However, this critical distance is antithetical to authentic religious commitment, at least on some accounts (see the following section). Also, religious parents typically wish to pass on their faith to their children, and doing so involves cultivating religious devotion through practices and rituals, rather than presenting their faith as just one among many equally good (or true) ones. For such parents, passing on their religious faith is central to good parenting, and in this respect it does not differ from passing on good moral values, for instance. Thus, politically mandated education that is aimed at developing autonomy runs up against the right of some parents to practice their religion and the right to raise their children as they choose. Many, though not all, liberals argue that autonomy is such an important good that its promotion justifies using techniques that make it harder for such parents to pass on their faith—such a result is an unfortunate side-effect of a desirable or necessary policy.
Yet a different source of political conflict for religious students in recent years concerns the teaching of evolution in science classes. Some religious parents of children in public schools see the teaching of evolution as a direct threat to their faith, insofar as it implies the falsity of their biblical-literalist understanding of the origins of life. They argue that it is unfair to expect them to expose their children to teaching that directly challenges their religion (and to fund it with their taxes). Among these parents, some want schools to include discussions of intelligent design and creationism (some who write on this issue see intelligent design and creationism as conceptually distinct positions; others see no significant difference between them), while others would be content if schools skirted the issue altogether, refusing to teach anything at all about the origin of life or the evolution of species. Their opponents see the former proposal as an attempt to introduce an explicitly religious worldview into the classroom, hence one that runs afoul of the separation of church and state. Nor would they be satisfied with ignoring the issue altogether, for evolution is an integral part of the framework of modern biology and a well-established scientific theory.
Conflicts concerning religion and politics arise outside of curricular contexts, as well. For example, in France, a law was recently passed that made it illegal for students to wear clothing and adornments that are explicitly associated with a religion. This law was especially opposed by students whose religion explicitly requires them to wear particular clothing, such as a hijab or a turban. The justification given by the French government was that such a measure was necessary to honor the separation of church and state, and useful for ensuring that the French citizenry is united into a whole, rather than divided by religion. However, it is also possible to see this law as an unwarranted interference of the state in religious practice. If liberty of conscience includes not simply a right to believe what one chooses, but also to give public expression to that belief, then it seems that people should be free to wear clothing consistent with their religious beliefs.
Crucial to this discussion of the effect of public policy on religious groups is an important distinction regarding neutrality. The liberal state is supposed to remain neutral with regard to religion (as well as race, sexual orientation, physical status, age, etc.). However, as Charles Larmore points out in Patterns of Moral Complexity (1987: 42ff), there are different senses of neutrality, and some policies may fare well with respect to one sense and poorly with respect to another. In one sense, neutrality can be understood in terms of a procedure that is justified without appeal to any conception of the human good. In this sense, it is wrong for the state to intend to disadvantage one group of citizens, at least for its own sake and with respect to practices that are not otherwise unjust or politically undesirable. Thus it would be a violation of neutrality in this sense (and therefore wrong) for the state simply to outlaw the worship of Allah. Alternatively, neutrality can be understood in terms of effect. The state abides by this sense of neutrality by not taking actions whose consequences are such that some individuals or groups in society are disadvantaged in their pursuit of the good. For a state committed to neutrality thus understood, even if it were not explicitly intending to disadvantage a particular group, any such disadvantage that may result is a prima facie reason to revoke the policy that causes it. Thus, if the government requires school attendance on a religious group’s holy days, for example, and doing so makes it harder for them to practice their faith, such a requirement counts as a failure of neutrality. The attendance requirement may nevertheless be unavoidable, but as it stands, it is less than optimal. Obviously, this is a more demanding standard, for it requires the state to consider possible consequences—both short term and long term—on a wide range of social groups and then choose from those policies that do not have bad consequences (or the one that has the fewest and least bad). For most, and arguably all, societies, it is a standard that cannot feasibly be met. Consequently, most liberals argue that the state should be neutral in the first sense, but it need not be neutral in the second sense. Thus, if the institutions and practices of a basically just society make it more challenging for some religious people to preserve their ways of life, it is perhaps regrettable, but not unjust, so long as these institutions and practices are justified impartially.
In addition to examining issues of toleration and accommodation on the level of praxis, there has also been much recent work about the extent to which particular political theories themselves are acceptable or unacceptable from religious perspectives. One reason for this emphasis comes from the emergence of the school of thought known as “political liberalism.” In his book of that name, John Rawls (1996) signaled a new way of thinking about liberalism that is captured by the idea of an “overlapping consensus.” An overlapping consensus refers to reasoned agreement on principles of justice by citizens who hold a plurality of mutually exclusive comprehensive doctrines (a term that includes religious beliefs, metaphysical positions, theories of morality and of the good life, etc., and may also include beliefs such as theories of epistemic justification). Rather than requiring citizens to accept any particular comprehensive doctrine of liberalism, a theory of justice should aim at deriving principles that each citizen may reasonably accept from his or her own comprehensive doctrine. Thus, the consensus is on the principles themselves, rather than the justification for those principles, and as such the conception of justice offered is “political” rather than “metaphysical.” This view of liberal justice marked a break with Rawls’s earlier “metaphysical” liberalism as expressed in A Theory of Justice, although debate continues among commentators about just how sharp a break political liberalism is and whether or not it is an improvement over the earlier view. The aim, then, for a political conception of justice is for all reasonable citizens to be able to affirm principles of justice without having to weaken their hold on their own private comprehensive views. However, some writers have argued that this is impossible—even a “thin” political conception of justice places strains on some comprehensive doctrines, and these strains might be acute for religious citizens. One such argument comes from Eomann Callan, in his book Creating Citizens. Callan points to the role played in Rawls’ theory of “the burdens of judgment” (see Rawls, 1996: § 2): fundamentalists will not be able to accept the burdens of judgment in their private lives, because doing so requires them to view rival faiths and other beliefs as having roughly equal epistemic worth. If Rawlsian liberalism requires acceptance of the burdens of judgment, then the overlapping consensus will not include some kinds of religious citizens.
A different way that liberal citizenship might conflict with a religious person’s self-understanding is if the former requires a commitment to a kind of fallibilism while the latter requires (or at least encourages) certitude in one’s religious belief. Richard Rorty has been read as arguing for the need for liberal democratic citizens to privatize their faith (1999) and to hold their beliefs at an “ironic” distance—that is, provisionally, and with a healthy skepticism about the extent to which they decisively capture reality (1989). But this kind of irony is not possible to maintain along with authentic faith, at least as the latter is understood in many religious traditions that emphasize the importance of certitude in one’s belief and totality of one’s commitment to God.
Thus, a religious citizen could feel an acute conflict between her identity qua citizen and qua religious adherent. One way of resolving the conflict is to argue that one aspect of her identity should take priority over the other. Witness the conflict experienced by the protagonist in Sophocles’ Antigone, as she buries her brother in defiance of Creon’s decree; in doing so, she acknowledges that her religious duties supersede her civic duties, at least in that context. For many religious citizens, political authority is subservient to—and perhaps even derived from—divine authority, and therefore they see their religious commitments as taking precedence over their civic ones. On the other hand, civic republicanism has tended to view a person’s civic role as paramount because it has seen participation in politics as partly constitutive of the human good (Dagger, 1997).
In contrast to these approaches, the liberal tradition has tended to refuse to prioritize one aspect of an individual’s identity over any other, holding that it is the individual’s task to determine which is most important or significant to her; this task is often seen as the reason for the importance of personal autonomy (Kymlicka, 2002). But this tendency makes it more challenging for liberals to adjudicate conflicts between religion and politics. One possibility is for the liberal to argue that the demands of justice are prior to the pursuit of the good (which would include religious practice). If so, and if the demands of justice require one to honor duties of citizenship, then one might argue that people should not allow their religious beliefs and practices to restrict or interfere with their roles as citizens. However, not even all liberals accept the claim that justice is prior to the good, nor is it a settled issue in the literature on political obligation that norms of justice can successfully ground universal duties of citizenship (see “The Obligation to Obey Law” and “Political Obligation”).
One recent trend in democratic theory is an emphasis on the need for democratic decisions to emerge from processes that are informed by deliberation on the part of the citizenry, rather than from a mere aggregation of preferences. As a result, there has been much attention devoted to the kinds of reasons that may or may not be appropriate for public deliberation in a pluralistic society. While responses to this issue have made reference to all kinds of beliefs, much of the discussion has centered on religious beliefs. One reason for this emphasis is that, both historically and in contemporary societies, religion has played a central role in political life, and often it has done so for the worse (witness the wars of religion in Europe that came in the wake of the Protestant Reformation, for example). As such, it is a powerful political force, and it strikes many who write about this issue as a source of social instability and repression. Another reason is that, due to the nature of religious belief itself, if any kind of belief is inappropriate for public deliberation, then religious beliefs will be the prime candidate, either because they are irrational, or immune to critique, or unverifiable, etc. In other words, religion provides a useful test case in evaluating theories of public deliberation.
Much of the literature in this area has been prompted by Rawls’ development of his notion of public reason, which he introduced in Political Liberalism and offered (in somewhat revised form) in his essay “The Idea of Public Reason Revisited.” His view is not as clearly expressed as one would wish, and it evolved after the publication of Political Liberalism, but the idea is something like this: when reasonable citizens engage in public deliberation on constitutional essentials, they must do so by offering reasons that do not appeal to any comprehensive doctrine. Since citizens have sharp disagreements on comprehensive doctrines, any law or policy that necessarily depends on such a doctrine could not be reasonably accepted by those who reject the doctrine. A prime example of a justification for a law that is publicly inaccessible in this way is one that is explicitly religious. For example, if the rationale for a law that outlawed working on Sunday was simply that it displeases the Christian God, non-Christians could not reasonably accept it.
Rawls makes important exceptions to this norm of public discourse, and he seems to have gradually softened its requirements somewhat as he developed his views on public reason, but his intention was to ensure that democratic outcomes could be reasonably accepted by all citizens, and even in his theory’s latest manifestations he seemed to view “public” reasons as those which could reasonably be accepted by everyone rather than explicitly drawing on comprehensive views.
A different explanation of “reasons which could be reasonably accepted by everyone” comes from Robert Audi, who argues that the set of such reasons is restricted to secular reasons. Since only secular reasons are publicly accessible in this way, civic virtue requires offering secular reasons and being sufficiently motivated by them to support or oppose the law or policy under debate. Religious reasons are not suitable for public deliberation since they are not shared by the non-religious (or people of differing religions) and people who reject these reasons would justifiably resent being coerced on the basis of them. However, secular reasons can include non-religious comprehensive doctrines, such as particular moral theories or conceptions of the human good, and so Audi’s conception of public deliberation allows some views to play a role that would be excluded by conceptions that restrict all comprehensive doctrines.
Proponents of the idea that the set of suitable reasons for public deliberation does not include certain or all comprehensive doctrines have come to be known as “exclusivists,” and their opponents as “inclusivists.” The latter group sometimes focuses on weaknesses of exclusivism—if exclusivism is false, then inclusivism is true by default. Others try to show that religious justifications can contribute positively to democratic polities; the two most common examples in support of this position are the nineteenth-century abolitionist movement and the twentieth-century civil rights movement, both of which achieved desirable political change in large part by appealing directly to the Christian beliefs prevalent in Great Britain and the United States.
A third inclusivist argument is that it is unfair to hamstring certain groups in their attempts to effect change that they believe is required by justice. Consider the case of abortion, an example Rawls discusses in a famous footnote in Political Liberalism (243-244) and again in “The Idea of Public Reason Revisited” (169). Many—though not all—who defend the pro-life position do so by appealing to the actual or potential personhood of fetuses. But “person” is a conceptually “thick” metaphysical concept, and as such it is one that is subject to reasonable disagreement. Consequently, on some versions of exclusivism, citizens who wish to argue against abortion should do so without claiming that fetuses are persons. But for these citizens, personhood is the most important part of the abortion issue, for the ascription of “person” is not simply a metaphysical issue—it is a moral issue, as well, insofar as it is an attempt to discern the bounds of the moral community. To ask them to refrain from focusing on this aspect of the issue looks like an attempt to settle the issue by default, then. Instead, inclusivists argue that citizens should feel free to introduce any considerations whatsoever that they think are relevant to the topic under public discussion.
Although secularism is proceeding rapidly in many of the world’s societies, and although this trend seems connected in some way to the process of economic development, nevertheless religion continues to be an important political phenomenon throughout the world, for multiple reasons. Even the most secularized countries (Sweden is typically cited as a prime example) include substantial numbers of people who still identify themselves as religious. Moreover, many of these societies are currently experiencing immigration from groups who are more religious than native-born populations and who follow religions that are alien to the host countries’ cultural heritage. These people are often given substantial democratic rights, sometimes including formal citizenship. And the confrontation between radical Islam and the West shows few signs of abating anytime soon. Consequently, the problems discussed above will likely continue to be important ones for political philosophers in the foreseeable future.
Saint Joseph’s College of Maine
Last updated: February 20, 2009 | Originally published: