Philosophy of religion is the philosophical study of the meaning and nature of religion. It includes the analyses of religious concepts, beliefs, terms, arguments, and practices of religious adherents. The scope of much of the work done in philosophy of religion has been limited to the various theistic religions. More recent work often involves a broader, more global approach, taking into consideration both theistic and non-theistic religious traditions. The range of those engaged in the field of philosophy of religion is broad and diverse and includes philosophers from the analytic and continental traditions, Eastern and Western thinkers, religious believers and agnostics, skeptics and atheists. Philosophy of religion draws on all of the major areas of philosophy as well as other relevant fields, including theology, history, sociology, psychology, and the natural sciences.
There are a number of themes that fall under the domain of philosophy of religion as it is commonly practiced in academic departments in North America and Europe. The focus here will be limited to six: (1) religious language and belief, (2) religious diversity, (3) concepts of God / Ultimate Reality, (4) arguments for and against the existence of God, (5) problems of evil and suffering, and (6) miracles.
The practice of philosophy, especially in the analytic tradition, places emphasis on precision of terms and clarity of concepts and ideas. Religious language is often vague, imprecise, and couched in mystery. In the twentieth century this linguistic imprecision was challenged by philosophers who used a principle of verifiability to reject as meaningless all non-empirical claims. For these logical positivists, only the tautologies of mathematics and logic, along with statements containing empirical observations or inferences, were taken to be meaningful. Many religious statements, including those about God, are neither tautological nor empirically verifiable. So a number of religious claims, such as “Yahweh is compassionate” or “Atman is Brahman,” were considered by the positivists to be cognitively meaningless. When logical positivism became prominent mid-century, philosophy of religion as a discipline became suspect.
By the latter half of the twentieth century, however, many philosophers came to the conclusion that the positivists’ radical empiricist claims and verificationist criteria of meaning were problematic or self-refuting. This development, along with other factors including the philosophical insights on the nature and meaning of language offered by Ludwig Wittgenstein (1889–1951) and the rise of a pragmatic version of naturalism offered by W. V. O. Quine (1908–2000), caused logical positivism to wane. By the 1970s verificationism virtually collapsed, and philosophical views that had been suppressed, including those having to do with religion and religious language, were once again fair game for philosophical discourse. With the work of certain analytic philosophers of religion, including Basil Mitchell (1917–2011), H. H. Farmer (1892–1981), Alvin Plantinga (1932–), Richard Swinburne (1934–), and John Hick (1922–), religious language and concepts were revived and soon became accepted arenas of viable philosophical and religious discourse and debate.
After the collapse of positivism, two streams emerged in philosophy of religion regarding what religious language and beliefs are about: realism and non-realism. The vast majority of religious adherents are religious realists. Realists, as used in this context, are those who hold that their religious beliefs are about what actually exists, independent of the persons who hold those beliefs. Assertions about Allah or Brahman, angels or demons, resurrection or reincarnation, for example, are true because, in part, there are actual referents for the words “Allah,” “Brahaman,” and so forth. The implication is that statements about them can and do provide correct predications of the behavior of Allah and Brahman and so forth. If Allah or Brahman do not actually exist, assertions about them would be false. Non-realists are those who hold that religious claims are not about realities that transcend human language, concepts, and social forms; religious claims are not about realities “out there”; they are not about objectively existing entities. Religion is a human construct and religious language refers to human behavior and experience.
An important figure who had much influence on the development of religious non-realism was Ludwig Wittgenstein. In his later works, Wittgenstein understood language to be not a fixed structure directly corresponding to the way things actually are, but rather a human activity susceptible to the vicissitudes of human life and practice. Language does not provide a picture of reality, he argued, but rather presents a set of activities which he dubbed “language games.” In learning language, one needs to be able to respond to words in various contexts; speech and action work together. In many cases, then, the meaning of a word is its use in the language. For Wittgenstein, this is true in all forms of discourse, including religious discourse. In speaking of God or other religious terms or concepts, their meanings have more to do with their use than with their denotation. The language games of the religions reflect the practices and forms of life of the various religious adherents; religious statements should not be taken as providing literal descriptions of a reality that somehow lies beyond those activities.
Some non-realists have been highly critical of religion, such as Sigmund Freud (1856–1939). Others, such as Don Cupitt (1934–), have sought to transform religion. Cupitt, a philosopher, theologian, and former priest in the Church of England, rejects historic religious dogma for, he maintains, it encompasses an outdated realist metaphysics and cosmology. He also abandons the notion of objective and eternal truth and replaces it with truth as a human improvisation. His approach to religion is to translate dogma and doctrine into a spirituality of practice where they become guiding myths to live by in this life, and they lead the believer to give up belief in a supernatural afterlife beyond the grave.
Non-realists have noted the alleged failure of realism to provide evidences or justifications for the truths of any particular religion, or of religion in general, and argue that projects in natural theology—the attempt to demonstrate the existence of God from evidence found in the natural world—are abject failures. Another point made by non-realists is that, since religious claims and practices are always done within a particular human context, and since the mind structures all perception within that context, the meanings of these claims are determined and limited by that context. To affirm a transcendent realm is to go beyond these contexts and structures.
Various responses to these claims have been offered by religious realists. Regarding the claim that there is no rational justification for religious beliefs, some realists agree. Nevertheless, these fideists claim that religion does not require evidence and justification; religion is about faith and trust, not evidence. Other realists, sometimes referred to as evidentialists, disagree and claim that while faith is fundamental to religion, or at least to some religions, there are in fact good arguments and evidences for religious truth claims. Yet another group of realists are commonly referred to as “Reformed epistemologists” (the term “Reformed” refers to the Christian, Calvinist Reformation theological tradition). Three of its leading proponents are Alvin Plantinga (1932–), Nicholas Wolterstorff (1932–), and William Alston (1921–). Reformed epistemology is non-evidentialist as it asserts that evidence (in the sense that evidentialists use the term) is not required in order for one’s faith to be justified. Unlike fideism, though, its adherents maintain that belief in God can be a rational endeavor despite a lack of evidence. This is contrary to the evidentialist approach in which it is irrational to believe a claim without evidence. It is also unlike evidentialism in that its adherents are generally opposed to classical foundationalism—the view that all justified beliefs must either be properly basic or derivative of properly basic beliefs.
Regarding the claim that religious statements, concepts, and beliefs exist only within a given social context, some realists have responded by noting that, while much of what occurs in religious discourse and practice is of human origin, one need not affirm a reductionist stance in which all religious meanings and symbols are reducible to human constructs.
In the West, most work done in philosophy of religion historically has been theistic. More recently, there has been a growing interest in religions and religious themes beyond the scope of theism. While awareness of religious diversity is not a new phenomenon, philosophers of religion from both the East and the West are becoming increasingly more aware of and interactive with religious others. It is now common to see contributions in Western philosophy of religion literature on various traditions, including Hinduism, Buddhism, Daoism, Confucianism, and African religions.
While interest in Eastern religion and comparative religion have brought about a deeper understanding of and appreciation for the different non-theistic religious traditions, it has also brought to the fore an awareness of the many ways the different traditions conflict. Consider some examples: for Buddhists there is no creator God, whereas Muslims affirm that the universe was created by the one true God, Allah; for Advaita Vedanta Hindus, the concept of Ultimate Reality is pantheistic monism in which only Brahman exists, whereas Christians affirm theistic dualism in which God exists as distinct from human beings and the other created entities; for Muslims and Christians, salvation is the ultimate goal whereby human beings are united with God forever in the afterlife, while the Buddhists’ ultimate goal is nirvana—an extinguishing of the individual self and complete extinction of all suffering. Many other examples could be cited as well. For the realist, at least, not all of these claims can be true. How is one to respond to this diversity of fundamental beliefs?
One response to religious diversity is to deny or minimize the doctrinal conflicts and to maintain that doctrine itself is not as important for religion as religious experience and that the great religious traditions are equally authentic responses to Ultimate Reality. This is one form of religious pluralism. Its most ardent defender has been John Hick. Utilizing Immanuel Kant’s (1724–1804) distinctions of noumena (things as they are in themselves) and phenomena (things as they are experienced), Hick argues that a person’s experiences, religious and non-religious, depend on the interpretive frameworks and concepts through which one’s mind structures and comprehends them. While some people experience and comprehend Ultimate Reality in personal, theistic categories (as Allah or Yahweh, to mention two), others do so in impersonal, pantheistic ways (as nirguna Brahman, for example). Yet others experience and comprehend Ultimate Reality as non-personal and non-pantheistic (as Nirvana or the Tao). We do not know which view is ultimately correct (if any of them are, and for Hick Ultimate Reality is far beyond human conceptions) since we do not have a “God’s eye” perspective by which to make such an assessment. One common illustration of the pluralist position of experiencing God is the Hindu parable of the blind men and the elephant. In this parable, God is like an elephant surrounded by several blind men. One man felt the elephant’s tail and believed it to be a rope. Another felt his trunk and believed it to be a snake. Another felt his leg and believed it to be a tree. Yet another felt his side and believed it to be a wall. Each of them experience the same elephant but in very different ways from the others. In our experiences and understandings of Ultimate Reality, we are very much like the blind men, argue such religious pluralists, for our beliefs and viewpoints are constricted by our enculturated concepts.
Hick argues for what he calls the “pluralistic hypothesis”: that Ultimate Reality is ineffable and beyond our understanding but that its presence can be experienced through various spiritual practices and linguistic systems offered within the religions. The great world religions, then, constitute very different but equally valid ways of conceiving, experiencing, and responding to Ultimate Reality. He uses different analogies to describe his hypothesis, including an ambiguous picture of a duck-rabbit. A culture that has ducks but no familiarity with rabbits would see the ambiguous diagram as a duck. People in this culture would not even be aware of the ambiguity. So too with the culture that has rabbits but no familiarity with ducks. People in this culture would see the diagram as a rabbit. Hick’s point is that the ineffable is experienced in the different traditions as Vishnu, or as Allah, or as Yahweh, or as the Tao, and so on, depending on one’s individual and cultural concepts.
One objection to pluralism of this sort is that it leads to a dilemma, neither horn of which pluralists will want to affirm. On the one hand, if we do not have concepts that are in fact referring to Ultimate Reality as it is in itself, then we have landed in religious skepticism. On the other hand, if we do have concepts that describe actual properties of Ultimate Reality, then we are not epistemically blind after all, and therefore we could, theoretically at least, be in a position to make evaluations about different claims that are made about Ultimate Reality from the various religious traditions.
Another version of religious pluralism attempts to avoid some of the difficulties of the pluralistic hypothesis. For the aspectual pluralist, there is an objective Ultimate Reality which can be knowable to us. Unlike the pluralistic hypothesis, and in very non-Kantian fashion, valid descriptions of the noumenal are possible. Peter Byrne argues that each of the different major religious traditions reflects some aspect of the transcendent. Byrne uses the notion of natural kinds in order to clarify his view. Just as the natural kind gold has an unobservable essence as well as observable properties or qualities—being yellow, lustrous, and hard—so too Ultimate Reality has an essence with different experienced manifestations. Ultimate Reality manifests different aspects of itself in the different religions given their own unique conceptual schemes and practices.
One challenge to this form of pluralism is that, since each of the religions is capturing only an aspect of the transcendent, it seems that one would obtain a better understanding of its essence by creating a new syncretistic religion in order to glean a more comprehensive understanding of Ultimate Reality. Also, since religious adherents are only glimpsing the transcendent through properties which are themselves enculturated within the various traditions, descriptions of Ultimate Reality cannot offer adequate knowledge claims about it. So one is left with at least a mitigated form of religious skepticism.
A second way of responding to the conflicting claims of the different traditions is to remain committed to the truth of one set of religious teachings while at the same time agreeing with some of the central concerns raised by pluralism. Religious relativism provides such a response. For religious relativism, as articulated by Joseph Runzo, the correctness of a religion is relative to the worldview of its community of adherents. On this view, each of the religious traditions are comprised of various experiences and mutually incompatible truth claims, and the traditions are themselves rooted in distinct worldviews that are incompatible with, if not contradictory to, the other worldviews. Runzo maintains that these differing experiences and traditions emerge from the plurality of phenomenal realities experienced by the adherents of the traditions. On this relativistic view, one’s worldview—that is, one’s total cognitive web of interrelated concepts and beliefs—determines how one comprehends and experiences Ultimate Reality. Furthermore, there are incompatible yet adequate truth claims that correspond to the various worldviews, and the veracity of a religion is determined by its adequacy to appropriately correspond to the worldview within which it is subsumed. An important difference between the religious relativist and the pluralist is that, for the relativist and not the pluralist, truth itself is understood to be relative.
Relativism may offer a more coherent account of religious conflict than pluralism, but it can be argued that it falls short of the actual beliefs of religious adherents. For most religious adherents, their beliefs are generally understood to be true in an objective sense. This leads to the third, and most commonly held, response to conflicting religious claims.
In contrast to pluralism and relativism is a third response to the conflicting truth claims of the religions: exclusivism. The term is used in different ways in religious discourse, but a common element is that the central tenets of one religion are true, and claims which are incompatible with those tenets are false. Another common and related element is that salvation is found exclusively in one religion. Regarding the truth claim, for example, for a Muslim exclusivist, Allah is the one true God who literally spoke to the prophet Muhammad in space and time. Since that is true, then the Advaita Vedantan claim that Brahman (God) is nirguna—without attributes—must be false, for these two understandings of Ultimate Reality contradict one another. The same is the case for all religious exclusivists; since they take their religious claims to be objectively true, the contrary claims of other religions are false. This does not mean that exclusivists are not self-critical of their own beliefs, nor does it rule out the practice of dialoguing with or learning from religious others. But it does mean that religious differences are real and that there are intractable disagreements among religious traditions. Religious exclusivism (of which Alvin Plantinga is one prominent example) has been the most widely held position among the adherents of the major world religions.
Various responses have been made to exclusivism, including moral objections (such as that the exclusivist is arrogant, dishonest, oppressive) and intellectual and epistemic objections (including claims that the exclusivist holds unjustified or irrational beliefs).
A major theme among philosophers of religion in the West has been that of God, including questions about the nature and existence of God, challenges to the existence of God, language about God, and so on. Within every major religion is a belief about a transcendent reality underlying the natural, physical world. From its beginnings, philosophy of religion has been concerned with reflecting on, as far as possible, how religions might understand Ultimate Reality. How the various religions conceptualize that reality differs, especially between Eastern and Western religions. In Western religion, primarily the three religions of Abrahamic descent—Judaism, Christianity, and Islam—Ultimate Reality is conceived of and described in terms of a personal God who is creator and sustainer of all and perfect in every respect. Many other properties are commonly attributed to God as well, including omniscience, omnipotence, and immutability.
In much of Eastern religion, including Buddhism, Taoism, and the Advaita Vedanta school of Hinduism, Ultimate Reality is understood quite differently. It is not a personal creator God, but an absolute state of being. It cannot be described by a set of attributes, such as omniscience or omnipotence, for it is undifferentiated Absolute Reality. Taoists refer to it as the Tao; Hindus refer to it as Brahman; for Buddhists, the name varies and includes Shunyata and Nirvana. These different conceptions of Ultimate Reality bring with them distinct understandings of other significant issues as well, such as salvation/liberation, life after death, and evil and suffering, among others.
There is a recent view of Ultimate Reality articulated by philosopher of religion John Schellenberg that he has dubbed “ultimism,” which is neither theistic nor pantheistic. According to this view, the best one can do from a religious perspective is to have faith that there exists a metaphysically and axiologically ultimate reality and that from this reality an ultimate good can be attained.
It is generally the case that religious adherents do not hold their religious convictions because of well-articulated reasons or arguments which support those convictions. However, reasons and arguments are sometimes used by believers to defend and advance their positions. Arguments for the existence of God have been utilized in natural theology and theistic apologetics for at least two millennia. Three which have been prominent historically and still receive special attention in contemporary philosophy of religion discussions are the ontological, cosmological, and teleological arguments.
First developed by Saint Anselm of Canterbury (1033–1109), ontological arguments take various forms. They are unique among traditional arguments for God’s existence in that they are a priori arguments, for they are based on premises that can allegedly be known independently of experience of the world. All of them begin with the concept of God and conclude that God must exist. If successful, ontological arguments prove that God’s non-existence is impossible.
Anselm argues that God is a being than which none greater can be conceived. It is one thing to exist in the mind (in the understanding) and another to exist outside the understanding (outside one’s thoughts; in reality). He then asks which is greater: to exist in the mind or in reality. His argument concludes this way:
Therefore, if that, than which nothing greater can be conceived, exists in the understanding alone, the very being, than which nothing greater can be conceived, is one, than which a greater can be conceived. But obviously this is impossible. Hence, there is no doubt that there exists a being, than which nothing greater can be conceived, and it exists both in the understanding and in reality. (Proslogion, chapter II, 54)
Since it would be a contradiction to affirm that the greatest possible being does not exist in reality but only in the mind (because existing in reality is greater than existing in the mind), one is logically drawn to the conclusion that God must exist.
There have been many objections to this argument. One of the most well-known is based on the analogy of the greatest possible island and was developed by Anselm’s fellow monk, Gaunilo. Utilizing a reductio ad absurdum, he argued that if we affirm Anselm’s conclusion, we must also affirm that the greatest possible island exists. Since that conclusion is absurd, so too is Anselm’s. Another important objection offered by Immanuel Kant was that existence is not a real predicate. Since existence does not add to the concept of a thing, and in Anselm’s argument existence is treated as a real predicate (rather than, say, as a quantifier), the argument is flawed.
Recent modal versions of the argument have been construed that avoid the objections to Anselm’s original formulation. Alvin Plantinga, for example, has devised a version of the ontological argument utilizing the semantics of modal logic: possibility, necessity, and possible worlds (a possible world being a world that is logically possible). Defining a maximally excellent being as one that is omniscient, omnipotent, and morally perfect in every possible world, his argument can be stated this way:
(1) It is possible that a being exists which is maximally great (a being that we can call God).
(2) So there is a possible world in which a maximally great being exists.
(3) A maximally great being is necessarily maximally excellent in every possible world (by definition).
(4) Since a maximally great being is necessarily maximally excellent in every possible world, that being is necessarily maximally excellent in the actual world.
(5) Therefore, a maximally great being (for example, God) exists in the actual world.
Plantinga does not affirm that the argument provides conclusive proof that God exists, but he does claim that there is nothing irrational in accepting it.
Many objections have been raised against Plantinga’s modal ontological argument, including problems with possible worlds semantics, that God’s existence is a logical or metaphysical impossibility, and that it leads to metaphysical absurdities. Regarding the latter, Michael Martin (1932–), offers the following reductio:
(1’) It is possible that a special fairy exists.
(2’) So there is a possible world in which a special fairy exists.
(3’) A special fairy is necessarily a tiny woodland creature with magical powers in
every possible world (by definition).
(4’) Since a special fairy is necessarily a tiny woodland creature with magical powers
in every possible world, that fairy is necessarily a tiny woodland creature with
magical powers in the actual world.
(5’) Therefore, a special fairy exists in the actual world.
Martin then argues that premise (1’) is no more contrary to reason than premise (1), so if we affirm (1) and conclude that (5), we must also affirm (1’) and conclude that (5’). Given this argument structure, we could also conclude that ghosts, gremlins, and countless other mythical creatures exist as well, which is absurd.
Cosmological arguments begin by examining some empirical or metaphysical fact of the universe, from which it then follows that something outside the universe must have caused it to exist. There are different types of cosmological arguments, and its defenders include some of the most prominent thinkers spanning the history of philosophy, including Plato, Aristotle, ibn Sina, al-Ghazali, Maimonides, Aquinas, Descartes, and Leibniz. Three versions of the argument that have received much attention are the Thomistic contingency argument, the Leibnizian sufficient reason argument, and the kalam argument.
With the Thomistic contingency argument, named after the medieval Christian theologian/philosopher Thomas Aquinas (1225–1274), the claim is made that contingent things exist in the world—“contingent things” ostensibly referring to those entities which begin to exist and cease to exist and whose existence is dependent on another. It is next argued that not all things can be contingent, for if they were there would be nothing to ground their existence. Only a necessary thing (or being) can account for the existence of contingent things—“necessary thing” ostensibly referring to a thing which never began to exist and which cannot cease to exist and whose existence does not depend on another. This necessary thing (or being) is God.
Another type of cosmological argument is the Leibnizian sufficient reason argument, so named after the German thinker Gottfried Wilhelm Leibniz (1646–1716). With this argument, an answer is sought to the question “Why is there something rather than nothing?” For Leibniz, there must be an explanation, or “sufficient reason,” for anything that exists, and the explanation for whatever exists must lie either in the necessity of its own nature or in a cause external to itself. The argument concludes that the explanation of the universe must lie in a transcendent God since the universe does not have within its own nature the necessity of existence and God does.
Some recent versions of the cosmological argument grant that contingent things exist due to the causal events of other contingent things, but they then go on to inquire why the universe should exist at all when conceivably this could have not been the case. Utilizing elements of both Aquinas’s and Leibniz’s arguments, the central point of these recent versions is that with respect to anything that exists, there is a reason for its existence. What provides a sufficient reason for the existence of the universe? It cannot be another contingent thing (and on into infinity), for to explain the existence of any contingent thing by another contingent thing lacks a sufficient reason why any contingent thing exists. Timothy O’Connor argues this way:
If our universe truly is contingent, the obtaining of certain fundamental facts or other will be unexplained within empirical theory, whatever the topological structure of contingent reality. An infinite regress of beings in or outside the spatiotemporal universe cannot forestall such a result. If there is to be an ultimate, or complete, explanation, it will have to ground in some way the most fundamental, contingent facts of the universe in a necessary being, something which has the reason for its existence within its own nature. It bears emphasis that such an unconditional explanation need not in any way compete with conditional, empirical explanations. Indeed, it is natural to suppose that empirical explanations will be subsumed within the larger structure of the complete explanation. (Theism and Ultimate Explanation: The Necessary Shape of Contingency. Oxford, Blackwell, 2008, 76)
An objection raised against both the Thomistic- and the Leibnizian-type arguments is that they are demanding explanations which are unwarranted. If for every individual contingent thing in the universe there is an explanation, why does the whole need a further explanation? Furthermore, an explanation must at some point come to an end—a brute fact. So why not end with the universe? Why posit some further transcendent reality?
Another form of cosmological argument is commonly referred to as the kalam argument (the term “kalam” is from medieval Islamic theology and came to mean “speculative theology”). The argument is structured by William Lane Craig, its most ardent proponent in recent times, as follows:
beginning no beginning
caused not caused
personal not personal
The dilemmas are obvious. Either the universe had a beginning or it did not. If it did, either that beginning was caused or it was not caused. If it was caused, either the cause was personal or it was impersonal. Based on these dilemmas, the argument can be put in the following logical form:
This version of the cosmological argument was bolstered by work in astrophysics and cosmology in the late twentieth century. On one interpretation of the standard Big Bang cosmological model, the time-space universe sprang into existence ex nihilo approximately 13.7 billion years ago. Such a beginning is best explained, argue kalam defenders, by a non-temporal, non-spatial, personal, transcendent cause—namely God.
The claim that the universe began to exist is also argued philosophically in at least two ways. First, it is argued that an actual infinite set of events cannot exist, for actual infinities lead to metaphysical absurdities. Since an infinite temporal regress of events is an actual infinite set of events, such a regress is metaphysically impossible. So the past cannot be infinite; the universe must have had a temporal beginning. A second approach begins by arguing that an infinite series of events cannot be formed by successive addition (one member being added to another). The reason why is that, when adding finite numbers one after the other, the set of numbers will always be finite. The addition of yet another finite number, ad infinitum, will never lead to an actual infinite. Since the past is a series of temporal events formed by successive addition, the past could not be actually infinite in duration. Nor will the future be so. The universe must have had a beginning.
Many objections have been raised against the kalam argument, both scientific and philosophical, including that there are other cosmological models of the universe besides the Big Bang in which the universe is understood to be eternal, such as various multi-verse theories. Philosophical rebuttals marshaled against the kalam argument include the utilization of set theory and mathematical systems which employ actual infinite sets.
Teleological arguments in the East go back as far as 100 C.E., where the Nyāya school in India argued for the existence of a deity based on the order found in nature. In the West, Plato, Aristotle, and the Stoics offered arguments for a directing intelligence of the world given the order found within it. There is an assortment of teleological arguments, but a common theme among them is the claim that certain characteristics of the natural world reflect design, purpose, and intelligence. These features of the natural world are then used as evidence for an intelligent, intentional designer of the world.
The teleological argument has been articulated and defended at various times and places throughout history, but its zenith was in the early nineteenth century with perhaps its most ardent defender: William Paley (1743–1805). In his book, Natural Theology, Paley offers an argument from analogy: since we infer a designer of an artifact such as a watch, given its evident purpose, ordered structure, and complexity, so too we should infer a grand designer of the works of nature, since they are even greater in terms of their evident purpose, order, and complexity—what he describes as “means ordered to ends.” Paley’s argument can be structured this way:
A number of objections have been raised against Paley’s version of the design argument. Those offered by David Hume (1711–1776) in his Dialogues Concerning Natural Religion are often taken to be archetype refutations of traditional design arguments. Among them are that the analogy between the works of nature and human artifacts is not particularly strong; that even if we could infer a grand designer of the universe, this designer turns out to be something less than the God of the theistic religions (especially given the great amount of evil in the world); and that just because a universe has the appearance of design, it does not follow that it is in fact designed; such an event could have occurred through natural, chance events.
A more recent version of the design argument is based on the apparent fine-tuning of the cosmos. Fine-tuning arguments, whose current leading defender is Robin Collins, include the claims that the laws of nature, the constants of physics, and the initial conditions of the universe are finely tuned for conscious life. Often cited as evidence are several dozen “cosmic constants” whose parameters are such that if they were altered even slightly, conscious life would be impossible. Consider the following three: (1) If the strong nuclear force (the force that binds protons and neutrons in an atom) had been either stronger or weaker by five percent, life would be impossible; (2) If neutrons were not roughly 1.001 times the mass of protons, all protons would have decayed into neutrons, or vice versa, and life would be impossible; (3) If gravity had been stronger or weaker by one part in 1040, life-sustaining stars, including the sun, could not exist; thus life would most likely be impossible. While each of the individual calculations of such constants may not be fully accurate, it is argued that the significant number of them, coupled with their independence from one other, provides evidence of their being intentionally established with conscious life in mind.
Objections to fine-tuning arguments are multifarious. According to an anthropic principle objection, if the laws of nature and physical constants would have varied to any significant degree, there would be no conscious observers such as ourselves. Given that such observers do exist, it should not be surprising that the laws and constants are just as they are. One way of accounting for such observers is the many-worlds hypothesis. In this view, there exist a large number of universes, perhaps an infinite number of them. Most of these universes include life-prohibiting parameters, but at least a minimal number of them would probably include life-permitting ones. It should not be surprising that one of them, ours, for example, is life-permitting. Much of the current fine-tuning discussion turns on the plausibility of the many-worlds hypothesis and the anthropic principle.
There are other versions of the teleological argument that have also been proposed which focus not on fundamental parameters of the cosmos but on different aspects of living organisms—including their emergence, alleged irreducibly complex systems within living organisms, information intrinsic within DNA, and the rise of consciousness—in an attempt to demonstrate intelligent, intentional qualities in the world. These biological and noölogical design arguments have not generally received as much attention as the fine-tuning argument by those engaged in natural theology or by the broader philosophical community.
Other arguments for the existence of God (or theism) include the moral argument, the argument from mind, the argument from religion experience, and Pascal’s wager. One common objection to the traditional arguments for God’s existence is that even if they are successful, they do not prove the existence of the deity of any particular religion. If successful, the cosmological argument only provides evidence for a transcendent first cause of the universe, nothing more; at best, the teleological argument provides evidence for a purposive, rational designer of the universe, nothing more; and so on. These conclusions are very different from the God (or gods) depicted in the Qur’an, or the Bible, or the Vedas.
Natural theologians maintain, however, that the central aim of these arguments is not to offer full-blown proofs of any particular deity, but rather to provide evidence or warrant for belief in a grand designer, or creator, or moral lawgiver. Some natural theologians argue that it is best to combine the various arguments in order to provide a cumulative case for a broad form of theism. Cosmological arguments provide insight into God’s creative providence; teleological arguments provide insight into God’s purposive nature and grand intelligence; and moral arguments provide insight into God’s moral nature and character. Taken together, these natural theologians argue, the classical arguments offer a picture of a deity not unlike the God of the theistic religious traditions and even if this approach does not prove the existence of any particular deity, it does nonetheless lend support to theism over naturalism (which, as used here, is the view that natural entities have only natural causes, and that the world is fully describable by the physical sciences).
Along with arguments for the existence of God, there are also a number of reasons one might have for denying the existence of God. One reason is that a person just does not find the arguments for God’s existence to be sufficiently compelling. If the burden is on the theist to provide highly convincing evidences or reasons that would warrant his or her believing that God exists, in the absence of such evidences and reasons disbelief is justified. Another reason one might have for not believing that God exists is that science conflicts with theistic beliefs and, given the great success of the scientific enterprise, it should have the last word on the matter. Since science has regularly rebuffed religious claims in the past, we should expect the claims of religion to eventually become extinct. A third possible reason for denying the existence of God is that the very concept of God is incoherent. And a fourth reason one might have is that the existence of God conflicts with various features of the natural world, such as evil, pain, and suffering.
Over the last several hundred years there has been tremendous growth in scientific understanding of the world in such fields as biology, astronomy, physics, and geology. These advances have had considerable influence on religious belief. When religious texts, such as the Bible, have been in conflict with science, the latter has generally been the winner in the debate; religious beliefs have commonly given way to the power of the scientific method. For example, the three-tiered universe held by the biblical authors, with heaven above the sky, hell below the earth, and the sun moving around the earth (and with the sun stopping its rotation during battle at Joshua’s command), is no longer plausible given what we now know. It has seemed to some that modern science will be able to explain all of the fundamental questions of life with no remainder.
Given the advances of science and the retreat of religious beliefs, many in the latter half of the twentieth century agreed with the general Freudian view that a new era was on the horizon in which the infantile illusions, or perhaps delusions, of religion would soon go the way of the ancient Greek and Roman gods. With the onset of the twenty-first century, however, a new narrative has emerged. Religion has not fallen into oblivion, as many anticipated; in fact, religious belief is on the rise. Many factors account for this, including challenges to psychological and sociological theories which hold belief in God to be pathological or neurotic. In recent decades these theories have themselves been challenged by medical and psychological research, being understood by many to be theories designed primarily to destroy belief in God. Another important factor is the increase in the number of believing and outspoken scientists, such as Francis Collins, the director of the human genome project.
At the other end of the spectrum regarding religion, however, is a fairly small but vocal band of intellectual atheists who have spawned a movement dubbed the “New Atheism.” These atheists, whose leading voices include Richard Dawkins, Christopher Hitchens, Sam Harris, and Daniel Dennett, attempt to demonstrate that respect for belief in God is irrational and socially unacceptable. But despite this orchestrated opposition arguing the falsity and incoherence of theism, it has proved rather resilient. Indeed, the twenty-first century is reflecting a renewed interest in philosophical theism.
Philosophical challenges to theism have also included the claim that the very concept of God makes no sense—that the attributes ascribed to God are logically incoherent (either individually or collectively). There are first-rate philosophers today who argue that theism is coherent and others of equal stature who argue that theism is incoherent. Much of the criticism of the concept of theism has focused on God as understood in Judaism, Christianity, and Islam, but it is also relevant to the theistic elements found within Mahayana Buddhism, Hinduism, Confucianism, and certain forms of African and Native American religions. The question of whether theism is coherent is an important one, for if there is reason to believe that theism is incoherent, theistic belief is in an important sense undermined.
The logical consistency of each of the divine attributes of classical theism has been challenged by both adherents and non-adherents of theism. Consider the divine attribute of omniscience. If God knows what you will freely do tomorrow, then it is the case now that you will indeed do that tomorrow. But how can you be free not to do that thing tomorrow if it is true now that you will in fact freely do that thing tomorrow? There is a vast array of replies to this puzzle, but some philosophers conclude that omniscience is incompatible with future free action and that, since there is future free action, God—if God exists—is not omniscient.
Another objection to the coherence of theism has to do with the divine attribute of omnipotence and is referred to as the stone paradox. An omnipotent being, as traditionally understood, is a being who can bring about anything. So, an omnipotent being could create a stone that was too heavy for such a being to lift. But if he could not lift the stone, he would not be omnipotent, and if he could not make such a stone, he would not be omnipotent. Hence, no such being exists. A number of replies have been offered to this puzzle, but some philosophers conclude that the notion of omnipotence as traditionally defined is incoherent and must be redefined if the concept of God is to remain a plausible one.
Arguments for the incoherence of theism have been offered for each of the divine attributes. While there have been many challenges to the classical attributes of God, there are also contemporary philosophers and theologians who have defended each of them as traditionally understood. There is much lively discussion currently underway by those defending both the classical and neo-classical views of God. But not all theistic philosophers and theologians have believed that the truths of religious beliefs can be or even should be demonstrated or rationally justified. As mentioned above, fideists, such as Søren Kierkegaard (1813–1855), maintain that religious faith does not need rational justification or the support of rational arguments. For fideists, attempting to prove one’s religious faith may even be an indication of a lack of faith.
Perhaps the most compelling and noteworthy argument against theism is what is referred to as the problem of evil. Philosophers of the East and the West have long recognized that difficulties arise for one who affirms both the existence of an omnipotent and omnibenevolent God and the reality of evil. David Hume, quoting the ancient Greek thinker Epicurus (341–270 B.C.E.), got to the heart of the matter with the following pithy observation:
Is he [God] willing to prevent evil, but not able? then he is impotent. Is he able, but not willing? then he is malevolent. Is he both able and willing? whence then is evil? (Hume’s Dialogues Concerning Natural Religion, Part X, 63)
There are different ways the problem of evil can be formulated. In fact, it is probably more accurate to refer to “problems” of evil. One formulation is construed as a logical problem. For the logical problem of evil, it is asserted that the two claims, (1) an omnipotent and omnibenevolent God exists, and (2) evil exists, are logically incompatible. Since evil ostensibly exists, the argument goes, God (understood traditionally as being omnipotent and omnibenevolent) must not exist.
In the latter half of the twentieth century, the logical argument held sway. But by the end of that century, it was widely acknowledged by philosophers of religion that the logical problem had been rebutted. One reason is that as claims (1) and (2) are not explicitly contradictory, there must be hidden premises or unstated assumptions which make them so. But what might those be? The assumed premises/assumptions appear to be something along these lines: (a) an omnipotent God could create any world, (b) an omnibenevolent God would prefer a world without evil over a world with evil, and (c) God would create the world he prefers. Given these claims, (1) and (2) would be logically incompatible. However, it turns out that at least (a) may not be true, even on a classical theistic account. It could be that a world with free agents is more valuable than a world with no free agents. Further, it could be that such free agents cannot be caused or determined to do only what is morally right and good, even by God. If this is so, in order for God to create agents who are capable of moral good, God had to create agents who are capable of moral evil as well. If this is a logical possibility, and it seems to be so, then premise (a) is not a necessary truth because God cannot create just any world.
In addition, premise (b) is not necessarily true either. For all we know, God could use evil to achieve some good end, such as bringing about the virtues of compassion and mercy. As long as (a) and (b) are possibly false, the conclusion of the argument is no longer necessarily true, so it loses its deductive force. This response to the logical argument from evil is called a defense, which is distinguished from a theodicy. The aim of a defense is to demonstrate that the arguments from evil are unsuccessful given a possible scenario or set of scenarios, whereas a theodicy is an attempt to justify God and the ways of God given the evil and suffering in the world. Both defenses and theodicies have been used by theists in responding to the various problems of evil.
Evidential arguments attempt to demonstrate that the existence of evil in the world counts as inductive evidence against the claim that God exists. One form of the evidential argument from evil is based on the assumption, often agreed on by theists and atheists alike, that an omnipotent, omniscient, omnibenevolent being would prevent the existence of significant amounts of gratuitous evil. Since significant amounts of gratuitous evil seem to exist, God probably does not. One influential approach, espoused by William Rowe (1931), contends that many evils, such as the slow and agonizing death of a fawn burned in a forest fire ignited by lightning, appear to be gratuitous. However, an omnipotent and omniscient being could have prevented them from occurring, and an omnibenevolent being would have not allowed any significant pointless evils to occur if they could have been avoided. So, the argument concludes, it is more reasonable to disbelieve that God exists.
One way of responding to such arguments is to attempt to demonstrate that there is, after all, a point to each of the seemingly gratuitous evils. A solid case for even some examples would lower the probability of the evidential argument, and one could maintain that normal epistemic limitations restrict knowledge in many other examples. The theistic traditions historically have, in fact, affirmed the inscrutability of God and the ways of God. It is from within this context that Stephen Wykstra developed a response to the evidential argument, a response that is referred to as “skeptical theism” (not to be taken as being skeptical about theism). The central point of skeptical theism is that because of human cognitive limitations we are unable to judge as improbable the claim that there are various goods secured by God’s allowing the evils in the world.
Rowe has provided responses to skeptical theism, one of which is that on this view one could never have any reason for doubting God’s existence given evil, no matter how horrific the evil turns out to be. The skeptical theist has created a chasm between human and divine knowledge far beyond what theism has traditionally affirmed.
Another version of the evidential argument has been advanced by Paul Draper. He argues that the world as it is, with its distribution of pains and pleasures, is more likely given what he calls a “hypothesis of indifference” than given theism. On this hypothesis, the existence of sentient beings (including their nature and their place) is neither the result of a benevolent nor a malevolent nonhuman person. Contrast this with the theistic account in which, since God is morally perfect, there must be morally good reasons for allowing biologically useless pain, and there must be morally good reasons for producing pleasures even if such pleasures are not biologically useful. But given our observations of the pains and pleasures experienced by sentient creatures, including their biologically gratuitous experiences (such as those brought about by biological evolution), the hypothesis of indifference provides a more reasonable account than theism.
In response, Peter van Inwagen (1942) maintains that this argument can be countered by contending that for all we know, in every possible world which exhibits a high degree of complexity (such as ours with sentient, intelligent life) the laws of nature are the same or have the same general features as the actual laws. We cannot assume, then, that the distribution of pain and pleasure (including the pains and pleasures reflected in biological evolution) in a world with a high degree of complexity such as ours would be any different given theism. We are simply not epistemically capable of accurately assigning a probability either way, so we cannot make the judgment that theism is less likely than the hypothesis of indifference.
When assessing arguments of this sort, some important questions for consideration are these: What is the claim probable or improbable with respect to? And what is the relevant background information with respect to the claim? The plausibility of the claim “God’s existence is improbable with respect to the evil in the world” considered alone may well be very different from the plausibility of the claim “God’s existence is improbable with respect to the evil in the world” when considered in conjunction with, say, one or more of the arguments for God’s existence. Furthermore, the theist can offer other hypotheses which may raise the probability of evil given God’s existence. For example, the major theistic traditions affirm the belief that God’s purposes are not restricted to this earthly life but extend on into an afterlife as well. In this case, there is further opportunity for God to bring moral good out of the many kinds and varieties of evil in this life. Thus the full scope of the considerations and evidences for and against theism may well raise the probability of God’s existence above that of taking into account only a part. Nevertheless, the evidential problem of evil remains a central argument type against the plausibility of theism.
A theodicy, unlike a defense, takes on the burden of attempting to vindicate God by providing a plausible explanation for evil. The theodical approach often takes the following general form: God, an omnipotent and omnibenevolent being, will prevent/eliminate evil unless there is a good reason or set of reasons for not doing so. There is evil in the world. Therefore God must have a good reason or set of reasons for not preventing/eliminating evil. There are various attempts to demonstrate what that good reason is, or those good reasons are. Two important theodicies are those that appeal to the significance and value of free will, and those that appeal to the significance and value of acquiring virtuous traits of character in the midst of suffering.
The first fully developed theodicy was crafted by Augustine in the fifth century of the common era. For Augustine, God is perfect in goodness, and the universe, God’s creation, is also good and exists for a good purpose. Since all creation is intrinsically good, evil must not represent the positive existence of any substantial thing. Evil, then, turns out to be a metaphysical privation, a privatio boni (privation of goodness), or the going wrong of something that is inherently good.
Both moral and natural evil, for Augustine, entered the universe through the wrongful use of free will. Since all creatures, both angels and humans, are finite and mutable, they have the capacity to choose evil, which they have done. Thus, while God created everything in the world good, including angels and humans, through the use of their wills these free agents have ushered into the world that which is contrary to the good. Much of what is good has become corrupted, and this corruption stems from these free creatures, not from God. The Augustinian theodicy concludes with the culmination of history entailing cosmic justice. For God will, in the eschaton (the end of time), usher all who repent into the eternal bliss of heaven and castigate to hell all those who, through their free will, have rejected God’s gift of salvation.
One objection to Augustine’s theodicy is that a number of evils are brought about by natural events, such as disease and natural disasters, including earthquakes and tsunamis. These evils do not seem to occur because of the free choices of moral creatures. The free will theodicy, then, is ineffectual as a solution to arguments from evil that include natural events such as these. C. S. Lewis, Alvin Plantinga, and others have proposed that supernatural beings may ultimately be responsible for evils of this kind, but most theodicists are skeptical of such a notion.
Another objection to this theodicy is that it was crafted in a pre-scientific culture and thus is devoid of an evolutionary view of the development of flora and fauna, including such elements as predation and species annihilation. The narrative of an originally perfect creation through which evil entered by the choices of free agents is now generally considered to be mistaken and unhelpful.
The soul-making (or person-making) theodicy was developed by John Hick, utilizing ideas from the early Christian thinker and bishop Irenaeus (c.130–c.202 C.E.). According to this theodicy, as advanced by Hick, God created the world as a good place, but no paradise, for developing morally and spiritually mature beings. Through evolutionary means, God is bringing about such individuals who have the freedom of will and the capacity to mature in love and goodness. Individuals placed in this challenging environment of our world, one in which there is epistemic distance between God and human persons, have the opportunity to choose, through their own free responses, what is right and good and thus develop into the mature persons that God desires them to be—exhibiting the virtues of patience, courage, generosity, and so on.
Evil, then, is the result of both the creation of a soul-making environment and of the human choices to act against what is right and good. While there is much evil in the world, nevertheless the trajectory of the world is toward the good, and God will continue to work with human (and perhaps other) persons, even in the afterlife if necessary, such that in the eschaton everyone will finally be brought to a place of moral and spiritual maturity.
One objection to the soul-making theodicy is that there are many evils in the world that seem to have nothing to do with character development. Gratuitous evils appear to be in abundance. Furthermore, there is no empirical support for the claim that the world is structured for soul making. Many persons appear to make no moral progress after much suffering; in fact, some persons seem to be worse off by the end of their earthly life.
In reply, it can be argued that apparently pointless evils are not always, in fact, without purpose and merit. The compassion that is evoked from such seemingly indiscriminate and unfair miseries, for example, is a great good, and one which may not arise without the miseries appearing as unfair and indiscriminate. While God did not intend or need any particular evils for soul-making purposes, God did arguably need to create an environment where such evils were a possibility. Thus, while each individual instance of evil may not be justified by a particular greater good, the existence of a world where evil is possible is necessary for a world where soul making can occur. Furthermore, with this theodicy a positive doctrine of life after death is central, for there are cases in which difficulties in an individual’s life breed bitterness, anger, and even a reduction of virtuous character. So in these instances, at least, the soul-making process would need to continue on in the afterlife.
The free will and soul-making theodicies share a common supposition that God would not permit evil which is not necessary for a greater good. But many theists maintain that some evils are not justified, that some horrors are so damaging that there are no goods which outweigh them. But if there are such evils, the question can be raised why God would allow them. It may be that standard theism, theism unaccompanied by other religious claims, is inadequate to provide a response. In fact, some have argued that an adequate reply requires an expanded theism which incorporates other particular religious claims.
One such approach has been offered by Marilyn McCord Adams (1943–). Utilizing the resources of her own religious tradition, Adams pushes theodicy beyond a general theism to an expanded Christian theism utilizing a Christocentric theological framework. She focuses on the worst sorts of evils, which she calls “horrendous evils.” These are evils which, when experienced by a particular person, give that person reason to doubt whether her life could, considered in totality, be taken to be a great good to her. Adams argues that the Christian theodicist should abandon the widely held assumption that responses to evil can only include those goods that both theists and atheists acknowledge. She maintains that goods of this sort are finite and temporal, whereas the Christian has infinite and eternal goods at her disposal. An intimate, loving, eternal relationship with God, for example, may well be a good that is infinite and incomparable with any other kind of good. She further argues that taking a “general reasons-why” approach to theodicy in which some general reason is provided to cover all forms of evil does not seem to be the kind of help we need. As a Christian philosopher, she believes a more adequate response can be provided which involves the coexistence of God and the evils in the world. Rather than focusing on the possible reasons why God might allow evils of this sort, she maintains that it is enough to show how God can be good and yet permit their existence.
Adams argues that there is good reason for the Christian to believe that all evils will ultimately be defeated in one’s life and that God will ultimately engulf all personal horrors through integrating participation in the evils into one’s life with God. Given this integration, she argues, all human beings, even those who have experienced the most horrific evils on earth, will in the eschaton be redeemed and thus find ultimate meaning and goodness in their lives. Such a view does, of course, presuppose one particular religious tradition and one interpretation of that tradition.
Another recent approach to the problem of evil has been offered by Eleonore Stump. She considers the problem to be not an intellectual one attempting to solve a logical puzzle, but rather a deeply personal one involving interpersonal relations, the central relations of which are between God and God’s creatures. She treats the problem of evil as centrally a problem of suffering and utilizes an account of second-person experiences and second-person biblical narratives to make her case.
Stump suggests a possible world, one grounded in the worldview of Thomas Aquinas, in which love is central. The proper object of love is God, which, on Aquinas’s doctrine of divine simplicity, is identical to God’s goodness. This goodness is also within human beings, and so a proper object of love includes love of other human beings (as well as oneself). Fallen human beings prefer pleasure and power over the greater goods, and as such human beings are not properly internally integrated around the ultimate and proper good. One must be redeemed in order to have proper internal integration.
Using the biblical story of Job, Stump sees several levels of second-person accounts, including God’s interactions with Job and a dialogue between God and Satan. Job, she suggests, received what he needed: an assurance of God’s goodness. But the way Job received this assurance, the way he knows that his suffering is under the providence of a good and loving God, occurs through a second-person experience that is difficult to explain to one who did not have the same experience. What we have in these accounts, then, are second-person stories relating God’s personal interaction with his creatures. What we learn from such biblical stories is that God will produce goods from one’s suffering for the one suffering—goods which would otherwise have not been produced.
One objection to Stump’s defense is that, in many cases, suffering seems to produce no growth or goods in the individual who is suffering. In fact, in some cases, suffering seems to predictably diminish the sufferer. Furthermore, much evil and suffering seems to be indiscriminate and gratuitous.
A related problem is that of divine hiddenness. Many people are perplexed and see as problematic that, if God exists, God does not make his existence sufficiently clear and available. The problem, concisely stated, can be put this way. If God exists as the perfect, loving, omnibenevolent being that theists have generally taken God to be, then God would desire the best for his creatures. The best for God’s creatures, at least in the Christian religion and to some extent in all of the Abrahamic traditions, is to be in relationship with God. However, many people, both non-theists and sometimes theists themselves, claim to have no awareness of God. Why would God remain hidden and elusive, especially when individuals would benefit from being aware of God?
John Schellenberg has argued that the hiddenness of God provides evidence that God does not in fact exist. Using a child-parent analogy, an analogy which is often used in the Abrahamic traditions themselves, Schellenberg notes that good parents are present to their children, especially when they are in need. But God is nowhere to be found, whether one is in need or not. So God, at least as traditionally understood, must not exist.
Schellenberg offers several different forms of the argument. One version can be sketched this way. If God does exist, then reasonable nonbelief would not occur, for surely a perfectly loving God would desire that people believe in God. And if God desires that people so believe, God would work it out so that persons would be in a reasonable position to believe. However, reasonable nonbelief does occur. There are persons who do not believe in God, and they are reasonable in doing so. Even after studying the evidence, examining their motives of belief, praying and seeking God, they still do not believe and see no good reason to believe. But a perfectly loving and good God, it seems, would ensure belief in God by all such persons. God would make himself known to them so that they would believe. Since there is reasonable nonbelief, then, we have solid evidence that God, as a perfectly loving, caring being does, not exist. The argument can be stated concisely this way:
Various replies can be made to this argument. While not a common move by theists, one could deny the first premise. Dystheists maintain that God is less (maybe much less) than omnibenevolent. This view of God is certainly not consistent with traditional theism whereby, as Anselm put it, God is “that than which nothing greater can be conceived.”
Another reply is to deny premise two, and several reasons might be offered in support of its denial. First, it may be that those persons who do not believe are, for one reason or another, not ready to believe that God exists, perhaps because of emotional or psychological or other reasons. So God hides out of love and concern for the person. Second, it could be that God’s revealing himself to some people would produce the wrong kind of belief or knowledge of God or could cause one to believe for the wrong reasons, perhaps out of fear or trepidation or an egoistic desire for success. In cases like this, God’s hiding would, again, be due to God’s love and concern for those who are not yet ready to believe.
A third reply is to deny the third premise. Some theists have, in fact, maintained that any nonbelief of God is unreasonable—that every case of nonbelief is one in which the person is epistemically and morally culpable for her nonbelief. That is, while such persons do not believe that God exists, they should so believe. They have the requisite evidence to warrant such belief, yet they deny or suppress it; they are intentionally disbelieving.
For many philosophers of religion, these replies to the issue of divine hiddenness are unsatisfactory. The elusiveness of God continues to be a problem for both theists and non-theists.
Non-theistic religions have also offered accounts of evil, including its nature and existence, specifically with respect to suffering. For Hindus and Buddhists, these considerations are rooted in karma and rebirth. In its popular formulations, rebirth is the view that the conscious self transmigrates from one physical body to the next after death. Each human being has lived former lives, perhaps as another human being or maybe even as another kind of organism. Rebirth is connected to the doctrine of karma. As typically understood within Hinduism and Buddhism, karma literally means “deed” or “action”—what one does. It can also mean one’s intention or motivation for a given action, or what happens to an individual. Its broader meaning, sometimes referred to as the “law of karma,” is a law of moral causation, including the results of one’s actions. Understood this way, it involves causal connections linking what an individual does to what happens to them. It is, in effect, the idea that one reaps the good and bad consequences of her or his actions, either in this life or in another life.
Reincarnation and karma seem to offer a better account of evil and suffering than does theism. For example, it seems exceedingly unfair that one child is born healthy into a wealthy, loving family, whereas another child is born sickly into a poor, cruel environment. If there is a personal, creator God who brought these two persons into the world, God seems to be unloving and unjust. But if the two children are reaping the consequences of actions they performed in previous lives, this seems to provide a justification for the inequalities. The effect of one’s karma determines the circumstances of one’s past, present, and future lives. We reap what we sow.
Various objections have also been raised against karma/rebirth. According to the karmic law of cause and effect, a person’s present life circumstances are explained by her actions in a previous life; and her life circumstances in that life are explained by her life circumstances in a life previous to that one; and so on indefinitely. So the solution hoped for regarding inequalities never seems to come to an end. Furthermore, does it really seem fair that when a person who has lived a long life dies and is reincarnated, she must start all over again as a baby with her maturity, life experiences, wisdom, and memories completely erased?
Another difficulty for the karma/rebirth solution has to do with free will. An initial advantage of this solution to the problem of evil is that real moral agency is preserved. In fact, moral agency is central to the karma/rebirth solution: our moral decisions self-determine our future experiences, making us responsible for our own destiny. Upon further reflection, the view seems to run contrary to free moral agency. Consider the example of a man contemplating the rape and murder of a woman. Suppose he has done so before, and has thus far not been caught. He is considering redirecting his life by turning himself in to the authorities and receiving the consequences of his actions. But just as he is pondering this option, a woman strolls by and his mad passions for rape and murder begin to burn within him. He now has the choice to continue down the path of destruction or put a stop to it. If he decides to attack the woman and does so, then on the karmic account the woman was not completely innocent after all; she is paying the price for her former evil actions. In that case, the rapist is not truly free to act as he does, for he is simply following mechanistically the effects of karmic justice. He is merely the instrumental means for meting out the justice requisite for this woman’s previous moral failings. If, however, the woman does not deserve such moral recompense, then karmic justice will ensure that she does not receive it. In that case, the rapist will be unable to engage in the attack.
The problem that arises has to do with locating the moral freedom in this system. If the rapist is deterministically carrying out justice on his victim, then it seems that he is not truly a free moral agent after all. He is simply a cog in the karmic justice machine. It is disconcerting to affirm a moral system in which we understand raped and murdered victims to be themselves morally culpable for such acts of brutality against them. On the other hand, suppose the rapist really is free to attack the woman. If she was not deserving of such an act, this would be a serious violation of the law of karma whereby suffering occurs only because of one’s previous evil actions. If in attempting to justify such actions, the defender of the karmic system replied that the woman would in a future life receive a reward for such a morally gratuitous act, this does not appear to be consistent with karma, for this would run counter to the central principle of karma in which evil and suffering are the effects of one’s previous deeds.
As with theistic replies to evil, karmic solutions may be helpful at some level, but they nevertheless leave one with less than complete answers to the variety of problems of evil and suffering.
The term “miracle” (Latin mirari, to wonder) is generally used in religious contexts to refer to an unusual event which is not explicable by natural causes alone but rather is the result of divine activity. Theists commonly consider most of the events that occur in the world to be, fundamentally, acts of God. As creator and sustainer of the universe, God is, broadly construed, the ultimate cause of what occurs in the universe. But many theists also affirm that some events involve a direct act of God, such as “miraculous” healings or in the case of Christian theism, the resurrection of Jesus, or in the case of Islam, the production of the Qur’an.
But there is debate among philosophers of religion about what kinds of divine activity should be considered miraculous. David Hume maintained that a miracle is a “violation of the laws of nature.” As such, he raised objections to such a notion. One objection is that it is never reasonable to believe a report that a violation of a law of nature has occurred. The evidence used to support a claim of a miraculous event is the testimony of witnesses. But the establishment of a natural law was based on the uniform experience of many persons over time. So the witness testimony necessary to establish a miracle would need to be greater than that which established the natural law in the first place. Since this never happens, no evidence is sufficient to make probable or establish the occurrence of a violation of a natural law, so it is always unreasonable to believe that such a violation has occurred.
Objections have been raised to Hume’s definition of a miracle. One objection is that miracles are not in fact violations of natural laws. Natural laws are descriptive rather than prescriptive; they describe what will, or likely will, occur or not occur under certain specifiable conditions. In that case, referring to God’s occasional actions in the world as a violation of them would be misrepresentative. If what one means by a violation of the laws of nature is just an exception to usual processes in the natural world, however, this objection is unwarranted.
This leads back to the issue of whether it is ever reasonable to believe that an exception to the usual processes in the natural world has occurred, and also whether it can be established that God has directly acted in the world. Hume does not attempt to demonstrate that miracles are a metaphysical impossibility. His approach is an epistemic one: to show that there is never sufficient evidence to warrant belief in a miracle.
One response to Hume’s claim about the insufficiency of evidence for belief in miracles is that his understanding of probability is inadequate. Determining the probability of an event is a rather complex undertaking, and simply utilizing the frequency of an occurrence to determine its probability, as Hume apparently does, simply will not do. Establishing the a priori probability of a miracle without the background information of, for example, the existence of God, the nature of God, the purposes and plans of God, and so on, is impossible. If one had such knowledge, a particular miracle may turn out to be highly probable.
Recent discussions of miracles by philosophers of religion have often focused on the concept of natural law, probability theory, and the role of religion as evidence for a particular religion or for belief in God.
Philosophy of religion is a flourishing field. Beyond those specific areas described above, there are also a number of important currents emerging, including feminist and continental approaches, renewed interest in medieval philosophy of religion, and an emphasis on the environment, race and ethnicity, and science and faith.
Bethel College (Indiana)
U. S. A.
Last updated: December 17, 2012 | Originally published: