Plato: The Republic
Since the mid-nineteenth century, the Republic has been Plato’s most famous and widely read dialogue. As in most other Platonic dialogues the main character is Socrates. It is generally accepted that the Republic belongs to the dialogues of Plato’s middle period. In Plato’s early dialogues, Socrates refutes the accounts of his interlocutors and the discussion ends with no satisfactory answer to the matter investigated. In the Republic however, we encounter Socrates developing a position on justice and its relation to eudaimonia (happiness). He provides a long and complicated, but unified argument, in defense of the just life and its necessary connection to the happy life.
The dialogue explores two central questions. The first question is “what is justice?” Socrates addresses this question both in terms of political communities and in terms of the individual person or soul. He does this to address the second and driving question of the dialogue: “is the just person happier than the unjust person?” or “what is the relation of justice to happiness?” Given the two central questions of the discussion, Plato’s philosophical concerns in the dialogue are ethical and political. In order to address these two questions, Socrates and his interlocutors construct a just city in speech, the Kallipolis. They do this in order to explain what justice is and then they proceed to illustrate justice by analogy in the human soul. On the way to defending the just life, Socrates considers a tremendous variety of subjects such as several rival theories of justice, competing views of human happiness, education, the nature and importance of philosophy and philosophers, knowledge, the structure of reality, the Forms, the virtues and vices, good and bad souls, good and bad political regimes, the family, the role of women in society, the role of art in society, and even the afterlife. This wide scope of the dialogue presents various interpretative difficulties and has resulted in thousands of scholarly works. In order to attempt to understand the dialogue’s argument as a whole one is required to grapple with these subjects.
Table of Contents
- Synopsis of the Republic
- Ethics or Political Philosophy?
- The Analogy of the City and the Soul
- Plato’s Defense of Justice
- References and Further Reading
- Standard Greek Text
- English Translations
- General Discussions of the Republic
- Discussions on Plato’s Ethics and Political Philosophy
- Discussions on the City/Soul Analogy.
- Discussions of Plato’s Defense of Justice in the Republic
- Discussions of Political Measures Introduced in the Just City
Socrates and Glaucon visit the Piraeus to attend a festival in honor of the Thracian goddess Bendis (327a). They are led to Polemarchus’ house (328b). Socrates speaks to Cephalus about old age, the benefits of being wealthy, and justice (328e-331d). One would not claim that it is just to return weapons one owes to a mad friend (331c), thus justice is not being truthful and returning what one owes as Cephalus claims. The discussion between Socrates and Polemarchus follows (331d-336b).
Polemarchus claims that justice is helping one’s friends and harming one’s enemies and that this is what one owes people (332c). Socrates’ objections to Polemarchus’ definition are as follows: (i) Is this appropriate in medicine or cooking? So in what context is this the case? (332d)? (ii) The just person will also be good at useless things and at being unjust (333e). (iii) We often do not know who our friends and enemies are. Thus, we may treat those whom we only think are our friends or enemies well or badly. Would this be justice? (334c). (iv) It does not seem to be just to treat anyone badly, not even an enemy (335b). Discussion between Socrates and Thrasymachus follows (336b-354c).
Thrasymachus defines justice as the advantage or what is beneficial to the stronger (338c). Justice is different under different political regimes according to the laws, which are made to serve the interests of the strong (the ruling class in each regime, 338e-339a). Socrates requires clarification of the definition: does it mean that justice is what the stronger think is beneficial to them or what is actually beneficial to them (339b)? And don’t the strong rulers make mistakes and sometimes create laws that do not serve their advantage (339c)? Thrasymachus points out that the stronger are really only those who do not make mistakes as to what is to their advantage (340d). Socrates responds with a discussion of art or craft and points out that its aim is to do what is good for its subjects, not what is good for the practitioner (341c). Thrasymachus suggests that some arts, such as that of shepherds, do not do this but rather aim at the advantage of the practitioner (343c). He also adds the claim that injustice is in every way better than justice and that the unjust person who commits injustice undetected is always happier than the just person (343e-344c). The paradigm of the happy unjust person is the tyrant who is able to satisfy all his desires (344a-b). Socrates points out that the shepherd’s concern for his sheep is different from his concern to make money, which is extraneous to the art (345c) and that no power or art provides what is beneficial to itself (346e). Socrates claims that the best rulers are reluctant to rule but do so out of necessity: they do not wish to be ruled by someone inferior (347a-c).
Socrates offers three argument in favor of the just life over the unjust life: (i) the just man is wise and good, and the unjust man is ignorant and bad (349b); (ii) injustice produces internal disharmony which prevents effective actions (351b); (iii) virtue is excellence at a thing’s function and the just person lives a happier life than the unjust person, since he performs the various functions of the human soul well (352d). Socrates is dissatisfied with the discussion since an adequate account of justice is necessary before they can address whether the just life is better than the unjust life (354b).
Glaucon is not persuaded by the arguments in the previous discussion (357a). He divides good things into three classes: things good in themselves, things good both in themselves and for their consequences, and things good only for their consequences (357b-d). Socrates places justice in the class of things good in themselves and for their consequences.
Glaucon renews Thrasymachus’ argument to challenge Socrates to defend justice by itself without any consideration of what comes from it (358b ff.). Glaucon gives a speech defending injustice: (i) justice originates as a compromise between weak people who are afraid that suffering injustice is worse than doing it (358e-359a); (ii) people act justly because this is necessary and unavoidable, so justice is good only for its consequences (story of the ring of Gyges’ ancestor, 359c-360d); (iii) the unjust person with the reputation for justice is happier than the just person with the reputation for injustice (360d-362c).
Adeimantus expands Glaucon’s defense of injustice and attack on justice by asserting: the reputation of justice is better than justice itself, so the unjust person who is able to keep the reputation of being just will be happier than the just person; discussion of various ways that the unjust can acquire the reputation for justice (362d-366d).
Socrates is asked to defend justice for itself, not for the reputation it allows for (367b). He proposes to look for justice in the city first and then to proceed by analogy to find justice in the individual (368c-369a). This approach will allow for a clearer judgment on the question of whether the just person is happier than the unjust person. Socrates begins by discussing the origins of political life and constructs a just city in speech that satisfies only basic human necessities (369b-372c). Socrates argues that humans enter political life since each is not self-sufficient by nature. Each human has certain natural abilities (370a) and doing only the single job one is naturally suited for, is the most efficient way to satisfy the needs of all the citizens (370c). Glaucon objects that Socrates’ city is too simple and calls it “a city of pigs” (372d). Socrates describes a city that allows for luxuries (“a feverish city,” 372e-373e). Socrates points out that the luxurious city will require an army to guard the city (373e). The army will be composed of professional soldiers, the guardians, who, like dogs, must be gentle to fellow citizens and harsh to enemies (375c). The guardians need to be educated very carefully to be able to do their job of protecting the city’s citizens, laws, and customs well (376d). Poetry and stories need to be censored to guarantee such an education (377b). Poetry should: (i) present the gods as good and only as causes of good (379a); (ii) as unchanging in form (380d); (iii) as beings who refrain from lies and deception (381e).
Socrates continues the political measures of the censorship of poetry: (iv) the underworld should not be portrayed as a bad place so that the guardians will not be too afraid of death (386b); (v) the heroes and gods should not be presented lamenting so that the guardians can develop courage (387e); (vi) poetry should prevent people from laughing violently (388e); (vii) poetry should promote the guardian’s sense of truth-telling but with the willingness to lie when this is conducive to the good of the city (389b); (viii) it should promote self-discipline and obedience (389c-d); (ix) it should not include stories that contribute to avarice (390d); (x) it should not include stories that contribute to hubris or impiety (391a). Socrates moves on to discuss the manner in which stories should be told (392d). He divides such manners into simple narration (in third person) and imitative narration (in first person, 392d). To keep the guardians doing only their job, Socrates argues that the guardians may imitate only what is appropriate for this (394e-395d). The just city should allow only modes and rhythms that fit the content of poetry allowed in the just city (398b-399c). Socrates explains how good art can lead to the formation of good character and make people more likely to follow their reason (400e-402c). Socrates turns to the physical education of the guardians and says that it should include physical training that prepares them for war, a careful diet, and habits that contribute to the avoidance of doctors (403c-405b). Physical education should be geared to benefit the soul rather than the body, since the body necessarily benefits when the soul is in a good condition, whereas the soul does not necessarily benefit when the body is in a good condition (410b-c).
Socrates begins to describe how the rulers of the just city are to be selected from the class of the guardians: they need to be older, strong, wise, and wholly unwilling to do anything other than what is advantageous to the city (412b-414b). Socrates suggests that they need to tell the citizens a myth that should be believed by subsequent generations in order for everyone to accept his position in the city (414b-415d). The myth of metals portrays each human as having a precious metal in them: those naturally suited to be rulers have gold, those suited to be guardians have silver, and those suited for farming and the other crafts have bronze.
Socrates proceeds to discuss the living and housing conditions of the guardians: they will not have private property, they will have little privacy, they will receive what they need from the city via taxation of the other classes, and they will live communally and have common messes (415e-416e).
Adeimantus complains that the guardians in the just city will not be very happy (419a). Socrates points out that the aim is to make the whole city, and not any particular class, as happy as possible (420b). Socrates discusses several other measures for the city as a whole in order to accomplish this. There should be neither too much wealth nor too much poverty in the city since these cause social strife (421d-422a). The just city should be only as large in size as would permit it to be unified and stable (423b). Socrates reemphasizes the importance of the guardian’s education and suggests that the guardians will possess wives and children in common (423e). He suggests that they should only allow very limited ways by which innovations may be introduced to education or change in the laws (424b-425e). The just city will follow traditional Greek religious customs (427b).
With the founding of the just city completed, Socrates proceeds to discuss justice (427d). He claims that the city they have founded is completely good and virtuous and thus it is wise, courageous, moderate, and just (427e). Justice will be what remains once they find the other three virtues in it, namely wisdom, courage, and moderation (428a). The wisdom of the just city is found in its rulers and it is the type of knowledge that allows them to rule the city well (428b-d). The courage of the just city is found in its military and it is correct and lawful belief about what to fear and what not to fear (429a-430b). The city’s moderation or self-discipline is its unanimity in following the just city’s structure in terms of who should rule and who should be ruled (430d-432a). The city’s justice consists in each class performing its proper function (433a-b).
Socrates then proceeds to find the corresponding four virtues in the individual (434d). Socrates defends the analogy of the city and the individual (435a-b) and proceeds to distinguish three analogous parts in the soul with their natural functions (436b). By using instances of psychological conflict, he distinguishes the function of the rational part from that of the appetitive part of the soul (439a). Then he distinguishes the function of the spirited part from the functions of the two other parts (439e-440e). The function of the rational part is thinking, that of the spirited part the experience of emotions, and that of the appetitive part the pursuit of bodily desires. Socrates explains the virtues of the individual’s soul and how they correspond to the virtues of the city (441c-442d). Socrates points out that one is just when each of the three parts of the soul performs its function (442d). Justice is a natural balance of the soul’s parts and injustice is an imbalance of the parts of the soul (444e). Socrates is now ready to answer the question of whether justice is more profitable than injustice that goes unpunished (444e-445a). To do so he will need to examine the various unjust political regimes and the corresponding unjust individuals in each (445c-e).
Socrates is about to embark on a discussion of the unjust political regimes and the corresponding unjust individuals when he is interrupted by Adeimantus and Polemarchus (449a-b). They insist that he needs to address the comment he made earlier that the guardians will possess the women and the children of the city in common (449b-d). Socrates reluctantly agrees (450a-451b) and begins with the suggestion that the guardian women should perform the same job as the male guardians (451c-d). Some may follow convention and object that women should be given different jobs because they differ from men by nature (453a-c). Socrates responds by indicating that the natural differences between men and women are not relevant when it comes to the jobs of protecting and ruling the city. Both sexes are naturally suited for these tasks (454d-e). Socrates goes on to argue that the measure of allowing the women to perform the same tasks as the men in this way is not only feasible but also best. This is the case since the most suited people for the job will be performing it (456c).
Socrates also proposes that there should be no separate families among the members of the guardian class: the guardians will possess all the women and children in common (457c-d). Socrates proceeds to discuss how this measure is for the best and Glaucon allows him to skip discussing its feasibility (458a-c). The best guardian men are to have sex with the best guardian women to produce offspring of a similar nature (458d-459d). Socrates describes the system of eugenics in more detail. In order to guarantee that the best guardian men have sex with the best guardian women, the city will have marriage festivals supported by a rigged lottery system (459e-460a). The best guardian men will also be allowed to have sex with as many women as they desire in order to increase the likelihood of giving birth to children with similar natures (460a-b). Once born, the children will be taken away to a rearing pen to be taken care of by nurses and the parents will not be allowed to know who their own children are (460c-d). This is so that the parents think of all the children as their own. Socrates recognizes that this system will result in members of the same family having intercourse with each other (461c-e).
Socrates proceeds to argue that these arrangements will ensure that unity spreads throughout the city (462a-465d). Responding to Adeimantus’ earlier complaint that the guardians would not be happy, Socrates indicates that the guardians will be happy with their way of life; they will have their needs satisfied and will receive sufficient honor from the city (465d-e). Thereafter, Socrates discusses how the guardians will conduct war (466e).
Glaucon interrupts him and demands an account explaining how such a just city can come into being (471c-e). Socrates admits that this is the most difficult criticism to address (472a). Then he explains that the theoretical model of the just city they constructed remains valid for discussing justice and injustice even if they cannot prove that such a city can come to exist (472b-473b). Socrates claims that the model of the just city cannot come into being until philosophers rule as kings or kings become philosophers (473c-d). He also points out that this is the only possible route by which to reach complete happiness in both public and private life (473e). Socrates indicates that they to, discuss philosophy and philosophers to justify these claims (474b-c). Philosophers love and pursue all of wisdom (475b-c) and they especially love the sight of truth (475e). Philosophers are the only ones who recognize and find pleasure in what is behind the multiplicity of appearances, namely the single Form (476a-b). Socrates distinguishes between those who know the single Forms that are and those who have opinions (476d). Those who have opinions do not know, since opinions have becoming and changing appearances as their object, whereas knowledge implies that the objects thereof are stable (476e-477e).
Socrates goes on to explain why philosophers should rule the city. They should do so since they are better able to know the truth and since they have the relevant practical knowledge by which to rule. The philosopher’s natural abilities and virtues prove that they have what is necessary to rule well: they love what is rather than what becomes (485a-b), they hate falsehood (485c), they are moderate (485d-e), they are courageous (486a-b), they are quick learners (486c), they have a good memory (486c-d), they like proportion since the truth is like it, and they have a pleasant nature (486d-487a).
Adeimantus objects that actual philosophers are either useless or bad people (487a-d). Socrates responds with the analogy of the ship of state to show that philosophers are falsely blamed for their uselessness (487e-489a). Like a doctor who does not beg patients to heal them, the philosopher should not plead with people to rule them (489b-c). To the accusation that philosophers are bad, Socrates responds that those with the philosopher’s natural abilities and with outstanding natures often get corrupted by a bad education and become outstandingly bad (491b-e). Thus, someone can only be a philosopher in the true sense if he receives the proper kind of education. After a discussion of the sophists as bad teachers (492a-493c), Socrates warns against various people who falsely claim to be philosophers (495b-c). Since current political regimes lead to either the corruption or the destruction of the philosopher, he should avoid politics and lead a quiet private life (496c-d).
Socrates then addresses the question of how philosophy can come to play an important role in existing cities (497e). Those with philosophical natures need to practice philosophy all their lives, especially when they are older (498a-c). The only way to make sure that philosophy is properly appreciated and does not meet hostility is to wipe an existing city clean and begin it anew (501a). Socrates concludes that the just city and the measures proposed are both for the best and not impossible to bring about (502c).
Socrates proceeds to discuss the education of philosopher kings (502c-d). The most important thing philosophers should study is the Form of the Good (505a). Socrates considers several candidates for what the Good is, such as pleasure and knowledge and he rejects them (505b-d). He points out that we choose everything with a view to the good (505e). Socrates attempts to explain what the Form of the Good is through the analogy of the sun (507c-509d). As the sun illuminates objects so the eye can see them, the Form of the Good renders the objects of knowledge knowable to the human soul. As the sun provides things with their ability to be, to grow, and with nourishment, the Form of the Good provides the objects of knowledge with their being even though it itself is higher than being (509b).
Socrates offers the analogy of the divided line to explain the Form of the Good even further (509d-511d). He divides a line into two unequal sections once and then into two unequal sections again. The lowest two parts represent the visible realm and the top two parts the intelligible realm. In the first of the four sections of the line, Socrates places images/shadows, in the second section visible objects, in the third section truths arrived at via hypotheses as mathematicians do, and in the last section the Forms themselves. Corresponding to each of these, there is a capacity of the human soul: imagination, belief, thought, and understanding. The line also represents degrees of clarity and opacity as the lowest sections are more opaque and the higher sections clearer.
Socrates continues his discussion of the philosopher and the Forms with a third analogy, the analogy of the cave (514a-517c). This represents the philosopher’s education from ignorance to knowledge of the Forms. True education is the turning around of the soul from shadows and visible objects to true understanding of the Forms (518c-d). Philosophers who accomplish this understanding will be reluctant to do anything other than contemplate the Forms but they must be forced to return to the cave (the city) and rule it.
Socrates proceeds to outline the structure of the philosopher king’s education so that they can reach an understanding of the Forms (521d). Those who eventually become philosopher kings will initially be educated like the other guardians in poetry, music, and physical education (521d-e). Then they will receive education in mathematics: arithmetic and number (522c), plane geometry (526c), and solid geometry (528b). Following these, they will study astronomy (528e), and harmonics (530d). Then they will study dialectic which will lead them to understand the Forms and the Form of the Good (532a). Socrates gives a partial explanation of the nature of dialectic and leaves Glaucon with no clear explanation of its nature or how it may lead to understanding (532a-535a). Then they discuss who will receive this course of education and how long they are to study these subjects (535a-540b). The ones receiving this type of education need to exhibit the natural abilities suited to a philosopher discussed earlier. After the training in dialectic the education system will include fifteen years of practical political training (539e-540c) to prepare philosopher kings for ruling the city. Socrates concludes by suggesting that the easiest way to bring the just city into being would be to expel everyone over the age of ten out of an existing city (540e-541b).
Socrates picks up the argument that was interrupted in Book V. Glaucon remembers that Socrates was about to describe the four types of unjust regime along with their corresponding unjust individuals (543c-544b). Socrates announces that he will begin discussing the regimes and individual that deviate the least from the just city and individual and proceed to discuss the ones that deviate the most (545b-c). The cause of change in regime is lack of unity in the rulers (545d). Assuming that the just city could come into being, Socrates indicates that it would eventually change since everything which comes into being must decay (546a-b). The rulers are bound to make mistakes in assigning people jobs suited to their natural capacities and each of the classes will begin to be mixed with people who are not naturally suited for the tasks relevant to each class (546e). This will lead to class conflicts (547a).
The first deviant regime from just kingship or aristocracy will be timocracy, that emphasizes the pursuit of honor rather than wisdom and justice (547d ff.). The timocratic individual will have a strong spirited part in his soul and will pursue honor, power, and success (549a). This city will be militaristic. Socrates explains the process by which an individual becomes timocratic: he listens to his mother complain about his father’s lack of interest in honor and success (549d). The timocratic individual’s soul is at a middle point between reason and spirit.
Oligarchy arises out of timocracy and it emphasizes wealth rather than honor (550c-e). Socrates discusses how it arises out of timocracy and its characteristics (551c-552e): people will pursue wealth; it will essentially be two cities, a city of wealthy citizens and a city of poor people; the few wealthy will fear the many poor; people will do various jobs simultaneously; the city will allow for poor people without means; it will have a high crime rate. The oligarchic individual comes by seeing his father lose his possessions and feeling insecure he begins to greedily pursue wealth (553a-c). Thus he allows his appetitive part to become a more dominant part of his soul (553c). The oligarchic individual’s soul is at middle point between the spirited and the appetitive part.
Socrates proceeds penultimately, to discuss democracy. It comes about when the rich become too rich and the poor too poor (555c-d). Too much luxury makes the oligarchs soft and the poor revolt against them (556c-e). In democracy most of the political offices are distributed by lot (557a). The primary goal of the democratic regime is freedom or license (557b-c). People will come to hold offices without having the necessary knowledge (557e) and everyone is treated as an equal in ability (equals and unequals alike, 558c). The democratic individual comes to pursue all sorts of bodily desires excessively (558d-559d) and allows his appetitive part to rule his soul. He comes about when his bad education allows him to transition from desiring money to desiring bodily and material goods (559d-e). The democratic individual has no shame and no self-discipline (560d).
Tyranny arises out of democracy when the desire for freedom to do what one wants becomes extreme (562b-c). The freedom or license aimed at in the democracy becomes so extreme that any limitations on anyone’s freedom seem unfair. Socrates points out that when freedom is taken to such an extreme it produces its opposite, slavery (563e-564a). The tyrant comes about by presenting himself as a champion of the people against the class of the few people who are wealthy (565d-566a). The tyrant is forced to commit a number of acts to gain and retain power: accuse people falsely, attack his kinsmen, bring people to trial under false pretenses, kill many people, exile many people, and purport to cancel the debts of the poor to gain their support (565e-566a). The tyrant eliminates the rich, brave, and wise people in the city since he perceives them as threats to his power (567c). Socrates indicates that the tyrant faces the dilemma to either live with worthless people or with good people who may eventually depose him and chooses to live with worthless people (567d). The tyrant ends up using mercenaries as his guards since he cannot trust any of the citizens (567d-e). The tyrant also needs a very large army and will spend the city’s money (568d-e), and will not hesitate to kill members of his own family if they resist his ways (569b-c).
Socrates is now ready to discuss the tyrannical individual (571a). He begins by discussing necessary and unnecessary pleasures and desires (571b-c). Those with balanced souls ruled by reason are able to keep their unnecessary desires from becoming lawless and extreme (571d-572b). The tyrannical individual comes out of the democratic individual when the latter’s unnecessary desires and pleasures become extreme; when he becomes full of Eros or lust (572c-573b). The tyrannical person is mad with lust (573c) and this leads him to seek any means by which to satisfy his desires and to resist anyone who gets in his way (573d-574d). Some tyrannical individuals eventually become actual tyrants (575b-d). Tyrants associate themselves with flatterers and are incapable of friendship (575e-576a). Applying the analogy of the city and the soul, Socrates proceeds to argue that the tyrannical individual is the most unhappy individual (576c ff.). Like the tyrannical city, the tyrannical individual is enslaved (577c-d), least likely to do what he wants (577d-e), poor and unsatisfiable (579e-578a), fearful and full of wailing and lamenting (578a). The individual who becomes an actual tyrant of a city is the unhappiest of all (578b-580a). Socrates concludes this first argument with a ranking of the individuals in terms of happiness: the more just one is the happier (580b-c).
He proceeds to a second proof that the just are happier than the unjust (580d). Socrates distinguishes three types of persons: one who pursues wisdom, another who pursues honor, and another who pursues profit (579d-581c). He argues that we should trust the wisdom lover’s judgment in his way of life as the most pleasant, since he is able to consider all three types of life clearly (581c-583a).
Socrates proceeds to offer a third proof that the just are happier than the unjust (583b). He begins with an analysis of pleasure: relief from pain may seem pleasant (583c) and bodily pleasures are merely a relief from pain but not true pleasure (584b-c). The only truly fulfilling pleasure is that which comes from understanding since the objects it pursues are permanent (585b-c). Socrates adds that only if the rational part rules the soul, will each part of the soul find its proper pleasure (586d-587a). He concludes the argument with a calculation of how many times the best life is more pleasant than the worst: seven-hundred and twenty nine (587a-587e). Socrates discusses an imaginary multi-headed beast to illustrate the consequences of justice and injustice in the soul and to support justice (588c ff.).
Thereafter, Socrates returns to the subject of poetry and claims that the measures introduced to exclude imitative poetry from the just city seem clearly justified now (595a). Poetry is to be censored since the poets may not know which is; thus may lead the soul astray (595b). Socrates proceeds to discuss imitation. He explains what it is by distinguishing several levels of imitation through the example of a couch: there is the Form of the couch, the particular couch, and a painting of a couch (596a-598b). The products of imitation are far removed from the truth (597e-598c). Poets, like painters are imitators who produce imitations without knowledge of the truth (598e-599a). Socrates argues that if poets had knowledge of the truth they would want to be people who do great things rather than remain poets (599b). Socrates doubts the poet’s capacity to teach virtue since he only imitates images of it (599c-601a). The poet’s knowledge is inferior to that of the maker of other products and the maker’s knowledge is inferior to that of the user’s (601c-602b).
Now Socrates considers how imitators affect their audiences (602c). He uses a comparison with optical illusions (602c) to argue that imitative poetry causes the parts of the soul to be at war with each other and this leads to injustice (603c-605b). The most serious charge against imitative poetry is that it even corrupts decent people (605c). He concludes that the just city should not allow such poetry in it but only poetry that praises the gods and good humans (606e-607a). Imitative poetry prevents the immortal soul from attaining its greatest reward (608c-d).
Glaucon wonders if the soul is immortal and Socrates launches into an argument proving its immortality: things that are destroyed, are destroyed by their own evil; the body’s evil is disease and this can destroy it; the soul’s evils are ignorance, injustice and the other vices but these do not destroy the soul; thus, the soul is immortal (608d-611a). Socrates points out that we cannot understand the nature of the soul if we only consider its relation to the body as the present discussion has (611b-d).
Socrates finally describes the rewards of justice by first having Glaucon allow that he can discuss the rewards of reputation for justice (612b-d). Glaucon allows this since Socrates has already defended justice by itself in the soul. Socrates indicates justice and injustice do not escape the notice of the gods, that the gods love the just and hate the unjust, and that good things come to those whom the gods love (612e-613a). Socrates lists various rewards for the just and punishments for the unjust in this life (613a-e). He proceeds to tell the Myth of Er that is supposed to illustrate reward and punishment in the afterlife (614b). The souls of the dead go up through an opening on the right if they were just, or below through an opening on the left if they were unjust (614d). The various souls discuss their rewards and punishments (614e-615a). Socrates explains the multiples by which people are punished and rewarded (615a-b). The souls of the dead are able to choose their next lives (617d) and then they are reincarnated (620e). Socrates ends the discussion by prompting Glaucon and the others to do well both in this life and in the afterlife (621c-d).
The Republic has acquired the recognition of a classic and seminal work in political philosophy. It is often taught in courses that focus on political theory or political philosophy. Moreover, in the dialogue Socrates seems primarily concerned with what is an ethical issue, namely whether the just life is better than the unjust life for the individual. These two observations raise two issues. The first is whether the Republic is primarily about ethics or about politics. If it is primarily about ethics then perhaps its recognition as a seminal political work is unwarranted. Moreover, considering it a political work would be somewhat mistaken. The second issue is that even if thinking of it as a classic in political philosophy is warranted, it is very difficult to situate it in terms of its political position.
Interpreters of the Republic have presented various arguments concerning the issue of whether the dialogue is primarily about ethics or about politics. As is evident from Books I and II, Socrates’ main aim in the dialogue is to prove that the just person is better off than the unjust person. In Book II, he proposes to construct the just city in speech in order to find justice in it and then to proceed to find justice in the individual (368a). Thus, he seems to use a discussion in political matters as a means by which to answer what is essentially an ethical question. But, Socrates also spends a lot of time in the dialogue on political matters in relation to the question of political justice such as education, the positions and relations among political classes, war, property, the causes of political strife and change of regimes, and several other matters. Each of these could provide important contributions to political philosophy.
One argument, suggesting that the dialogue is primarily concerned with the ethical question, focuses on Socrates’ presentation of the political discussion of justice as instrumental to discovering justice in the individual. Another relevant consideration is that there are several indications in the dialogue that the aim in the discussion is more pressing than the means (the just city). Thus, the argument goes, Socrates does not seem primarily interested in discussing political philosophy but ethics instead. Another related argument indicates that the discussion entails great doubts about whether the just city is even possible. Socrates claims this along with the idea that the function of the just city in the argument is to enable the individual to get a better idea of justice and injustice (472b-d, 592a-b). Thus, it is very difficult for us to conclude that Socrates takes the political discussion as seriously as he does the moral question (see Annas, Julia. Platonic Ethics, Old and New).
Other interpreters indicate that the Republic is essentially about both ethics and politics (among others see Santas, Gerasimos. Understanding Plato’s Republic; Schofield, Malcolm. Plato: Political Philosophy; Reeve C.D.C. Philosopher Kings). Some emphasize that many of Socrates’ proposals for social reform (education, property, the role of women, the family) go beyond what is needed to be able to argue that the just person is better off than the unjust person. Thus, these social reforms seem to be developed for their own sake.
Some indicate that Socrates’ discussion of political matters is meant, in part, to provide us with Plato’s critique of Greek political life. In Book VIII he criticizes democracy as an unjust regime and thus he seems to launch a critique against Athenian democracy. He also adopts several measures in the just city, which were part of the Spartan constitution. Like Spartan citizens, the guardians of the just city are professional soldiers whose aim is the protection of the city, the guardians eat together, and they have their needs provided for by other classes. But unlike Sparta, the just city has philosophers as rulers, a rigorous system of education in intellectual matters, and it is not timocratic or honor loving. These differences may be construed as a critique of Sparta’s political life. Thus, the argument suggests, in addition to the main ethical question the dialogue is also about political philosophy.
Another position is that even though the discussion of political matters is instrumental to addressing the main ethical question of the dialogue, Socrates makes several important contributions to political philosophy. One such contribution is his description of political regimes in Book VIII and his classification of them on a scale of more or less just. Another such contribution is his consideration of the causes of political change from one political regime to another. Moreover, Socrates seems to raise and address a number of questions that seem necessary in order to understand political life clearly. He raises the issues of the role of women in the city, the role of the family, the role of art, the issue of class relations, of political stability, of the limitation of people’s freedoms and several others. Thus, according to this view, it is warranted to regard the Republic as a work on political philosophy and as a seminal work in that area.
A further relevant consideration has to do with how one understands the nature of ethics and political philosophy and their relation. Since modernity, it becomes much easier to treat these as separate subjects. Modern ethics is more focused on determining whether an action is morally permissible or not whereas ancient ethics is more focused on happiness or the good life. Many ancient thinkers want to address the question “what is the happy life?” and in order to do this they think that it is warranted to address political matters. Humans live their lives in political communities and the kind of political community they live in can be conducive or detrimental to one’s happiness. Thus, ethics and political philosophy are more closely linked for ancient thinkers than they may be for us since modernity. Ethics and political philosophy seem to be different sides of the same coin.
The second issue has to do with situating the Republic’s political stance. There are several competing candidates. The Republic entails elements of socialism as when Socrates expresses the desire to achieve happiness for the whole city not for any particular group of it (420b) and when he argues against inequalities in wealth (421d). There are also elements of fascism or totalitarianism. Among others, there is extreme censorship of poetry, lying to maintain good behavior and political stability, restriction of power to a small elite group, eugenic techniques, centralized control of the citizen’s lives, a strong military group that enforces the laws, and suppression of freedom of expression and choice. Several commentators focused on these elements to dismiss the Republic as a proto-totalitarian text (see Popper, Karl. The Open Society and Its Enemies). There are also some strong elements of communism such as the idea that the guardian class ought to possess things in common. Despite, Socrates’ emphasis on the individual and the condition of his soul, the Republic does not entail the kernels of what becomes modern liberalism. Socrates seems to argue against allowing much freedom to individuals and to criticize the democratic tendency to treat humans as equals. Some have argued that the Republic is neither a precursor of these political positions nor does it fit any of them. They find that the Republic has been such a seminal work in the history of political philosophy precisely because it raises such issues as its political stance while discussing many of the features of such political positions.
The analogy of the city and the soul, is Socrates proposed and accepted method by which to argue that the just person is better off than the unjust person (Book II, 368c-369a). If Socrates is able to show how a just city is always happier than unjust cities, then he can have a model by which to argue that a just person is always happier than an unjust one. He plausibly assumes that there is an interesting, intelligible, and non-accidental relation between the structural features and values of a city and an individual. But commentators have found this curious approach one of the most puzzling features of the Republic. The city/soul analogy is quite puzzling since Socrates seems to apply it in different ways, thus there is much controversy about the exact extent of the analogy. Moreover, there is much controversy concerning its usefulness in the attempt to discover and to defend justice in terms of the individual.
In several passages Socrates seems to say that the same account of justice must apply to both cities (justice is the right order of classes) and to individuals (justice is the right order of the soul). But even though he says this he seems to think that this ought to be the case for different reasons. For example, at (435a), he seems to say that the same account of justice ought to apply to the city and to the individual since the same account of any predicate X must apply to all things that are X. So, if a city or an individual is just then the same predicates must apply to both. In other passages Socrates seems to mean that same account of justice ought to apply to the city and to the individual since the X-ness of the whole is due to the X-ness of the parts (435d). So, if the people in the city are just, then this will cause the city to be just as well. Yet still in other passages he seems to say that if a city is just and this causes it to have certain features such as wisdom or courage, then we can deduce that the individual’s being just will also cause him to be wise and courageous. So if a city’s X-ness entails certain predicates, then the individual’s X-ness must entail the same predicates. In other passages still, he seems to claim that the justice of the city can be used as a heuristic device by which to look for justice in the individual, thus the relation between the two seems quite loose (368e-369a). (For a thorough discussion of these issues and the various interpretations of the city/soul analogy see Ferrari, G.R.F. City and Soul in Plato’s Republic.)
In response to Thrasymachus, Glaucon, and Adeimantus, Socrates seeks to show that it is always in an individual’s interest to be just, rather than unjust. Thus, one of the most pressing issues regarding the Republic is whether Socrates defends justice successfully or not. David Sachs, in his influential article “A Fallacy in Plato’s Republic”, argues that Socrates’ defense of justice entails a crucial problem which renders the defense problematic. Sachs argues that Socrates commits the fallacy of irrelevance. Socrates sets out to defend the idea that it is always in one’s interest to be just and to act justly and he presents the just person as one who has a balanced soul. Sachs observes that what Socrates defends is psychic health or rationality which may lead one to be happy but he fails to defend justice. Socrates fails to show why having a balanced soul will lead one to act justly or why psychic health amounts to justice. Sachs implies that justice, as this is traditionally understood, includes actions in relation to others, it includes considerations of other people’s good, and also includes strong motivations not to act unjustly. According to Sachs, Socrates’ defense of justice does not include compelling reasons to think that a person with a balanced soul will refrain from acts that are traditionally thought to be unjust such as say, theft, murder, or adultery. Thus, Plato presents Socrates defending psychic health rather than justice.
Sachs’ critique indicates that as Socrates presents the just person, the person’s balanced soul does not entail a sufficient causal or logical connection to performing socially just actions. In order to save Socrates’ defense of justice one needs to show that there is a logical and a causal connection between having a balanced soul and performing socially just actions. Otherwise, the problem of being psychically just but socially unjust remains
Given Sachs’ critique, several commentators have come to Socrates’ defense to bridge the gap between a just soul and just actions (these are discussed in detail by Singpurwalla, Rachel G. K. “Plato’s Defense of Justice in the Republic”). One approach to bridging the gap between a just soul and just actions has been to show that the just person with a balanced soul operates according to certain values and desires which cannot lead to unjust actions (see Kraut, Richard “The Defense of Justice in Plato’s Republic”). The just person’s soul entails desires for certain kinds of objects the most important of which is knowledge. Socrates indicates the difficulty and extreme effort required to attain knowledge of the forms and the form of the Good, thus the just person will pursue learning and not spend time indulging in the satisfaction of desires that typically lead to unjust actions. This approach of bridging the gap between a just soul and just actions may have some drawbacks. One drawback may be that several unjust actions may be motivated by desires that are compatible with the desire for knowledge. For example, why wouldn’t a person with a great desire for knowledge steal a book if this would contribute to his knowledge.
A second approach to bridging the gap between the just soul and just actions has been to show that the just person’s knowledge of the good, directly motivates him to perform just actions and to refrain from unjust ones (see Cooper, John “The Psychology of Justice in Plato’s Republic” and White, N. A Companion to Plato’s Republic). A crucial piece of evidence for this approach is Socrates’ presentation of the philosopher who agrees to rule the city even though this will interfere with his desire to learn. The proponents of this approach argue that the philosopher agrees to rule since his knowledge of the good directly motivates him to act against his interests and to do something that is good objectively and for others. This approach has met at least one serious objection: the just person’s knowledge of the good may motivate him to do what is good for others but Socrates seeks to also argue that it is always in one’s interest to be just, thus this approach may suggest that just actions may not always be in the just person’s interests (for a discussion of this see Singpurwalla). This objection amounts to the claim that the second approach may show that the just person will do just actions but it does this by sacrificing Socrates’ claim that being just is always in one’s interest.
Given the problems of the first two approaches, a third one attempts to show that the just person will do what is just in relation to others while at the same time doing what is in the just person’s interests. In other words, this approach seeks to show that the just person’s own good is realized in doing what is also good for others. According to this approach, the just person has a value that motivates him to do what is just, in relation to others and this value is the just person’s love of the forms (see Dahl, Norman “Plato’s Defense of Justice”). The just person’s love of the forms is the desire to contemplate and also imitate or instantiate these in the world. Thus, the philosopher regards ruling as something in his interest despite the fact that it interferes with his pursuit of knowledge, since in ruling he will be imitating the forms. Even though this approach seems to bridge the gap between the just person and just actions and the gap between just actions and such actions being in the just person’s interest (this was the problem with the second approach) a criticism remains. Singpurwalla points out that only very few people can acquire such knowledge of the forms so as to be just persons, thus for most people Socrates offers no good reason to be just. This third approach may save Socrates’ defense of justice only for people capable of knowing the forms, but falls short of showing that everyone has a reason to be just.
Singpurwalla suggests a fourth approach which can defend Socrates contra Sachs and which will avoid the criticisms launched against the other approaches. She aims to show that Socrates has a good reason to think that it is in everyone’s interest to act justly because doing so satisfies a deeply ingrained human need, namely, the need to be unified with others. Singpurwalla attempts to make her case by showing the following: (1) that according to Socrates our happiness largely resides in being unified with others (she cites the tyrant’s unhappiness due to bad relations with others as evidence for this, 567a-580a); (2) that being unified with others entails considering their own good when we act (she cites Socrates’ claims that when people are unified they share in each other’s pleasures and successes and failures as evidence for this, 462b-e, 463e-464d); (3) thus, behaving unjustly, which involves disregarding another’s good, is incompatible with being unified with others and with our happiness. Singpurwalla’s position tries to show that even though the average person may not be able to attain the knowledge of the form of the good, he can still be motivated to act justly since this is in his interest. Thus, Socrates’ defense of justice may be compelling for the philosopher as well as the average person.
- Slings, S.R. (ed.), Platonis Rempublicam (Oxford: Oxford Classical Texts, 2003).
- Shorey, Paul. Plato. Republic (2 vols. Loeb, 137-1937). This translation includes an introduction and notes.
- Bloom, Allan. The Republic of Plato. (New York: Basic Books, 1968). This translation includes notes and an interpretative essay.
- Ferrari, G.R.F. (ed.), Griffith, Tom (trans.). Plato. The Republic. (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2000). This translation includes an introduction.
- Reeve, C.D.C. Plato. The Republic. (Indianapolis: Hackett, 2004).
(all attempt to provide a unified interpretation of the dialogue).
- Murphy, N.R. The Interpretation of Plato’s Republic (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1951).
- Cross, R.C. and Woozley, A.D. Plato’s Republic: A Philosophical Commentary (New York: St. Martin’s Press, 1964).
- White, Nicholas P. A Companion to Plato’s Republic (Indianapolis: Hackett, 1979).
- Annas, Julia. An Introduction to Plato’s Republic (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1981).
- Reeve, C.D.C. Philosopher Kings: The Argument of Plato’s Republic (Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1988).
- Howland, Jacob. The Republic: The Odyssey of Philosophy (Philadelphia: Paul Dry Books, 2004).
- Rosen, Stanley. Plato’s Republic: A Study (New Haven: Yale University Press, 2005).
- Santas, Gerasimos. Understanding Plato’s Republic (Wiley-Blackwell, 2010).
(all entail a systematic discussion of ethics and/or political philosophy in the Republic).
- Irwin, T.H. Plato’s Ethics (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1995).
- Annas, Julia. Platonic Ethics Old and New (Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 1999).
- Monoson, Sara. Plato’s Democratic Entanglements (Princeton: Princeton University Press, 2000).
- Bobonich, Christopher. Plato’s Utopia Recast (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2002).
- Schofield, Malcolm. Plato: Political Philosophy (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2006).
- Rowe, Christopher. “The Place of the Republic in Plato’s Political Thought” in Ferrari, G.R.F. The Canbridge Companion to Plato’s Republic. (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2007).
- Williams, Bernard. “The Analogy of City and Soul in Plato’s Republic”, in Kraut, Richard (ed.). Plato’s Republic: Critical Essays (New York: Rowman and Littlefield, 1997).
- Lear, Jonathan. “Inside and Outside the Republic”, in Kraut, Richard (ed.). Plato’s Republic: Critical Essays (New York: Rowman and Littlefield, 1997).
- Ferrari, G.R.F. City and Soul in Plato’s Republic (Chicago: The University of Chicago Press, 2005).
- Blossner, Norbert. “The City-Soul Analogy”, in Ferrari, G.R.F. The Canbridge Companion to Plato’s Republic. (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2007).
(in chronological order; these essays discuss how Socrates defends justice and examine how well he does in doing so).
- Sachs, David. “A Fallacy in Plato’s Republic”, in The Philosophical Review 72 (1963): 141-58.
- Dahl, Norman O. “Plato’s Defense of Justice”, in Philosophy and Phenomenological Research. Vol. 51, No. 4 (Dec. 1991).
- Kraut, Richard. “The Defense of Justice in Plato’s Republic”, in Kraut, Richard (ed.) Plato’s Republic: Critical Essays (New York: Rowman and Littlefield, 1997).
- Singpurwalla, Rachel G.K. “Plato’s Defense of Justice in the Republic”, in Santas, Gerasimos (ed.). The Blackwell Guide to Plato’s Republic (Oxford: Blackwell Publishing, 2006).
- Discussions of the Role of Women in the Just City
- Vlastos, Gregory. “Was Plato a Feminist?”, Times Literary Supplement, No. 4, 485, Mar. 17, 1989, 276, 288-89.
- Saxonhouse, Arlene. “The philosopher and the Female in the Political Thought of Plato”, in Kraut, Richard (ed.) Plato’s Republic: Critical Essays (New York: Rowman and Littlefield, 1997).
- Reeve. C.D.C. “The Naked Old Women in the Palaestra”, in Kraut, Richard (ed.) Plato’s Republic: Critical Essays (New York: Rowman and Littlefield, 1997).
- Urmson, James O. “Plato and the Poets”, in Kraut, Richard (ed.) Plato’s Republic: Critical Essays (New York: Rowman and Littlefield, 1997).
- O’Connor, David K. “Rewriting the Poets in Plato’s Characters”, in Ferrari, G.R.F. The Canbridge Companion to Plato’s Republic. (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2007).
- Moss, Jessica. “What is Imitative Poetry and Why is it Bad?”, in Ferrari, G.R.F. The Canbridge Companion to Plato’s Republic. (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2007).
- Lorenz, Hendrik. “The Analysis of the Soul in Plato’s Republic” in Santas, Gerasimos (ed.). The Blackwell Guide to Plato’s Republic (Oxford: Blackwell Publishing, 2006).
- Ferrari, G.R.F., “The Three-Part Soul”, in Ferrari, G.R.F. The Cambridge Companion to Plato’s Republic. (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2007).
- Cooper, John M. “The Psychology of Justice in Plato” in Kraut, Richard (ed.) Plato’s Republic: Critical Essays (New York: Rowman and Littlefield, 1997).
- Anagnostopoulos, Mariana. “The Divided Soul and the Desire for Good in Plato’s Republic” in Santas, Gerasimos (ed.). The Blackwell Guide to Plato’s Republic (Oxford: Blackwell Publishing, 2006).
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Last updated: November 4, 2012 | Originally published: November 3, 2012
Categories: Ancient Philosophy