What Else Science Requires of Time

This article adds to the main "Time" article and its supplements. The three most fundamental theories of physical science are the general theory of relativity, the standard model of particle physics (which includes quantum theory), and the big bang theory of cosmology.

Table of Contents

  1. Relativity and Quantum Mechanics
  2. The Big Bang
  3. Infinite Time

Relativity and Quantum Mechanics

EinsteinAccording to relativity and quantum mechanics, spacetime is, loosely speaking, a collection of points called “spacetime locations” where the universe’s physical events occur. Spacetime is four-dimensional and a continuum, and time is a distinguished, one-dimensional sub-space of this continuum. Because time is not really a dimension of space, it is less misleading to speak of 4-dimensional spacetime as (3 + 1)-dimensional spacetime.

Any interval of time is a linear continuum of instants. This implies that current science requires every interval of time to have a point-like structure just like an interval of real numbers in their standard less-than order. So, between any two point-like instants of time there is an aleph-one infinity of other instants, and there are no gaps in the sequence of instants. Time is smooth and not quantized even in quantum mechanics.

There are complications. There is an important difference between the universe’s cosmic time and any object's proper time; and there is an important difference between proper time and a reference frame’s coordinate time. Also, special relativity considers space-time to be a passive arena for events, but general relativity requires spacetime to be dynamic in the sense that changes in matter-energy can change the curvature of space-time itself.

All physicists believe that relativity and quantum mechanics are logically inconsistent and need to be replaced by a theory of quantum gravity. A successful theory of quantum gravity is likely to have radical implications for our understanding of time; two prominent suggestions of what those implications might be are that (i) time and space will be seen to be discrete rather than continuous, and (ii) space and perhaps even time, too, will be seen to emerge from more basic entities. But today "the best game in town" says time is not discrete and does not emerge from a more basic timeless entity.

Aristotle, Newton, and everyone else before Einstein, believed there is a frame-independent notion of an interval of time. For example, if the time interval between two lightning flashes is 100 seconds on someone’s accurate clock, then it also is 100 seconds on your own accurate clock, even if you are flying by the other person at an incredible speed. Einstein rejected this piece of common sense in his 1905 special theory of relativity: “Every reference-body has its own particular time; unless we are told the reference-body to which the statement of time refers, there is no meaning in a statement of the time of an event.” Two reference frames, or reference-bodies, that are moving relative to each other will divide spacetime differently into its time part and its space part. In short, your accurate clock need not agree with my accurate clock, and any two initially synchronized clocks will not stay synchronized if they are in motion relative to each other or undergo different gravitational forces.

In 1908, the mathematician Hermann Minkowski had an original idea in metaphysics regarding space and time. He was the first person to claim that spacetime is more fundamental than either time or space alone. As he put it, “Henceforth space by itself, and time by itself, are doomed to fade away into mere shadows, and only a kind of union of the two will preserve an independent reality.” The metaphysical assumption behind Minkowski’s remark is that what is “independently real” is what does not vary from one reference frame to another. What does not vary is their union, what we now call “spacetime.” It seems to follow that the division of events into the past ones, the present ones, and the future ones is also not “independently real.” One philosophical implication that Minkowski and Einstein accepted is that it’s an error to say, “Only my present is real.”

A coordinate system or reference frame is a way of representing space and time using ordered sets of numbers as names of spacetime points. Science specifies a time coordinate with a single number. Scientists do not believe time is two dimensions; they do not assign ordered pairs of numbers to times because they are confident that, in any reference frame, the happens-before order-relation on events is faithfully reflected in the less-than order-relation on the time numbers (dates) that we assign to events. In the fundamental theories such as relativity and quantum mechanics, the values of the time variable t in any reference frame are real numbers, not merely rational numbers. Each number designates an instant of time, and time is a linear continuum of these instants ordered by the happens-before relation, similar to the mathematician’s line segment that is ordered by the less-than relation. Physical time is treated as being one-dimensional rather than two-dimensional, and continuous rather than discrete. These features do not require time to be linear, however, because a segment of a circle is also a linear continuum, but there is no evidence for circular time, that is, for causal loops. Causal loops are represented in the physicists' spacetime diagrams as worldlines that are closed curves.

In mathematical physics, the ordering of instants by the happens-before relation, that is, by temporal precedence, is complete in the sense that there are no gaps in the sequence of instants. Unlike physical objects, physical time is believed to be infinitely divisible—divisible in the sense of the actually infinite, not merely in Aristotle's sense of potentially infinite. Regarding density of instants, the ordered instants are so densely packed that between any two there is a third, so that no instant has a next instant. Regarding continuity, time’s being a linear continuum implies that there is a nondenumerable infinity of instants between any two non-simultaneous instants. The rational number line does not have this feature; it is not continuous the way the real number line is. There is little doubt that the actual temporal structure of events can be embedded in the real numbers, but how about the converse? That is, to what extent is it known that the real numbers can be adequately embedded into the structure of the instants? The problem here is that, although time is not quantized in quantum theory, for times shorter than about 10-43 second (the so-called Planck time), science has no experimental grounds for the claim that between any two events there is a third. Instead, the justification of saying the reals can be embedded into an interval of instants is that the assumption of continuity is so convenient and useful, and that there are no known inconsistencies due to making this assumption, and that there are no better theories available.

Relativity theory challenges a great many of our intuitive beliefs about time. For two events occurring at the same place but at different times, relativity theory implies their order is absolute in the sense of being independent of the frame of reference, and this agrees with common sense and the manifest image of time, but for distant events occurring close enough in time to be in each other’s absolute elsewhere, event A can occur before event B in one reference frame, but after B in another frame, and simultaneously with B in yet another frame. For example, suppose you are sitting exactly in the middle of a moving train when lightning strikes simultaneously in the front and back of the train. You will know the strikes were simultaneous if the light rays from the two strikes reach you at the same time. However, the two lightning strikes are in each other's absolute elsewhere. This implies that, in the reference frame of a person standing still on the ground outside the train, the lightning strike at the back of the train happened first because the center of the train is speeding away from the strike poin. In a frame fixed to a fast plane flying overhead in the same direction as the train and toward the front of the train, then the lightning strike at the front of the train really happened first. It was Einstein's original idea that all three judgments about time order are correct. The event at the front of the train really did happen first, and it really did happen second, and it really did happen at the same time as the event at the back. It's all a matter of which reference frame is used to make the judgment.

Science impacts our understanding of time in other fundamental ways. Special relativity theory implies there is time dilation between one frame and another. For example, the faster a clock moves, the slower it runs, relative to stationary clocks. But this does not work just for clocks. If a human being moves fast, the human being also ages more slowly than someone who is stationary. Time dilation effects occur for tiny protons, too, but protons do not show the effects of their aging the way human bodies and clocks do.

Time dilation shows itself when a speeding twin returns to find that his (or her) Earth-bound twin has aged more rapidly. This surprising dilation result once caused some philosophers to question the consistency of relativity theory by arguing that, if motion is relative, then we could call the speeding twin “stationary” and it would follow that this twin is now the one who ages more rapidly. This argument is called the twin paradox. Experts now are agreed that the mistake is within the argument for the paradox, not within relativity theory. The twins feel different accelerations, so their two situations are not sufficiently similar to carry out the paradoxical argument. The arguer fails to notice the radically different relationships that each twin has to the rest of the universe as a whole. This is why one twin’s proper time is so different than the other’s. One last remark about proper time; freely drifting objects follow trajectories of maximum proper time, not, as one might intuitively expect, minimum proper time.

There are two kinds of time dilation. Special relativity’s time dilation involves speed; general relativity’s time dilation also involves gravitational fields (and accelerations). Two ideally synchronized clocks need not stay in synchrony if they undergo different gravitational forces. This gravitational time dilation would be especially apparent if one, but not the other, of the two clocks were to approach a black hole. The time shown on the clock approaching the black hole will slow, and it completely stops at the horizon (not just at the center of the hole)—relative to time on a clock that remains safely back on Earth.

If, as many physicists suspect, the microstructure of spacetime near the Planck length is a quantum foam of changing curvature of spacetime with black holes rapidly forming and dissolving, then time loses its meaning at this small scale. The philosophical implication is that time exists only when we are speaking of regions large compared to the Planck length.

General Relativity theory has other profound implications for time. In 1948, the logician Kurt Gödel discovered radical solutions to Einstein’s equations, solutions in which there are closed timelike curves due to the rotation of the universe’s matter, so that as one progresses forward in time along one of these curves one arrives back at one’s starting point. Gödel drew the conclusion that if matter is distributed so that there is Gödelian spacetime (that is, with a preponderance of galaxies rotating in one direction rather than another), then the universe has no linear time. There is no evidence that our universe has this rotation.

You may have heard the remark that nothing can go faster than light speed. This is not true. First, the remark applies only to the speed of light in a vacuum. There are materials through which light moves very slowly compared to the speed of an airplane flying through air. The light speed limit applies only to objects within space, but places no restrictions on how fast space itself can expand. And virtual particles such as gravitons can move faster than the speed of light. This is why they can escape from a black hole and affect the path of a spaceship that is outside the black hole.

We’ve said little about quantum mechanics, but time reversibility is implied by quantum mechanics and not relativity theory. The process of falling into a black hole does not have an inverse process in relativity theory, but every quantum process has an inverse process, so the two major theories are inconsistent on this issue.

The Big Bang

The big bang is a violent explosion of space that began billions of years ago. The explosion creates new space. The big bang theory in some form or other is accepted by the vast majority of astronomers, but it is not as firmly accepted as is the theory of relativity. Here is a quick story of its origin. In 1922, the Russian physicist Alexander Friedmann predicted from general relativity that the universe should be expanding. Georges Lemaître independently made the same prediction, although later. In 1929, the American astronomer Edwin Hubble observed clusters of galaxies undergoing a universal expansion, on average, away from each other. Subsequent investigations over the next century more carefully measured the amount of past time since the beginning of the big bang. The expansion rate has not always been uniform. The term "big bang" does not have a precise definition. It should not refer to a single event but rather to a brief range of events.

The big bang theory is a theory of how our universe evolved, more specifically how it expanded and cooled from a small, dense, hot early condition. The expansion and cooling is continuing. Atoms are not expanding; our solar system is not expanding; even the cluster of galaxies to which the Milky Way belongs is not expanding. What is expanding is the average distances between clusters of galaxies. It is as if the clusters are exploding away from each other, and in the future they will be very much farther away from each other. But the explosion is not occurring within space; the explosion is an explosion of space.

At any earlier moment, the universe was more compact. Projecting to earlier and earlier times, and assuming that gravitation is the main force at work, the astronomers now conclude that 13.8 billion years ago (which happens to be about three times the age of our planet) the universe was smaller than an atom and outrageously dense with an extremely low entropy. Because all substances cool when they expand, physicists believe the universe itself must have been cooling down over the last 13.8 billion years, and so it begin expanding when it was extremely hot. At present the average temperature of space in all very large regions has cooled to about 2.7 Celsius degrees above absolute zero. Space is presently expanding at a rate of 71 kilometers per second per megaparsec.

The initial explosion at the time of the big bang is part of the cause of this expansion of space. However, ordinary dark energy is also part of the cause. Its influence early on was very weak, but its key feature is that it does not dilute as the space it is within expands. So, finally about five or six billion years of space's expanding since the big bang, the dark energy finally became influential enough to accelerate the expansion of space. Now 13.8 billion years after the big bang, the dark energy is causing a more rapidly increasing expansion of space.

Observations of supernovas are best explained by the assumption that distance between supernovas is increasing at an accelerating rate. Because this rate will increase, it is estimated that a galaxy cluster that is now 100 light years away from the Milky Way will, in another 13.8 billion years, be more than 200 light years away and moving faster, and in twice that time it will be much farther away and much faster. Eventually it will become invisible, as will all other galaxies.

During the first three quarters of the twentieth century, it was commonly believed that the entire universe was created in the big bang, and time itself came into existence then. So, the day of the big bang was a day without a yesterday. With the appearance of the cosmological theory of eternal inflation and with new theories of quantum gravity in the 21st century, the question of what happened before the big bang has been resurrected as scientifically legitimate.

The theory of cosmic inflation is the best accepted version of, or amendment to, the big bang theory. It postulates that extremely early in the big bang process there was an explosive, exponential inflation of space due to the presence of a small amount of material having negative pressure. This material is a form of energy but not a form of ordinary dark energy. The epoch of cosmic inflation began after the Planck epoch. It began about 10−36 seconds into the big bang process, and lasted for about 10−33 seconds, during which time the volume of space increased by a factor of at least 1078.

After exponential expansion stopped, due to the decay of the primordial explosive material, the universe continued to expand, but less rapidly. The originator of the inflation theory, M.I.T. physics professor Alan Guth, described the inflationary period this way:

There was a period of inflation driven by the repulsive gravity of a peculiar kind of material that filled the early universe. Sometimes I call this material a "false vacuum," but, in any case, it was a material which in fact had a negative pressure, which is what allows it to behave this way. Negative pressure causes repulsive gravity. Our particle physics tells us that we expect states of negative pressure to exist at very high energies, so we hypothesize that at least a small patch of the early universe contained this peculiar repulsive gravity material which then drove exponential expansion. Eventually, at least locally where we live, that expansion stopped because this peculiar repulsive gravity material is unstable; and it decayed, becoming normal matter with normal attractive gravity. At that point [in time], the dark energy is there, we think. We think it's always been there, but it's not dominant. It's a tiny, tiny fraction of the total energy density, so at that stage at the end of inflation the universe just starts coasting outward. It has a tremendous outward thrust from the inflation, which carries it on. So, the expansion continues, and as the expansion happens the ordinary matter thins out. The dark energy, we think, remains approximately constant. If it's vacuum energy, it remains exactly constant. So, there comes a time later where the energy density of everything else drops to the level of the dark energy, and we think that happened about five or six billion years ago. After that, as the energy density of normal matter continues to thin out, the dark energy [density] remains constant [and] the dark energy starts to dominate; and that's the phase we are in now. We think about seventy percent or so of the total energy of our universe is dark energy, and that number will continue to increase with time as the normal matter continues to thin out.

World Science U Live Session: Alan Guth, published November 30, 2016 at https://www.youtube.com/watch?v=IWL-sd6PVtM.

In the literature in both physics and philosophy, descriptions of the big bang often speak of it as if it is a first event, but the theory does not require a first event. This description is a philosophical move, not something demanded by the scientific evidence. James Hartle and Stephen Hawking consider the past cosmic time-interval to be open rather than closed at t = 0. This means that looking back to the big bang is like following the positive real numbers back to ever smaller positive numbers without ever reaching a smallest positive one. If Hartle and Hawking are correct that time is actually like this, then the big bang had no single beginning event.

Classical big bang theory is based on the assumption that the universal expansion of clusters of galaxies can be projected all the way back to a singularity, a zero volume. Yet physicists agree that the projection must become untrustworthy in the Planck era before exponential expansion began. Current science cannot speak with confidence about the nature of time within this tiny Planck era. If a theory of quantum gravity does get confirmed, it should provide more information about this Planck era, and it may even allow physicists to answer the questions, "How was the inflationary period initiated?" “What caused the big bang?” and "Did anything happen before then?"

The scientifically radical, but theologically popular remark, “God caused the big bang, but He, himself, does not exist in time” is a cryptic answer because it is not based on a well-justified and detailed theory of who God is, how He caused the big bang, and how He can exist but not be in time. It is also difficult to understand St. Augustine’s remark that “time itself was made by God.” On the other hand, for a person of faith, belief in their God is usually stronger than belief in any scientific hypothesis, or in any desire for a scientific justification of their remark about God, or in the importance of satisfying any philosopher’s demand for clarification.

Many physicists are advocating revision of the classical big bang theory in order to allow for the multiverse (or cosmic landscape or eternal inflation) in which there are multiple big bangs occurring all the time. See (Veneziano, 2006). There is no external time in which these universes exist, which means that it is not strictly correct to say "occurring all the time." We cannot make clear sense of one universe occurring before or after any other within the multiverse, although this way of speaking is compelling to the average person, and is used in this article. Also, in some of these universes there is no time dimension at all. This multiverse theory is increasingly being accepted by theoretical cosmologists.

Another cosmological theory is that the big bang represents a bounce from an earlier compression of the universe; there may be a sequence of bangs and crunches, and presently we are in a bang phase, but this theory with its infinite past time is not well accepted.

Why does the big bang theory say space exploded instead of matter-energy exploded into a pre-existing space? This is a subtle issue. If it had said matter-energy exploded but space did not, this would be awkward and complicated for several reasons. Where is the center that it expands from? Picking one would be arbitrary. If the bang were to be just an expansion of matter-energy, then we'd have to accept a pre-existing, large space for it to expand into, but this would be a complicating assumption. How large would it be? When was it created? And since clusters of galaxies can separate faster than the speed of light, we'd have to make some ad hoc change to the theory of relativity.

Infinite Time

clockThere are three ways to interpret the question of whether physical time is infinite: (a) Is time infinitely divisible? (b) Will there be an infinite amount of time in the future? (c) Was there an infinite amount of time in the past?

(a) Is time infinitely divisible? Yes, because general relativity and quantum mechanics require time to be a continuum. But the answer is no if these theories are eventually replaced by a relativistic quantum mechanics that quantizes time. “Although there have been suggestions that spacetime may have a discrete structure,” Stephen Hawking said in 1996, “I see no reason to abandon the continuum theories that have been so successful.”

(b) Will there be an infinite amount of time in the future? Probably. According to the classical theory of the big bang, the answer depends on whether events will keep occurring. The best estimate from the cosmologists these days is that the expansion of the universe is accelerating and will continue forever. There always will be the events of galaxy clusters getting farther apart, even though gravity will continue to compact much of the matter into black holes, and so the future is potentially infinite.

(c) Was there an infinite amount of time in the past? Aristotle argued “yes.” But by invoking the radical notion that God is “outside of time,” St. Augustine disagreed and said, “Time itself being part of God’s creation, there was simply no before!” (that is, no time before God created everything else but Himself). So, for theological reasons, Augustine declared time had a finite past. After advances in astronomy in the late 19th and early 20th centuries, the question of the age of the universe became a scientific question. With the acceptance of the classical big bang theory, the amount of past time was judged to be finite and less than 14 billion years. With the rejection of the classical theory's singularity at t = 0, the implication is only that the amount of time is at least 13.8 billion years. With the rise of the theories of eternal inflation and the multiverse, the estimate is that there were other big bangs before t = 0, but that there was a first big bang, and so past time is finite. For a discussion of some of the controversies, see (Veneziano, 2006) and (Nadis, 2013).

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Author Information

Bradley Dowden
Email: dowden@csus.edu
California State University, Sacramento
U. S. A.