Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy

What Science Requires of Time

Table of Contents

  1. Relativity and Quantum Mechanics
  2. The Big Bang
  3. Infinite Time
  4. Continuity of Time

Relativity and Quantum Mechanics

EinsteinScience currently requires all the basic laws of science to be time symmetric, to not distinguish between change toward the future and change toward the past. [The second law of thermodynamics is not a basic law.] Also, the basic laws cannot change from one day to another. The basic laws are the laws at the foundation of our two most fundamental physical theories, general relativity and quantum mechanics. The Big Bang theory is the leading theory of cosmology, and it, too, has consequences for our understanding of time, as we shall see.

According to relativity and quantum mechanics, spacetime is, loosely speaking, a collection of points called “spacetime locations” where the universe’s physical events occur. Spacetime is four-dimensional and a continuum, and time is a distinguished, one-dimensional sub-space of this continuum. Therefore, it is less misleading to speak of 4-dimensional spacetime as (3 + 1)-dimensional spacetime.

Any interval of time–that is, any duration–is a linear continuum of instants. So, science requires every duration to have a point-like structure that is the same structure as an interval of real numbers. This implies that between any two instants there are an aleph-one infinity of other instants, and there are no gaps in the sequence of instants. Notice that time is not quantized even in quantum mechanics.

That first response to the question “What does science require of time?” is too simple. There are complications. There is an important difference between the universe’s cosmic time and any object’s proper time; and there is an important difference between proper time and a reference frame’s coordinate time.  Unlike in special relativity, most spacetimes can not have a single coordinate system. Also, special relativity considers space-time to be a passive arena for events, but general relativity requires spacetime to be dynamic in the sense that changes in matter-energy can change the curvature of space-time itself. All physicists believe that relativity and quantum mechanics are logically inconsistent and need to be replaced by a theory of quantum gravity. A successful theory of quantum gravity is likely to have radical implications for our understanding of time; two prominent suggestions of what those implications might be are that time and space will be seen to be discrete rather than continuous, and time and space will be seen to emerge from more basic entities. But today “the best game in town” says time is not discrete and does not emerge from a more basic timeless entity.

Aristotle, Newton, and everyone else before Einstein, believed there is a frame-independent notion of duration. For example, if the time interval (duration) between two lightning flashes is 100 seconds on someone’s accurate clock, then it also is 100 seconds on your own accurate clock, even if you are flying at an incredible speed nearby or far away. Einstein rejected this piece of common sense in his 1905 special theory of relativity when he declared that the duration of a non-instantaneous event is relative to (that is, depends on) the observer’s reference frame. As Einstein expressed it, “Every reference-body has its own particular time; unless we are told the reference-body to which the statement of time refers, there is no meaning in a statement of the time of an event.” Two reference frames, or reference-bodies, that are moving relative to each other will divide spacetime differently into its time part and its space part, so they will disagree about the duration of an event that is not instantaneous. In short, your accurate clock need not agree with my accurate clock, and any two initially synchronized clocks will not stay synchronized if they are in motion relative to each other or undergo different gravitational forces.

In 1908, the mathematician Hermann Minkowski had an original idea in metaphysics regarding space and time. He was the first person to realize that spacetime is more fundamental than either time or space alone. As he put it, “Henceforth space by itself, and time by itself, are doomed to fade away into mere shadows, and only a kind of union of the two will preserve an independent reality.” The metaphysical assumption behind Minkowski’s remark is that what is “independently real” is what does not vary from one reference frame to another. What does not vary is their union, what we now call “spacetime.” It seems to follow that the division of events into the past ones, the present ones, and the future ones is also not “independently real.” One philosophical implication that Minkowski and Einstein accepted is that it’s an error to say, “Only my present is real.”

A coordinate system or reference frame is a way of representing space and time using numbers to represent spacetime points. Science confidently assigns numbers to times because, in any reference frame, the happens-before order-relation on events is faithfully reflected in the less-than order-relation on the time numbers (dates) that we assign to events. In the fundamental theories such as relativity and quantum mechanics, the values of the time variable t in any reference frame are real numbers, not merely rational numbers. Each number designates an instant of time, and time is a linear continuum of these instants ordered by the happens-before relation, similar to the mathematician’s line segment that is ordered by the less-than relation. Therefore, if these fundamental theories are correct, then physical time is one-dimensional rather than two-dimensional, and continuous rather than discrete. These features do not require time to be linear, however, because a segment of a circle is also a linear continuum, but there is no evidence for circular time, that is, for causal loops. Causal loops are worldlines that are closed curves in spacetime.

In mathematical physics, the ordering of instants by the happens-before relation, that is, by temporal precedence, is complete in the sense that there are no gaps in the sequence of instants. Unlike physical objects, physical time is believed to be infinitely divisible–divisible in the sense of the actually infinite, not merely in Aristotle’s sense of potentially infinite. Regarding the number of instants in any (non-zero) duration, time’s being a linear continuum implies the ordered instants are so densely packed that between any two there is a third, so that no instant has a next instant. In fact, time’s being a linear continuum implies that there is a nondenumerable infinity of instants between any two instants, that is, an aleph one number of instants. There is little doubt that the actual temporal structure of events can be embedded in the real numbers, but how about the converse? That is, to what extent is it known that the real numbers can be adequately embedded into the structure of the instants? The problem here is that, although time is not quantized in quantum theory, for times shorter than about 10-43 second (the so-called Planck time), science has no experimental grounds for the claim that between any two events there is a third. Instead, the justification of saying the reals can be embedded into an interval of instants is that the assumption of continuity is convenient and useful, and there are no known inconsistencies due to making this assumption, and that there are no better theories available.

Relativity theory challenges a great many of our intuitive beliefs about time. For events occurring at the same place, relativity theory implies the order is absolute (independent of the frame of reference) and so agrees with common sense, but for distant events occurring close enough in time to be in each other’s absolute elsewhere, event A can occur before event B in one reference frame, but after B in another frame, and simultaneously with B in yet another frame. For example, suppose you are sitting exactly in the middle of a moving train when lightning strikes simultaneously in the front and back of the train. You will know they were simultaneous if the light from the two strikes reaches you at the same time. But from the reference frame of a person standing still on the ground outside the train, the lightning strike at the back of the train happened first. From a frame fixed to a fast plane flying overhead in the same direction as the train and toward the front of the train, then the lightning strike at the front of the train really happened first. It was Einstein’s original idea that all three judgments are correct. The event at the front of the train really did happen first, and it really did happen second, and it really did happen at the same time as the event at the back. It’s all a matter of which reference frame is used to make the judgment. Philosophical realists infer from this that events in your absolute elsewhere are as real as any other events even though the only part of the universe that you can directly observe is your own past light cone, your backward cone.

Science impacts our understanding of time in other fundamental ways. Special relativity theory implies there is time dilation between one frame and another. For example, the faster a clock moves, the slower it runs, relative to stationary clocks. But this does not work just for clocks. If a human being moves fast, the human being also ages more slowly than someone who is stationary. Time dilation effects occur for tiny protons, too, but protons do not readily show the effects of their aging the way human bodies and clocks do.

Time dilation shows itself when a speeding twin returns to find that his (or her) Earth-bound twin has aged more rapidly. This surprising dilation result has caused some philosophers to question the consistency of relativity theory by arguing that, if motion is relative, then we could call the speeding twin “stationary” and it would follow that this twin is now the one who ages more rapidly. This argument is called the twin paradox. Experts now are agreed that the mistake is within the argument for the paradox, not within relativity theory. The twins feel different accelerations, so their two situations are not sufficiently similar to carry out the argument. The argument fails to notice the radically different relationships that each twin has to the rest of the universe as a whole. This is why one twin’s proper time is so different than the other’s.

[An object's proper time along its worldline, that is, along its path in 4-d spacetime, is the time elapsed by a clock having the same worldline. Coordinate time is the time measured by a clock at rest in the (inertial) frame. A clock isn't really measuring the time in a reference frame other than one fixed to the clock. In other words, a clock primarily measures the elapsed proper time between events that occur along its own worldline. Technically, a clock is a device that measures the spacetime interval along its own worldline. If the clock is at rest in an inertial frame, then it measures the "coordinate time." If the spacetime has no inertial frame then it can't have a normal coordinate time.]

There are two kinds of time dilation. Special relativity’s time dilation involves speed; general relativity’s also involves gravitational fields (and accelerations). Two ideally synchronized clocks need not stay in synchrony if they undergo different gravitational forces. This gravitational time dilation would be especially apparent if one of the two clocks were to approach a black hole. As a clock falls toward a black hole, time slows on approach to the event horizon, and it completely stops at the horizon (not just at the center of the hole)—relative to time on a clock that remains safely back on Earth.

If, as many physicists suspect, the microstructure of spacetime (near the Planck length which is much smaller than the diameter of a proton) is a quantum foam of changing curvature of spacetime with black holes forming and dissolving, then time loses its meaning at this small scale. The philosophical implication is that time exists only when we are speaking of regions large compared to the Planck length.

General Relativity theory may have even more profound implications for time. In 1948, the logician Kurt Gödel  discovered radical solutions to Einstein’s equations, solutions in which there are closed timelike curves due to the rotation of the universe’s matter, so that as one progresses forward in time along one of these curves one arrives back at one’s starting point. Gödel drew the conclusion that if matter is distributed so that there is Gödelian spacetime (that is, with a preponderance of galaxies rotating in one direction rather than another), then the universe has no linear time. There is no evidence that our universe has this rotation.

We’ve said little about quantum mechanics, but time reversibility is implied by quantum mechanics and not relativity theory. The process of falling into a black hole does not have an inverse process in relativity theory, but every quantum process has an inverse process, so the two major theories are inconsistent on this issue.

The Big Bang

The Big Bang is a violent explosion of spacetime that began billions of years ago. It is not an explosion within preexisting space; the explosion creates new space. The Big Bang theory in some form or other is accepted by the vast majority of astronomers, but it is not as firmly accepted as is the theory of relativity. Here is a quick story of its origin. In 1922, the Russian physicist Alexander Friedmann predicted from general relativity that the universe should be expanding. In 1925, the American astronomer Edwin Hubble made careful observations of clusters of galaxies and confirmed that they are undergoing a universal expansion, on average.

The Big Bang theory is a theory of how our universe evolved, how it expanded and cooled from this beginning. This beginning process is called the “Big Bang” and the expansion and cooling is continuing today. Atoms are not expanding; our solar system is not expanding; even the cluster of galaxies to which the Milky Way belongs is not expanding. But most every galaxy cluster is moving away from the others. It is as if the clusters are exploding away from each other, and in the future they will be very much farther away from each other. But the explosion is not occurring within space; the explosion is an explosion of space. Now, consider the past instead of the future. At any earlier moment the universe was more compact. Projecting to earlier and earlier times, and assuming that gravitation is the main force at work, the astronomers now conclude that 13.7 billion years ago (which happens to be three times the age of our planet) the universe was in a state of nearly zero size and infinite density. Because all substances cool when they expand, physicists believe the universe itself must have been cooling down over the last 13.7 billion years, and so it begin expanding when it was extremely hot. At present the average temperature of space in all very large regions has cooled to 2.7 Celsius degrees above absolute zero. Space is presently expanding at a rate of 71 kilometers per second per megaparsec, a rate that is increasing. A galaxy that is now 100 light years away from the Milky Way will, in another 13.7 billion years, be more than 200 light years away.

As far as we knew back in the 20th century, the entire universe was created in the Big Bang, and time itself came into existence “at that time.” So, the day of the Big Bang was a day without a yesterday. With the appearance of the new theories of quantum gravity in the 21st century, the question of what happened for the Big Bang has been resurrected as legitimate.

In the literature in both physics and philosophy, descriptions of the Big Bang often assume that a first event is also a first instant of time and that spacetime did not exist outside the Big Bang. This intimate linking of a first event with a first time is a philosophical move, not something demanded by the science. It is not even clear that it is correct to call the Big Bang an event. The Big Bang “event” is a singularity without space coordinates, but events normally must have space coordinates. One response to this problem is to alter the definition of “event” to allow the Big Bang to be an event. Another response, from James Hartle and Stephen Hawking, is to consider the past cosmic time-interval to be open rather than closed at t = 0. Looking back to the Big Bang is then like following the positive real numbers back to ever smaller positive numbers without ever reaching a smallest positive one. If Hartle and Hawking are correct that time is actually like this, then the universe had no beginning event.

Classical Big Bang theory is based on the assumption that the universal expansion of clusters of galaxies can be projected all the way back. Yet physicists agree that the projection must become untrustworthy in the Planck era, that is, for all times less than 10-43 second after the beginning of the Big Bang. Current science cannot speak with confidence about the nature of time within the Planck era. If a theory of quantum gravity does get confirmed, it should provide information about this Planck era, and it may even allow physicists to answer the question, “What caused the Big Bang?” and “Did anything happen before then?”

The scientifically radical, but theologically popular, answer, “God caused the Big Bang, but He, himself, does not exist in time” is a cryptic answer because it is not based on a well-justified and detailed theory of who God is, how He caused the Big Bang, and how He can exist but not be in time. It is also difficult to understand St. Augustine’s remark that “time itself was made by God.” On the other hand, for a person of faith, belief in their God is usually stronger than belief in any scientific hypothesis, or in any desire for a scientific justification of their remark about God, or in the importance of satisfying any philosopher’s demand for clarification.

Some physicists are advocating revision of the classical Big Bang theory in order to allow for the “cosmic landscape” or “multiverse,” in which there are multiple big bangs. See (Veneziano, 2006). But there is no external time in which these universes exist, which means that it is not sensible to speak of one universe occurring before or after any other within the multiverse. Also, in some of these universes there is no time dimension at all. However, this new theory is not generally accepted by theoretical cosmologists. Another cosmological theory is that the Big Bang represents a bounce from an earlier compression of the universe; there may be a sequence of bangs and crunches, and presently we are in a bang phase, that is, an expanding phase.

Infinite Time

clockThere are three ways to interpret the question of whether physical time is infinite: (a) Is time infinitely divisible? (b) Will there be an infinite amount of time in the future? (c) Was there an infinite amount of time in the past?

(a) Is time infinitely divisible? Yes, because general relativity and quantum mechanics require time to be a continuum. But the answer is no if these theories are eventually replaced by a relativistic quantum mechanics that quantizes time. “Although there have been suggestions that spacetime may have a discrete structure,” Stephen Hawking said in 1996, “I see no reason to abandon the continuum theories that have been so successful.”

(b) Will there be an infinite amount of time in the future? Probably. According to the classical theory of the Big Bang, the answer depends on whether events will keep occurring. The best estimate from the cosmologists these days is that the expansion of the universe is accelerating and will continue forever. There always will be the events of galaxy clusters getting farther apart, even though gravity will continue to compact much of the matter into black holes, and so the future is potentially infinite.

(c) Was there an infinite amount of time in the past? Aristotle argued “yes.” But by invoking the radical notion that God is “outside of time,” St. Augustine disagreed and said, “Time itself being part of God’s creation, there was simply no before!” (that is, no time before God created everything else but Himself). So, for theological reasons, Augustine declared time had a finite past. After advances in astronomy in the late 19th and early 20th centuries, the question of the age of the universe became a scientific question. With the acceptance of the classical Big Bang theory, the amount of past time was judged to be less than 14 billion years because this is when the Big Bang began. The assumption is that time does not exist independently of the spacetime relations exhibited by physical events. Recently, however, the classical Big Bang theory has been challenged. There could be an infinite amount of time in the past according to some proposed, but as yet untested, theories of quantum gravity based on the assumptions that general relativity theory fails to hold for infinitesimal volumes. These theories imply that the beginning of the Big Bang was actually an inflationary expansion from a pre-existing physical state. There was never a singularity. In that case our Big Bang could be just one bang among other bangs in a multiverse or landscape. If so, then is the past of this multiverse finite or infinite? Cosmologists do not agree on that issue. For a discussion of the controversies, see (Veneziano, 2006) and (Nadis, 2013).

There have been interesting speculations on how conscious life could continue forever, despite the fact that the available energy for life will decrease as the universe expands, and despite the fact that any life swept up into a black hole will reach the center of the hole in a finite time at which point death will be certain. For an introduction to these speculations, see (Krauss and Starkman, 2002).

Continuity of Time

In the classical theories of relativity and quantum mechanics, time is not quantized, but is a continuum. However, if certain, as yet untested, theories attempting to unify relativity and quantum mechanics are correct, then there is a shortest duration for any possible event (about 10-43 second), and time is digital rather than analog.

Author Information

Bradley Dowden
Email: dowden@csus.edu
California State University, Sacramento
U. S. A.

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