Nicholas Rescher (1928- ) is a prominent representative of contemporary pragmatism, but, unlike most analytic thinkers, he managed to establish himself as a systematic philosopher. In particular, he built a system of “pragmatic idealism” that combines elements of the European continental idealism with American pragmatism. One of the most salient features of Rescher¹s work is the breadth of topics with which he has dealt, including logic in its various forms, epistemology, the philosophy of science, metaphysics, process philosophy, ethics and political philosophy. He has written about 400 articles and 100 books.
In his system of pragmatic idealism, the activity of the human mind plays a key role and makes a fundamental contribution to knowledge, while “valid” knowledge contributes to practical success. Rescher also defends a coherence theory of truth in a manner differing in a significant way from that endorsed by classical idealism. He draws an original distinction between a pragmatism of the left and a pragmatism of the right. The first is a flexible type of pragmatism that endorses a greatly enhanced cognitive relativism. The second envisions the pragmatist enterprise as a source of cognitive security. Rescher sees Charles S. Peirce, Clarence I. Lewis and himself as adherents to the pragmatism of the right, and William James, F. S. C. Schiller and Richard Rorty as representatives of the pragmatism of the left, with John Dewey standing in a middle of the road position.
In the philosophy of science, Rescher claims, against any form of instrumentalism and many postmodern authors as well, that natural science can validate a plausible commitment to the actual existence of its theoretical entities. Scientific conceptions aim at what really exists in the world, but only hit it imperfectly and “well off the mark.” What we can get is, at most, a rough consonance between our scientific ideas and reality itself.
Rescher recognizes that moral rules are frequently part of the customs of a community, but he denies that morality consists in conformity to mores or in benefit-maximization.
Nicholas Rescher was born on July 15, 1928, in the German town of Hagen, Westphalia. He is one of the many contemporary American philosophers whose life began in a foreign country, and who then pursued a successful career in the United States. Rescher obtained his Ph.D. in Philosophy from Princeton University in 1951 at the age of twenty-two. He was the youngest person ever to do so in that department. He is also among the most prolific of contemporary scholars, having written more than 400 articles and 100 books, ranging over many areas of philosophy, over a dozen of which have been translated into foreign languages.
He was awarded the Alexander von Humboldt Prize for Humanistic Scholarship in 1984, the Cardinal Mercier Prize in 2005, and the American Catholic Philosophical Society’s Aquinas medal in 2007. He has served as a President of the American Philosophical Association, American Catholic Philosophy Association, American G. W. Leibniz Society, C. S. Peirce Society, and the American Metaphysical Society. He has held visiting lectureships at Oxford, Constance, Salamanca, Munich, and Marburg; and his work has been recognized by seven honorary degrees from universities on three continents. Rescher serves on the editorial board of Process Studies, the principal academic journal for both process philosophy and theology. He has for many years been teaching at the University of Pittsburgh with a status of University Professor. His life is detailed in an Autobiography (Frankfurt: Ontos Verlag, 2007).
Rescher has written on a wide range of topics, including logic, epistemology, the philosophy of science, metaphysics, and the philosophy of value. He is best known as an advocate of pragmatism and, more recently, of process philosophy. Over the course of his six-decade research career, Rescher has established himself as a systematic philosopher of the old style, and the author of a system of pragmatic idealism that combines elements of continental idealism with American pragmatism. To this end, he:
Apart from this larger program, Rescher has made significant contributions to:
Rescher draws an important distinction between a more flexible “pragmatism of the left” and a more conservative “pragmatism of the right.” Referring to a famous article by Arthur Lovejoy, he notes that there seem to be as many pragmatisms as pragmatists. Usually, however, those who are interested in pragmatism from an historical point of view tend to forget that, from the beginning, a substantial polarity is present in this tradition of thought. It is a dichotomy between what Rescher calls “pragmatism of the left,” namely a flexible type of pragmatism which endorses a greatly enhanced cognitive relativism, and a “pragmatism of the right,” namely a different position that sees the pragmatist stance as a source of cognitive security. Both positions are eager to assure pluralism in the cognitive enterprise and in the concrete conduct of human affairs, but the meaning they attribute to the term “pluralism” is not the same. Rescher sees C. S. Peirce, C. I. Lewis and himself as adherents of the pragmatism of the right, and William James, F. S. C. Schiller and Richard Rorty as representatives of the pragmatism of the left, with John Dewey standing somehow in a middle of the road position.
The position of the so-called pragmatists of the left is clear: one just has to read Rorty’s works to see where it ends up, from both a cognitive and a social-political viewpoint. But what does the pragmatism of the right really come to? Parochial diversity is something that a post-modern pragmatist such as Rorty gladly accepts in order to achieve results that are, at the same time, subjectivistic and relativistic. On the other hand, even a Rescherian pragmatist sees practical efficacy as the cornerstone of our endeavors, but at the same time he takes efficacy to be the best instrument we have at our disposal for achieving objectification.
Objective pragmatism — or the pragmatism of the right, as Rescher calls it — implies that (a) our social-linguistic world evolved out of natural reality; (b) this social-linguistic world acquires an increasing autonomy; (c) between the social and the natural worlds there is no ontological line of separation, but just a functional one; (d) however, the accessibility to natural reality is only granted by the tools that the social-linguistic world provides us with; (e) this means that our knowledge of natural reality is always tentative and mediated by our conceptual capacities; (f) there is no need to draw relativistic conclusions from this situation, because the presence of an objective reality that underlies the data at hand puts upon personal desires objective constraints that we are able to overcome at the verbal level, but not in the sphere of rational deliberations implementing actions.
Rescher’s definition of ontological objectivity is the following: Objectivity is not something we infer from the data; it is something we do and must presuppose. It is something that we postulate or presume from the very outset of our dealings with people’s claims about the world’s facts – our own included. Its epistemic status is not that of an empirical discovery but that of a presupposition whose ultimate justification is a transcendental argument from the very possibility of the projects of communication and inquiry as we standardly conduct them.
The specification at stake here is just the opposite of objectivity conceived of as something that we merely infer from empirical data (maybe with a little abstractive effort). But, on the other side, nor can it be equated with a classical idealistic viewpoint, according to which objectivity is something that our mind simply creates in the process of reflection. Objectivity is, in this case, a sort of cross-product of the encounter between our mind-shaped tools and capacities, and a surrounding reality made of things that are real in the classical meaning of the term: they are there and in no way can be said to be mind-created. But a final — and quite important — qualification is in order: the very mode in which we see these real things, and conceive of (and speak about) them is indeed mind-dependent. Science itself gives us some crucial insights in this direction, since it shows that we see, say, tables and trees in a certain way which, however, does not match the image that scientific instruments are able to attain.
On the other hand rationality is for Rescher a matter of idealization. Although we must admit our natural origins and evolutionary heritage, we must give way as well to the recognition that there is indeed something that makes us unique. Only human beings are able to “gaze towards idealities” and to somehow detach themselves from “the actualities on an imperfect world.” Just like objectivity, rationality is the expression of mankind’s capacity to see not only how things actually are, but also how they might have been and how they could turn out to be if we were to take some course of action rather than another. Thus the concept of possibility plays a key role.
Rescher endorses a coherentist approach to truth. Why? The answer is, first of all, systemic and holistic: he needs a coherence theory because the older and more classical correspondence theories do not fit into the comprehensive philosophical system he managed to build. But there is also a more theoretical reply, because he believes a coherence theory has a great number of fertile applications, such as in the methodology of the use of historical sources, the analysis of counterfactual conditionals, and the problems of inductive logic. As he recognizes in The Coherence Theory of Truth, the first impetus towards developing a coherentist approach to truth came from a theory of inference from inconsistent premises constructed for the analysis of counterfactual conditionals.
Rescher’s point of departure is the distinction between “definitional” and “criterial” theories of truth, that is, between what truth is and how we acquire truth. The definitional theories try to provide a definition of the expression “is true” as a characteristic of propositions. The criterial ones aim, instead, at specifying the test-conditions which allow us to determine whether (or not) there is warrant to apply “is true” to propositions. Rescher prefers the second alternative and, once again, the reasons for such a preference are typically pragmatic: The criterial approach to truth is decision-oriented. Its aim is not to specify in the abstract what “is true” means, but rather to put us into a position to implement and apply the concept by instructing us as to the circumstances under which there is rational warrant to characterize or class something (that is, some proposition) as true. Why bother with a criterion once a definition is at hand? To know the meaning of a word or concept is only half the battle: We want to be able to apply it, too. It does little good to know how terms like “speed limit” or “misdemeanor” are defined in the abstract if we are left in the dark as to the conditions of their application.
According to Rescher we must address a basic question: which kind of evolution are we referring to when talking of evolutionary epistemology? If we take evolution to be an undifferentiated concept, such that no useful distinction can be found in it, we are — according to our author — on a wrong track. The evolutionary “pattern” is certainly one, but for sure this should not lead us to assume that the specific characteristics of mankind must be left out of the picture, either because they are not important or because no specifically human characteristic is admitted. Rescher’s evolutionary framework, as it always happens in his philosophical system, is pluralistic and multi-sided.
The evolutionary pathway provided by the route of intelligence is one of the alternative ways of coping within nature that are available to biological organisms. (Other ways include toughness, multiplicity and isolation). Human beings, thus, can be said to have evolved to fill a possible ecological niche left free for intelligent creatures.
There are, however, many ways to look at the evolution of mankind. Rescher stresses that, after all, intelligence has evolved not because it aids the survival of its possessors within nature. It arose because it represents one effective means of survival. Intelligence is our functional substitute for the numerousness of termites, the ferocity of lions, or the toughness of microorganisms. So, it might even be said that this is our specific manner of fighting the battle for survival: we would not be here if our intelligence-led rationality were not survival-conducive. But does all this mean that intelligence is an inevitable feature of conscious organic life? The answer to such a question is crucial and, as long as Rescher is concerned, is negative.
The scheme we get by adopting this stance is, thus, more complex than the reductionistic one endorsed by materialist philosophers, since any element of the biological sphere is matched by an analogous element located in a sphere that may be defined as “sociological-intellectual,” along the following lines. At the biological level we have:
(A) Biological mutation;
(B) Reproductive elimination of traits through their non-realization in an individual’s progeny; and, eventually,
(C) One’s physical progeny.
The same steps can be traced at the sociological-intellectual level:
(A1) Procedural variation;
(B1) Reproductive elimination of processes through their lapsed transmissions to one’s successors (for example, children or students);
(C1) Those individuals whom one influences.
The differences between (A)-(C) and (A1)-(C1) are clearly visible but, no doubt, the same process is at issue in both cases, since both involve structures that are maintained over time.
No one can seriously doubt that there are strong idealistic features in Rescher’s philosophy. For example, he never tires of stressing that the conceptual apparatus we employ itself makes a creative contribution to our view of the world, and his holistic stance is clearly influenced by Hegel and Bradley, thinkers who have long been quite unpopular within American analytic philosophy. But idealism is just one element in a broader framework where pragmatism plays the key role, and other important components are detectable as well in his thought (for instance naturalism). No doubt Leibniz, Kant, Hegel and Bradley are all philosophers who deeply influenced his outlook. But, still, the central figure in Rescher’s personal Olympus is (and will remain) Charles S. Peirce. Here is how Rescher recalls how the idealistic perspective became a central feature of his comprehensive philosophical outlook:
I recall well how the key ideas of my idealistic theory of natural laws – of “lawfulness as imputation” – came to me in 1968 during work on this project while awaiting the delivery of Arabic manuscripts in the Oriental Reading Room of the British Museum. It struck me that what a law states is a mere generalization, but what marks this generalization as something special in our sight — and renders it something we see as a genuine law of nature — is the role that we assign to it in inference. Lawfulness is thus not a matter of what the law-statement says, but how it is used in the systematization of knowledge — the sort of role we impute to it. These ideas provided an impetus to idealist lines of thought and marked the onset of my commitment to a philosophical idealism which teaches that the mind is itself involved in the conceptual constitution of the objects of our knowledge. (Instructive Journey: An Essay in Autobiography, pages 172-173)
It should be noted that Rescher immediately tied these idealistic insights to the philosophy of science, a sector that has always been at the core of his interests. The aforementioned statements, in fact, led him to the conclusion that scientific discovery, Galileo notwithstanding, is not a matter of simply “reading” what is written in the book of nature, but is rather the outcome of the interaction between nature on the one side, and human mind on the other. The contribution which mind gives to the construction of “our science” is at least as important as that provided by nature: no science as we know it would be possible without the specific contribution of the mind.
What is the source of our ideas according to his philosophical outlook? Locke, for instance, remarked that we can only think about ideas, their source being either sensation or observation of the internal operations of our mind. Taking this path we can certainly avoid the problems connected to metaphysical skepticism, but ideas become our only “real” point of reference, which is not such a wonderful solution from an empiricist point of view. According to the verifiability principle held by the logical positivists, on the other hand, the meaningfulness of a statement is strictly tied to the existence of some possible set of observations that, were they to be ever made, would determine the truth of the statement itself. In this case metaphysical skepticism could be avoided by equating metaphysics with non-sense, but the verifiability principle created other, unexpected problems. Scientific laws, in fact, clearly resist the application of the verifiability principle, and the price to be paid for the elimination of metaphysics seemed, to say the least, too high. So the problem of demarcating science from metaphysics, which has been deemed tremendously important by some sectors of early twentieth century philosophy, remains pressing.
Detaching himself from the mainstream of American analytic philosophy which, under the influence of the logical positivists, had been largely dominated by empiricist and positivist trends of thought, Rescher in the early 1970’s launched his project of rehabilitating idealism. Taking notice of the fact that idealism had been effectively dead in Anglo-American philosophy for more than a generation, he tells us that, “this eclipse of an important sector of philosophical tradition seems to be entirely unjustified on the merits.”
“Idealism” is a sort of umbrella-term that covers a large variety of trends and sub-trends. Each of them is somehow connected to the others, but disagreements within the idealistic field have always been strong. Rescher readily recognizes this fact, providing a general scheme in which all the various idealistic trends can be inserted. The fundamental distinction to be made is between the “ontological” versions of idealism and the “epistemic” ones. Ontological versions imply that everything there is arises causally from, or is supervenient upon, the operations of mind. Epistemic versions are less strongly committed because they rule out the thesis that mind creates the world in toto, be it natural or social, and content themselves to point out the intimate correlatedness between our mind and the world-as-we-know it. Rescher says explicitly that his conceptual idealism belongs to the epistemic version of the theory, and he characterizes it as follows: “Conceptual idealism [states that] any fully adequate descriptive characterization of the nature of the physical (‘material’) reality must make reference to mental operations; some recourse to verbal characteristics or operations is required within the substantive content of an adequate account of what it is to be real.”
Another important consideration relates to Rescher’s attitude towards Kant and his transcendental idealism. Kant’s presence is clearly perceivable in our author’s writings, but his Kant is always Kant viewed and interpreted through the lenses of pragmatism (which in this case are Peircean lenses). On the one hand Rescher accepts the Kantian view that our knowledge is strongly determined by the a priori elements present in our conceptual schemes, and that they indeed have an essential function as long as our interpretation of reality is concerned. On the other hand, he tends to see these aprioristic elements as resting on a contingent basis, and validated on pragmatic rather than necessitarian considerations. The mind certainly makes a great contribution towards shaping reality-as-we-see-it, but the very presence of the mind itself can be explained by adopting an evolutionary point of view.
It is only too natural that when the man of the street reads about the results of scientific discoveries he takes them to be descriptions of “real” nature. Why should different thoughts come to his mind, given the impressive results that science was able to attain in the last few centuries? It should be noted, however, that not only philosophers, but also even many scientists have often denied the validity of the picture that the man of the street takes more or less for granted. Many examples could be provided in this regard, as any standard text on the history of science might easily confirm. In the past century uncertainty about the content of our theories has grown fast, together with the feeling that there are alternative theories that can account equally well for all possible observations. Clearly the threat of relativism arises at this point, even though many authors nowadays no longer take relativism to be a threat, but just a fact of the matter.
Obviously things were different when logical positivism still was the dominant — and, in many cases, even the only — doctrine in philosophy of science. In that case the main purpose was to individuate the immutable models that lie beyond concrete scientific practice, because it was commonly held by the main representatives of this neopositivism that science is objective and progressive, in the cumulative sense of the term. Intersubjectivity was granted through recourse to the scientific language, purportedly believed to be neutral, free of errors and misunderstandings and, thus, available to every observer. Formal logic became then something much more important than a simple instrument, since its task was supposed to be that of “capturing” intersubjectivity by means of a language constructed in the purest form possibly available to human beings, leaving aside all the unpleasant distortions that our natural languages bring with them.
At this point we can note that scientific realism (and the nature of scientific knowledge at large) is a theme where the originality of Rescher’s position clearly emerges. Certainly he is very distant from the received view of logical empiricism. Looking back to the years of his philosophical formation, he says: I was thus led back to take a rather different view of the technical preoccupations in the minutiae of formal analysis which came to the forefront in the postwar years. It seemed to me that the passion for the detailed analysis of small-scale side issues was getting out of hand. All too often, philosophers were using their technical tools on those issues of detail congenial to their application, rather than concentrating them on inherently important matters. Technical questions became preoccupations in their own right, rather than because of any significant bearing on the central problems of the field.
Rescher’s increasing distance from the neopositivist model, however, should not lead one to think that he got closer to the more recent, and more fashionable, post-empiricist trend of thought. He argues, against any form of instrumentalism and many postmodern authors as well, that natural science can indeed validate a plausible commitment to the actual existence of its theoretical entities. Scientific conceptions aim at what really exists in the world, but only hit it imperfectly and “well off the mark.” What we can get is, at most, a rough consonance between our scientific ideas and reality itself. This statement should not sound surprising, if only one recalls Rescher’s proclaimed conceptual idealism and his unwillingness to trace a precise borderline between ontology and epistemology.
Furthermore, Rescher’s aim is to replace Charles S. Peirce’s “long-run convergence” theory of scientific progress by a more modest position geared to increasing success in scientific applications, especially in matters of prediction and control. This dimension of applicative efficacy is something real, and can hardly be denied from a rational point of view. He goes on arguing that the connection between adequacy and applicative success in questions of scientific theorizing leads, in turn, to a pragmatist-flavored philosophy of science. He also states very clearly that “perfection” (the completion of the project) is, in principle, unfeasible. This means that his ideas are opposed to all those scientific projects whose aim is the search for a “final” theory.
So we have a general picture of this kind: In attempting answers to our questions about how things stand in the world, science offers (or at any rate, both endeavors and purports to offer) information about the world. The extent to which science succeeds in this mission is, of course, disputable. The theory of sub-atomic matter is unquestionably a “mere theory,” but it could not help us to explain those all too real atomic explosions if it is not a theory about real substances. Only real objects can produce real effects. There exist no “hypothetical” or “theoretical entities” at all, only entities, plus hypotheses and theories about them which may be right or wrong, well-founded or ill-founded. The theoretical entities of science are introduced not for their own interest but for a utilitarian mission, to furnish the materials of causal explanation for the real comportment of real things. Thus our inability to claim that natural science as we understand it depicts reality correctly must not be taken to mean that science is a merely practical device, a mere instrument for prediction and control that has no bearing on describing “the nature of things.” What science says is descriptively committal in making claims regarding “the real world,” but the tone of voice in which it proffers these claims always is (or should be) provisional and tentative.
So we can never assume that a particular scientific theory, for instance, Einstein’s relativity theory, gives us the true picture of reality, since we know perfectly well from the history of science that, in a future we cannot actually foresee, it will be replaced by a better theory. And it should be noted, moreover, that this future theory will be better for future scientists, but not the best in absolute terms, since its final destiny is to be displaced by yet another theory.
Rescher’s conception of scientific realism is thus strictly tied to his distinction between reality-as-such and reality-as-we-think-of-it. He argues that there is indeed little justification for believing that our present-day natural science describes the world as it really is, and this fact does not allow us to endorse an absolute and unconditioned scientific realism. In other words, if we claim that the theoretical entities of current science correctly pick up the “furniture of the world,” we run into the inevitable risk of hypostatizing something, that is, our present science, that is only a historically contingent product of humankind, valid in this particular period of its cultural evolution. Rescher’s view is, instead, that “a realistic awareness of scientific fallibilism precludes the claim that the furnishings of the real world are exactly as our science states them to be — that electrons “actually are just what the latest Handbook of Physics claims them to be.”
But what about future science? We might in fact be tempted to say that, since present-day science is really bound to be imperfect and incomplete, perhaps future science will do the job, thus accomplishing that project of “perfected science” that the logical positivists loved so much. Even in this case, however, many problems arise. First of all, just which future are we talking about? There is indeed no reason to believe that tomorrow’s science will be very different from ours as long as its capacity of providing the “correct” picture of reality is concerned. The fact is, he argues, that scientific theories always have a finite lifespan. This is so for every human creation (and science is a human product, in any possible sense of the term), so that, “as something that comes into being within time, the passage of time will also bear it away.” While we can certainly claim that the aims of science are stable, it should honestly be recognized that its questions and answers are not.
Ideal science, even when its realization is referred to the future, looks more like a philosophical utopia than a feasible accomplishment (even though utopias, as Rescher often recognizes, are indeed useful when they are viewed as essentially “regulative” ideas). Perfected science, thus, is not “what will emerge when,” but “what would emerge if,” and many realistically unachievable conditions must be provided in order to obtain such a highly desirable result. This means that our cognitive enterprise must be pursued in an imperfect world, and the strong realistic thesis that science faithfully describes the real world should be taken for what it is: a matter of intent. The only type of scientific realism that looks reasonable to Rescher is a scientific realism viewed in idealistic perspective, in which what is at stake is a sort of “ideal science” that no wise men can claim to possess.
The real alternative at stake here is the following: logic as “doctrine” vs. logic as “instrument.” Rescher does not deny that logic has, in this particular regard, a dual nature. From the doctrinal point of view it is clearly a body of theses or, even better, a systematic codification of those special propositions defined as “logical truths.” At the methodological level, instead, it must be seen as an operational code for conducting sound reasoning. Having once again recourse to historical considerations, our author observes that the distinction at issue carries back to the old dispute — carried on throughout late antiquity and the Middle Ages — as to whether logic is to be considered as a part of knowledge or as an instrument for its development. The best minds of the day insisted that the proper answer is simply that logic is both of these — at once a theory with a body of theses of its own, and a tool for testing arguments to determine whether they are good or bad.
A pragmatic conception of logic, however, leads him to view its instrumental-methodological character as primary with respect to the doctrinal features. All this follows quite naturally from what we said above, because, for a pragmatically oriented thinker, logic’s task lies, first of all, in systematizing and rationalizing the practice of reasoning in all the contexts (theoretical included) where human beings usually draw inferences. Logical rules, in turn, are not supposed to have an abstract and formalistic character, because in that case they cannot be attuned to human practices (be they theoretical or instrumental). It is interesting to note that this approach is not distant from some insights contained in the works of the second Wittgenstein, where language is no longer taken to be an ideal entity endowed with some sort of “essence,” but rather a set of social practices that are used in order to satisfy men’s concrete needs. Our models of inference thus become the products of social practices, while the social dimension pertains to language in each of its many characteristics and features. In other words, our rules for drawing inferences are essentially practical and not formal; they are rules that allow (or do not allow) us to perform a certain kind of action.
For Rescher a conceptual scheme for operation in the factual domain is always correlative with a Weltanschauung — a view of how things work in the world. And the issue of historical development becomes involved at this juncture, seeing that such a fact-committal scheme is clearly a product of temporal evolution. Our conceptions of things are a moving rather than a fixed target for analysis. The startling conclusion is that there are assertions in a conceptual scheme A that are simply not available in another conceptual scheme B, because no equivalent in it may be found. This view also allows him to challenge Donald Davidson when he says that, “we get a new out of an old scheme when the speakers of a language come to accept as true an important range of sentences they previously took to be false.” The point at stake, in fact, is different, since Rescher answers that a change of scheme is not just a matter of saying things differently, but rather of saying altogether different things.
In other words, a scheme A may be committed to phenomena that another scheme B cannot even envisage: Galenic physicians, for instance, had absolutely nothing to say about bacteria and viruses because those entities lay totally beyond their conceptual dimension. Where one scheme is eloquent, Rescher says, the other is altogether silent. This means, moreover, that our classical and bivalent logic of the True and False is not much help in such a context. Some assertions that are deemed to be true in a certain scheme may have no value whatsoever in another scheme, so that we need to formalize this truth-indeterminacy by having recourse, say, to a many-valued logical system in which, besides the classical T and F, a third (Indeterminate) value I is present. We have, in sum, a more complex picture than Davidson’s. Rescher observes that in brushing aside the idea of different conceptual schemes we incur the risk of an impoverishment in our problem-horizons. So, to deny that different conceptual schemes exist is absurd.
Even in the social field, for Rescher, context-relativization means neither irrationalism nor indifferentism. For sure we must recognize the presence of different perspectives, but on the other hand our experiential indications provide us with criteria for making a rational choice. The fact that no appropriate universal diet exists does not lead to the conclusion that we can eat anything, and the absence of a globally correct language does not mean that we can choose a language at random for communicating with others in a particular context. For these reasons he concludes that an individual need not be intimidated by the fact of disagreement — it makes perfectly good sense for people to do their rational best towards securing evidentiated beliefs and justifiable choices without undue worry about whether or not others disagree.
To what extent are Rescher’s doubts about the notion of consensus applicable to the real social and political situations? Consensus is deemed by many authors to be a sine qua non condition for achieving a benign political and social order, while its absence is often viewed as a premonitory symptom of chaos. Needless to say the feelings are usually strong in this regard, because political and social philosophy has a more direct impact on our daily life than other such traditional sectors of the philosophical inquiry as, say, metaphysics or epistemology.
What deserves to be pointed out is that the search for consensus has many concrete contraindications, which can mainly be drawn from history. Think, for instance, of how Hitler gained power in Germany in the 1930’s. As a matter of fact he obtained a resounding victory through democratic election, because he was able to make the political platform of the Nazi party consensually accepted by a large majority of citizens. It would be foolish, however, to draw the conclusion that Hitler and the Nazis were right just because they were good consensus-builders. On the contrary, the United States is a good example of a democratically thriving society that can dispense with consensus, and where dissensus is deemed to be productive (at least to a certain extent). Another striking fact is that the former Soviet Union was, instead, a typically consensus-seeking society.
Homogeneity granted by consensus is not the mark of a benign social order, since this role is more likely to be played by a dissensus-dominated situation that is in turn able to accommodate diversity of opinions. It follows, among other things, that we should be very careful not to characterize the consensus endorsed by majority opinion as intrinsically rational. In the industrialized nations of the Western world the power of the media in building up consensus is notoriously great. It may, and does, happen sometimes, however, that the power of the media in assuring consensus is used to support bad politicians, who repay the favor by paying attention to sectorial rather than to general interests. It is thus easily seen that consensus is not an objective that deserves to be pursued no matter what.
All this seems plausible and reasonable to Rescher, despite the fact that many theorists nowadays continue to view consensus as an indispensable component of a good and stable social order. It is the case, for example, with Jürgen Habermas. The Marxist roots of Habermas’ thought explain why the German philosopher is so eager to have the activities of the people harmonized thanks to their interpersonal agreement about ends and means. The basis of agreement is thus both collective and abstractly universal. Another Rescher’s key word, “acquiescence,” needs at this point be introduced. Given that the insistence on the pre-requisite of communal consensus is simply unrealistic, we must come to terms with concrete situations, that is, with facts as presented by real life. If, according to contractarian lines of thought, we take justice to be the establishment of arrangements that are (or, even better, would be) reached in idealized conditions, then we cannot help but note that justice is not a feature of our imperfect world. “Life is unjust” is bound to be our natural conclusion, together with the acknowledgement that real-life politics is the art of the possible. It is obvious as well, however, that even in real-life politics we constantly need to make decisions and to take some course of action. How should we behave, then, given the fact that the so-called communal consensus turned out to be unachievable?
The answer is that a modern and democratic society looks for social accommodation, which means that it always tries to devise methods for letting its members live together in peace even in those inevitable cases when a subgroup prevails over another. As Rescher as it, the choice is not just between either the agreement of the whole group, on the one hand, or the lordship of some particular subgroup, on the other hand. Accommodation through general acquiescence is a perfectly practicable mode for making decisions in the public order and resolving its conflicts. And, given the realities of the situation in a complex and diversified society, it has significant theoretical and practical advantages over its more radical alternatives. The reader will not find it difficult to recognize that this is just the strategy constantly adopted within the democratic societies of the Western world, which, in turn, distinguishes them from all forms of tyrannies and monocratic (one-person) forms of government.
Acquiescence is thus a matter of mutual restraint, a sort of “live and let live” concrete politics that permits any individual or subgroup belonging in a larger group to avoid fight in order to gain respect for its own position. Thus acquiescence, and not consensual agreement, turns out to be the key factor for building a really democratic society, Rescher argues. In a situation like that of the former Yugoslavia, for instance, it would be foolish to ask for consensus given the historical and ethnical roots of war today. But a search for acquiescence would be much less foolish, with all factions giving up something in order to avoid even greater damages and losses.
If we want to be pluralists in the true spirit of Western democratic thought, we must abandon the quest for a monolithic and rational order, together with the purpose of maximizing the number of people who approve what the government, say, does. On the contrary, we should have in mind an acquiescence-seeking society where the goal is that of minimizing the number of people who strongly disapprove of what is being done. We should never forget, Rescher claims, that the idea that “all should think alike” is both dangerous and anti-democratic, as history shows with plenty of pertinent examples. Since consensus is an absolute unlikely to be achieved in concrete life, a difference must be drawn between “being desirable” and “being essential.” All in all, it can be said that it qualifies at most for the former status. The general conclusion is that consensus is no more than one positive factor that has to be weighed on the scale along with many others.
Rescher recognizes that cultural, social and ethical diversity are a fact of life rather than a mere hypothesis. Social scientists have always stressed the elements of differentiation across social groups, and especially sociologists are ready to pick up strong differences as long as moral beliefs of various social groups are concerned. From this, most social scientists and even several philosophers draw the conclusion that cultural relativism is unavoidable: since each group has a different way of dealing with beliefs, relationships, and so forth, it follows that there is no unique criterion for evaluating actions. Or, to put it in a slightly different way, we are provided with no “trans-cultural standard” which can be deemed to be valid for all conceptual schemes. Social scientists and philosophers who find the hermeneutic stance congenial will most likely be in favor of the aforementioned conclusion, because it shows that cultures are unique and cannot be investigated from a general viewpoint.
It goes without saying that the ethical side of relativism is strictly connected to all its other branches (conceptual, epistemological, etc.), since the real problem at stake here is the search for cross-cultural “universals” which could explain the fact, often denied by relativists, that we share as rational beings many common features (which, of course, does not mean to deny that there are many and important differences, too).
So we must wonder about the real nature of norms and values: are they something that can be only referred to particular social groups, in the sense that we can only speak of norms and values as referred to group A, or B, or C? Or are we authorized to talk about kinds of “moral universals” that are the true foundations of any normative system?
It would seem that anthropology, and social science in general, has a message for us concerning human variability, but it is not exactly the one endorsed by radical cultural relativism. Rather, the correct conclusion appears to be that there is both uniformity and diversity across human cultures at the level of concepts, beliefs, and norms, sasys Rescher. Diversity shows the creativeness of human capacity for developing cultural instruments. Uniformity, instead, reflects both the biological constants in human life and the common features of the human existential situation.
Relativists of all sorts try to solve the problem by equating “morality” on the one side and “mores” on the other. Rescher notes in this regard that cultural relativism is the doctrine that societies and cultures have their own customs and folkways, which are so many different and in principle equally valid ways of transacting their business of everyday life. Moral relativism is the theory which holds, analogously, that there are different and discordant but in principle equally valid moralities. It is one of the widely pervasive convictions of our day that the former, plausible mode of relativism somehow entails the latter, that one group’s moral goodness is another’s moral wickedness — it all simply “lies in the eyes of the beholder”.
Rescher goes on noting that social scientists are especially drawn to this sort of approach, which in his opinion amounts to “imperialistic power grabbing.” Thus anthropologists, who study norms and customs, claim that morality belongs to their discipline because moral rules are nothing more than norms and customs. The same happens with the economists, who study the operations of rational self-interest in the production and distribution of goods; they, too, claim that morality belongs to their discipline, because moral rules are no more than procedures that maximize social utility and serve “the greatest good of the greatest number.” Rescher disagrees.
There is in his view a “wide gulf” that separates morality from mere mores. Many social theorists endorsedrelativism from a variety of anthropological, sociological, and ideological perspectives. Relativism has become so successful that it is often seen as a sort of truism that does not even need a defense. For Rescher, however, the rejection of relativism and the articulation of plausible arguments for absolutism are indeed essential to any meaningful legitimation of the moral project. They represent his main task, meaning that the moral project must itself be legitimated “in terms of morality-external values,” that is, values which, like personhood and responsibility for self-realization, are fully in agreement with moral concerns. Instead, values as social conformity or personal advantage are not consonant with such concerns.
Rescher’s strategy is twofold. On the one side he is ready to admit that moral rules are frequently part of the customs of a community or that moral behavior advances the welfare interests of the social group or the individual agent. On the other, however, he firmly rejects the view according to which morality consists in conformity to mores or in benefit-maximization. In other words, morality cannot adequately be accounted for in terms of values that imply no characteristically moral bearing. For this reason Rescher claims that the anthropological route to moral relativism is highly problematic. There is no difficulty whatever about the idea of different social customs, but the idea of different moralities faces insuperable difficulties. The case is much like that of saying that the tribe whose counting practices is based on the sequence: “one, two, many” has a different arithmetic from ourselves. To do anything like justice to the facts one would have to say that they do not have arithmetic at all, but just a peculiar, and very rudimentary way of counting. And similarly with those exotic tribesmen. On the given evidence, they do not have a different morality, but rather their culture has not developed to a point where they have a morality at all. If they think that it is acceptable to engage in practices like the sacrifice of firstborn girl children, then their grasp on the conception of morality is, on the face of it, somewhere between inadequate and nonexistent.
The conclusion is thus clear. Anti-absolutism must take a flexible and non-dogmatic stance if it wants to be coherent enough, while what it does today often is the opposite. The global rejection of absolutes has gone too far, and a middle of the road position is indeed mandatory. As Rescher notes, the very antipathy to dogmatic uniformity that characterizes the era’s sensibilities will, or should, militate against an absolutistic position in relation to philosophical absolutes. There is good reason to see the anti-absolutism of 20th century thought as misguided and in need of replacement by a position that is far less doctrinaire.
Rescher has published more than 100 books as well as more than 400 essays, chapters, and reviews. Below is a list of selected books:
University of Genoa, Italy
Last updated: July 31, 2009 | Originally published: