Paul Ricoeur was among the most impressive philosophers of the 20th century continental philosophers, both in the unusual breadth and depth of his philosophical scholarship and in the innovative nature of his thought. He was a prolific writer, and his work is essentially concerned with that grand theme of philosophy: the meaning of life. Ricoeur’s “tensive” style focuses on the tensions running through the very structure of human being. His constant preoccupation was with a hermeneutic of the self, fundamental to which is the need we have for our lives to be made intelligible to us. Ricoeur’s flagship in this endeavor is his narrative theory. Though a Christian philosopher whose work in theology is well-known and respected, his philosophical writings do not rely upon theological concepts, and are appreciated by non-Christians and Christians alike. His most widely read works are The Rule of Metaphor, From Text to Action, and Oneself As Another, and the three volumes of Time and Narrative. His other significant books include Hermeneutics and the Human Sciences, Conflict of Interpretations, The Symbolism of Evil, Freud and Philosophy, and Freedom and Nature: The Voluntary and the Involuntary.
Jean Paul Gustave Ricoeur was born on February 27, 1913, at Valence, France, and he died in Chatenay-Malabry, France on May 20, 2005. He lost both his parents within his first few years of his life and was raised with his sister Alice by his paternal grandparents, both of whom were devout Protestants. Ricoeur was a bookish child and successful student. He was awarded a scholarship to study at the Sorbonne in 1934, and afterwards was appointed to his first teaching position at Colmar, Alsace. While at the Sorbonne he first met Gabriel Marcel, who was to become a lifelong friend and philosophical influence. In 1935 he was married to Simone Lejas, with whom he has raised five children.
Ricoeur served in World War II – spending most of it as a prisoner of war – and was awarded the Croix de Guerre. He was interred with Mikel Dufrenne, with whom he later wrote a book on the work of Karl Jaspers. After the war Ricoeur returned to teaching, taking positions at the University of Strasbourg, the Sorbonne, University of Paris at Nanterre, the University of Louvain and University of Chicago. Ricoeur is a traditional philosopher in the sense that his work is highly systematic and steeped in the classics of Western philosophy. His is a reflective philosophy, that is, one that considers the most fundamental philosophical problems to concern self-understanding. While Ricoeur retains subjectivity at the heart of philosophy, his is no abstract Cartesian-style subject; the subject is always a situated subject, an embodied being anchored in a named and dated physical, historical and social world. For this reason his work is sometimes described as philosophical anthropology. Ricoeur is a post-structuralist hermeneutic philosopher who employs a model of textuality as the framework for his analysis of meaning, which extends across writing, speech, art and action. Ricoeur considers human understanding to be cogent only to the extent that it implicitly deploys structures and strategies characteristic of textuality. It is Ricoeur’s view that our self-understandings, and indeed history itself , are “fictive”, that is, subject to the productive effects of the imagination through interpretation. For Ricoeur, the human subjectivity is primarily linguistically designated and mediated by symbols. He states that the “problematic of existence” is given in language and must be worked out in language and discourse. Ricoeur refers to his hermeneutic method as a “hermeneutics of suspicion” because discourse both reveals and conceals something about the nature of being. Unlike post-structuralists such as Foucault and Derrida, for whom subjectivity is nothing more than an effect of language, Ricoeur anchors subjectivity in the human body and the material world, of which language is a kind of second order articulation. In the face of the fragmentation and alienation of post-modernity, Ricoeur offers his narrative theory as the path to a unified and meaningful life; indeed, to the good life.
Ricoeur has developed a theoretical style that can best be described as “tensive”. He weaves together heterogeneous concepts and discourses to form a composite discourse in which new meanings are created without diminishing the specificity and difference of the constitutive terms. Ricoeur’s work on metaphor and on the human experience of time are perhaps the best examples of this method, although his entire philosophy is explicitly such a discourse. For example, in What Makes Us Think? Ricoeur discusses the nature of mental life in terms of the tension between our neurobiological conceptions of mind and our phenomenological concepts. Similarly, in the essay “Explanation and Understanding” he discusses human behavior in terms of the tension between concepts of material causation, and the language of actions and motives. The tensive style is in keeping with what Ricoeur regards as basic, ontological tensions inherent in the peculiar being that is human existence, namely, the ambiguity of belonging to both the natural world and the world of action (through freedom of the will). Accordingly, Ricoeur insists that philosophy find a way to contain and express those tensions, and so his work ranges across diverse schools of philosophical thought, bringing together insights and analysis from both the Anglo-American and European traditions, as well as from literary studies, political science and history.
The tensions are played out in our ability to take different perspectives on ourselves and so to formulate diverse approaches and methods in understanding ourselves. The different theoretical frameworks employed in philosophy and the sciences are not simply the result of ignorance or power. They are the result of tensions that run through the very structure of human being; tensions which Ricoeur describes as “fault lines.” Ricoeur’s entire body of work is an attempt to identify and map out the intersections of these numerous and irreducible lines that comprise our understandings of the human world. Ricoeur calls these “fault lines” because they are lines that can intersect in different ways in all the different aspects of human lives, giving lives different meanings. However, as points of intersection of discourses, these meanings can come apart. Ricoeur argues that the stability we enjoy with respect to the meanings of our lives is a tentative stability, subject to the influences of the material world, including the powers and afflictions of one’s body, the actions of other people and institutions, and one’s own emotional and cognitive states. Given the fundamental nature of these tensions, Ricoeur argues that it is ultimately poetics (exemplified in narrative), rather than philosophy that provides the structures and synthetic strategies by which understanding and a coherent sense of self and life is possible.
Ricoeur acknowledges his indebtedness to several key figures in the tradition, most notably, Aristotle, Kant, Hegel and Heidegger. Aristotelian teleology pervades Ricoeur’s textual hermeneutics, and is most obvious in his adoption of a narrative approach. The concepts of “muthos” and “mimesis” in Aristotle’s Poetics form the basis for Ricoeur’s account of narrative “emplotment,” which he enjoins with the innovative powers of the Kantian productive imagination within a general theory of poetics.
The influence of Hegel is manifest in Ricoeur’s employment of a method he describes as a “refined dialectic.” For Ricoeur, the dialectic is a “relative moment[s] in a complex process called interpretation” (Explanation and Understanding”, 150). Like Hegel, the dialectic involves identifying key oppositional terms in a debate, and then proceeding to articulate their synthesis into a new, more developed concept. However, this synthesis does not have the uniformity of a Hegelian synthesis. Ricoeur’s method entails showing how the meanings of two seemingly opposed terms are implicitly informed by, and borrow from, each other. Within the dialectic, the terms maintain their differences at the same time that a common “ground” is formed. However, the common ground is simply the ground of their mutual presupposition. Ricoeur’s dialectic, then, is a unity of continuity and discontinuity. For example, in “Explanation and Understanding” Ricoeur argues that scientific explanation implicitly deploys a background hermeneutic understanding that exceeds the resources of explanation. At the same time, hermeneutic understanding necessarily relies upon the systematic process of explanation. Neither the natural sciences nor the human sciences are fully autonomous disciplines. A key dialectic that runs through Ricoeur’s entire corpus is the dialectic of same and other. This is a foundational dialectic for him, and so, as might be expected, it structures his discussions and dissections of every field of philosophy he enters: selfhood, justice, love, morality, personal identity, knowledge, time, language, metaphor, action, aesthetics, metaphysics, and so on. Unlike the Hegelian dialectic, for Ricoeur, there is no absolute culminating point. There is, nevertheless, a kind of absolute, an objective existence that is revealed indirectly through the dialectic. This is most evident in the third volume of Time and Narrative, where he argues that phenomenological time presupposes an objective order of time (cosmological time), and in The Rule of Metaphor, where he argues that language belongs to, and is expressive of, extra-linguistic reality. Despite this apparent concession to realism, Ricoeur insists that the objective cannot be known as such, but merely grasped indirectly and analytically. Here, the Kantian influence comes to the fore. For Ricoeur, objective reality is the contemporary equivalent of Kantian noumena: although it can never itself become an object of knowledge, it is a kind of necessary thought, a limiting concept, implied in objects of knowledge. This view informs Ricoeur’s “tensive” style. Although we can know, philosophically that there is an objective reality, and, in that sense, a metaphysical constraint on human existence, we can never understand human existence simply in terms of this objectivity. What we must appeal to in order to understand our existence are our substantive philosophical and ethical concepts and norms. This sets up an inevitable tension between the contingency of those norms and the brute fact of objective reality, evidenced in our experience of the involuntary, for example, as aging and dying. Again, Kant looms large. We necessarily regard ourselves from two perspectives: as the author of our actions in the practical world, and as part of, or passive to, cause and effect in the natural world. Such is the inherently ambiguous and tensive nature of human, mortal subjects. It is this condition, then, with which philosophy must grapple. And it is to this condition that Ricoeur offers narrative as the appropriate framework.
There are two closely related questions that animate all of Ricoeur’s work, and which he considers to be fundamental to philosophy: “Who am I?” and “How should I live?” The first question has been neglected by much of contemporary analytical and post-modern philosophy. Consequently, those philosophies lack the means to address the second question. Postmodernism self-consciously rejects traditional processes of identity formation, depicting them as familial and political power relations premised upon dubious metaphysical assumptions about gender, race and mind. At the same time, contemporary philosophy of mind reduces questions of “who?” to questions of “what?”, and in doing so, closes down considerations of self while rendering the moral question one of mere instrumentality or utility. In relation to the question “Who am I?”, Ricoeur acknowledges a long-standing debt to Marcel and Heidegger, and to a lesser extent to Merleau-Ponty. To the moral question, the debt is to Aristotle and Kant. In addressing the question “who am I?” Ricoeur sets out first to understand the nature of selfhood – to understand the being whose nature it is to enquire into itself.
In this endeavor, Ricoeur’s philosophy is driven by the desire to provide an account that will do justice to the tensions and ambiguities which make us human, and which underpin our fallibility. Ricoeur’s interest here can be noted as early as The Voluntary and The Involuntary, drafted during his years as a prisoner of war. There he explores the involuntary constraints to which we are necessarily subject in virtue of our being bodily mortal creatures, and the voluntariness necessary to the idea of ourselves as the agents of our actions. We have, as he later describes it, a “double allegiance”, an allegiance to the material world of cause and effect, and to the phenomenal world of the freedom of the will by which we tear ourselves away from the laws of nature through action. This conception of the double nature of the self lies at the core of Ricoeur’s philosophy. Ricoeur rejects the idea that a self is a metaphysical entity; there is no entity, “the self,” there is only selfhood. Selfhood is an intersubjectively constituted capacity for agency and self-ascription that can be had by individual human beings. Selfhood proper is neither simply an abstract nor an animal self-awareness, but both. It essentially involves an active grasp of oneself as a “who”–that is, as a person who is the subject of a concrete situation, a situation characterized by material and phenomenal qualities. This entails understanding oneself as a named person with a time and place of birth, linked to other similarly named persons and to certain ethnic and cultural traditions, living in a dated and named place. In Oneself As Another Ricoeur describes how the complexity of the question of “who?” opens directly onto a certain way of articulating the question of personal identity: “how the self can be at one and the same time a person of whom we speak and a subject who designates herself in the first person while addressing a second person. . . The difficulty will be . . . understanding how the third person is designated in discourse as someone who designates himself as a first person (34-5)”. Drawing on Heidegger’s notion of Dasein, Ricoeur goes on to write that “To say self is not to say myself . . . the passage from selfhood to mineness is marked by the clause “in each case” . . . The self . . . is in each case mine” (OAA 180). What he means by this is that each person has to take one’s selfhood as one’s own; each must take oneself as who one is; one must “attest” to oneself. Subjectivity, or selfhood, is for Ricoeur, a dialectic of activity and passivity because we are beings with a “double nature,” structured along the fault lines of the voluntary and the involuntary, beings given to ourselves as something to be known. Ricoeur shares Marcel’s view that the answer to the question “Who am I?” can never be fully explicated. This is because, in asking “Who am I?”, “I” who pose the question necessarily fall within the domain of enquiry; I am both seeker and what is sought. This peculiar circularity gives a “questing” and dialectical character to selfhood, which now requires a hermeneutic approach. This circularity has its origins in the nature of embodied subjectivity. Ricoeur’s account is built upon Marcel’s conception of embodied subjectivity as a “fundamental predicament”(Marcel, 1965). The predicament lies in the anti-dualist realization that “I” and my body are not metaphysically distinct entities. My body cannot be abstracted from its being mine. Whatever states I may attribute to my body as its states, I do so only insofar as they are attributes of mine. My body is both something that I am and something that I have: it is “my body” that imagines, perceives and experiences. The unity of “my body” is a unity sui generis. Yet my body is also that over which I exercise a certain instrumentality through my agency. However, the agency that effects that instrumentality is nothing other than “my body.” There is no I-body relation; the primitive term here is “my body.” The inherent ambiguity of the “carnate body” or “corps-sujet” can be directly experienced by clasping one’s own hands (an example often employed by Marcel and Merleau-Ponty). In this experience the distinction between subject and object becomes blurred: it isn’t clear which hand is being touched and which is touching; each hand oscillates between the role of agent and object, without ever being both simultaneously. One cannot feel oneself feeling. This example is supposed to demonstrate two points: first, that the ambiguity of my body prevents the complete objectification of myself, and second, that ambiguity extends to all perception. Perception is not simply passive, but rather, involves an active reception (a concept that Ricoeur takes up and develops in his account of the ontology of the self and one’s own body in Oneself As Another, see 319–329). In other words, my body has an active role in structuring my perceptions, and so, the meaning of my perceptions needs to be interpreted in the context of my bodily situation. The non-coincidence of myself and my body constitutes a “fault line” within the structure of subjectivity. The result is that knowledge of myself and the world is not constituted by more or less accurate facts, but rather, is a composite discourse–a discourse which charts the intersection of the objective, intersubjective and subjective aspects of lived experience. On this view, all knowledge, including my knowledge of my own existence, is mediate and so calls for interpretation. This also means that self-understanding can never be grasped by the kind of introspective immediacy celebrated by Descartes. Instead, as human beings we are never quite “at one” with ourselves; we are fallible creatures. Thus, who I am is not an objective fact to be discovered, but rather something that I must achieve or create, and to which I must attest. On Ricoeur’s view, the question “Who am I ?” is a question specific to a certain kind of being, namely, being a subject of a temporal, material, linguistic and social unity. The ability to grasp oneself as a concrete subject of such a world requires a complex mode of understanding capable of integrating discourses of quite heterogenous kinds, including, importantly, different orders of time. It is to the temporal dimension of selfhood that Ricoeur has most directly addressed his hermeneutic philosophy and narrative model of understanding.
Central to Ricoeur’s defense of narrative is its capacity to represent the human experience of time. Such a capacity is an essential requisite for a reflective philosophy. Ricoeur sets out his account of “human time” in Time and Narrative, Volume 3. He points out that we experience time in two different ways. We experience time as linear succession, we experience the passing hours and days and the progression of our lives from birth to death. This is cosmological time–time expressed in the metaphor of the “river” of time. The other is phenomenological time; time experienced in terms of the past, present and future. As self-aware embodied beings, we not only experience time as linear succession, but we are also oriented to the succession of time in terms of what has been, what is, and what will be. Ricoeur’s concept of “human time” is expressive of a complex experience in which phenomenological time and cosmological time are integrated. For example, we understand the full meaning of “yesterday” or “today” by reference to their order in a succession of dated time. To say “Today is my birthday” is to immediately invoke both orders of time: a chronological date to which is anchored the phenomenological concept of “birthday.” Ricoeur describes this anchoring as the “inscription” of phenomenological time on cosmological time (TN3 109).
These two conceptions of time have traditionally been seen in opposition, but Ricoeur argues that they share a relation of mutual presupposition. The order of “past-present-future” within phenomenological time presupposes the succession characteristic of cosmological time. The past is always before the present which is always after the past and before the future. The order of succession is invariable, and this order is not part of the concepts of past, present or future considered merely as existential orientations. On the other hand, within cosmological time, the identification of supposedly anonymous instants of time as “before” or “after” within the succession borrows from the phenomenological orientation to past and future. Ricoeur argues that any philosophical model for understanding human existence must employ a composite temporal framework. The only suitable candidate here is the narrative model. Ricoeur links narrative’s temporal complexity to Aristotle’s characterization of narrative as “the imitation of an action”. Ricoeur’s account of the way in which narrative represents the human world of acting (and, in its passive mode, suffering) turns on three stages of interpretation that he calls mimesis1 (prefiguration of the field of action), mimesis2 (configuration of the field of action), and mimesis3 (refiguration of the field of action). Mimesis1 describes the way in which the field of human acting is always already prefigured with certain basic competencies, for example, competency in the conceptual network of the semantics of action (expressed in the ability to raise questions of who, how, why, with whom, against whom, etc.); in the use of symbols (being able to grasp one thing as standing for something else); and competency in the temporal structures governing the syntagmatic order of narration (the “followability” of a narrative). Mimesis2 concerns the imaginative configuration of the elements given in the field of action at the level of mimesis1. Mimesis2 concerns narrative “emplotment.” Ricoeur describes this level as “the kingdom of the as if” Narrative emplotment brings the diverse elements of a situation into an imaginative order, in just the same way as does the plot of a story. Emplotment here has a mediating function. It configures events, agents and objects and renders those individual elements meaningful as part of a larger whole in which each takes a place in the network that constitutes the narrative’s response to why, how, who, where, when, etc. By bringing together heterogeneous factors into its syntactical order emplotment creates a “concordant discordance,” a tensive unity which functions as a redescription of a situation in which the internal coherence of the constitutive elements endows them with an explanatory role. A particularly useful feature of narrative which becomes apparent at the level mimesis2 is the way in which the linear chronology of emplotment is able to represent different experiences of time. What is depicted as the “past” and the “present” within the plot does not necessarily correspond to the “before” and “after” of its linear, episodic structure. For example, a narrative may begin with a culminating event, or it may devote long passages to events depicted as occurring within relatively short periods of time. Dates and times can be disconnected from their denotative function; grammatical tenses can be changed, and changes in the tempo and duration of scenes create a temporality that is “lived” in the story that does not coincide with either the time of the world in which the story is read, nor the time that the unfolding events are said to depict. In Volume 2 of Time and Narrative, Ricoeur’s analyses of Mrs. Dalloway, The Magic Mountain and Remembrance of Things Past centre on the diverse variations of time produced by the interplay of a three tiered structure of time: the time of narrating; the narrated time; and the fictive experience of time produced through “the conjunction/disjunction of the time it takes to narrate and narrated time” (TN2 77). Narrative configuration has at hand a rich array of strategies for temporal signification. Another key feature of mimesis2 is the ability of the internal logic of the narrative unity (created by emplotment) to endow the connections between the elements of the narrative with necessity. In this way, emplotment forges a causal continuity from a temporal succession, and so creates the intelligibility and credibility of the narrative. Ricoeur argues that the temporal order of the events depicted in the narrative is simultaneous with the construction of the necessity that connects those elements into a conceptual unity: from the structure of one thing after another arises the conceptual relation of one thing because of another. It is this conversion that so well “imitates” the continuity demanded by a life, and makes it the ideal model for personal identity and self-understanding. Mimesis3 concerns the integration of the imaginative or “fictive” perspective offered at the level of mimesis2 into actual, lived experience. Ricoeur’s model for this is a phenomenology of reading, which he describes as “the intersection of the world of the text and the world of the reader”(TN1 71). Not only are our life stories “written,” they must be “read,” and when they are read they are taken as one’s own and integrated into one’s identity and self-understanding. Mimesis3 effects the integration of the hypothetical to the real by anchoring the time depicted (or recollected or imputed) in a dated “now” and “then” of actual, lived time. Mimesis is a cyclical interpretative process because it is inserted into the passage of cosmological time. As time passes, our circumstances give rise to new experiences and new opportunities for reflection. We can redescribe our past experiences, bringing to light unrealized connections between agents, actors, circumstances, motives or objects, by drawing connections between the events retold and events that have occurred since, or by bringing to light untold details of past events. Of course, narrative need not have a happy ending. The concern of narrative is coherence and structure, not the creation of a particular kind of experience. Nevertheless, the possibility of redescription of the past offers us the possibility of re-imagining and reconstructing a future inspired by hope. It is this potentially inexhaustible process that is the fuel for philosophy and literature.
Besides the metaphysical complexity and heterogeneity of the human situation, one of Ricoeur’s deepest concerns is the tentative, even fragile status of the coherence of a life. His conception of ethics is directly tied to his conception of the narrative self. Because selfhood is something that must be achieved and something dependent upon the regard, words and actions of others, as well as chancy material conditions, one can fail to achieve selfhood, or one’s sense of who one is can fall apart. The narrative coherence of one’s life can be lost, and with that loss comes the inability to regard oneself as the worthy subject of a good life; in other words, the loss of self-esteem.
Ricoeur’s ethics is teleological. He argues that human life has an ethical aim, and that aim is self-esteem: “the interpretation of ourselves mediated by the ethical evaluation of our actions. Self-esteem is itself an evaluation process indirectly applied to ourselves as selves” (The Narrative Path, 99). In short, self-esteem means being able to attest to oneself as being the worthy subject of a good life, where “good” is an evaluation informed not simply by one’s own subjective criteria, but rather by intersubjective criteria to which one attests. This entails another moral concept: that of imputation. As the subject of my actions, I am responsible for what I do; I am the subject to whom my actions can be imputed and whose character is to be interpreted in the light of those actions. Ricoeur describes the ethical perspective that arises from this view of the subject as “aiming at the good life” with and for others, in just institutions” (OAA 172). Such a perspective merely spells out the premise of this practical and material conception of selfhood, with its presupposition of the world of action, lived with others. For Ricoeur, a life can have an aim because the teleological structure of action extends over a whole life, understood within the narrative framework. The ethical life is achieved by aiming to live well with others in just institutions. Ricoeur’s view of selfhood has it that we are utterly reliant upon each other. While Ricoeur emphasizes the importance of the first person perspective and the notion of personal responsibility, his is no philosophy of the radical individual. He emphasizes that we are “mutually vulnerable”, and so the fate (self-esteem) of each of us is tied up with the fate of others. This situation has a normative dimension: we have an indebtedness to each other, a duty to care for each other and to engender self-respect and justice, all of which are necessary to the creation and preservation of self-esteem. While duty runs deep, Ricoeur argues that it is nevertheless preceded by a certain reciprocity. In order to feel commanded by duty, one must first have the capacity to hear and respond to the demand of the Other. That is, there must be some fundamental, primordial openness and orientation to others for the power of duty to be felt. Prior to duty there must be a basic reciprocity, which underlies our mutual vulnerability and from which duty, as well as the possibility of friendship and justice, arises. Here, Ricoeur emphasizes the ethical primacy of acting and suffering. Ricoeur calls this phenomenon “solicitude” or “benevolent spontaneity” (OAA 190). It makes the relation of self and Other (and thus, ethics) primordial, or ontological – hence the title of Ricoeur’s book on ethics, Oneself As Another. Self-esteem is said to arise from a primitive reciprocity of spontaneous, benevolent feelings, feelings which one is also capable of directing toward oneself, but only through the benevolence of others. This fundamental reciprocity is prior to the activity of giving. This can be demonstrated in the situation of sympathy, where it is the Other’s suffering (not acting) that one shares. Here, Ricoeur argues that “from the suffering Other there comes a giving that is no longer drawn from the power of acting and existing, but precisely from weakness itself” (OAA 188-9). In this case, the suffering Other is unable to act, and yet gives. What the suffering Other gives to he or she who shares this suffering is precisely the knowledge of their shared vulnerability and the experience of the spontaneous benevolence required to bear that knowledge. As might be supposed from Ricoeur’s view of embodied subjectivity, one is always already an Other to oneself. So, love and understanding for others, and love and understanding for oneself, are two sides of the same sheet of paper, so to speak. One becomes who one is through relations with the Other, whether in the instance of one’s own body or another’s. Reciprocity forms the basis of those productive and self-affirming relations central to so much of ethics, namely friendship and justice. Its corruption leads to self-loathing and the destruction of self-esteem, which goes hand-in-hand with harm to others and injustice. For Ricoeur, friendship and justice become the chief virtues because of their crucial role in the well-being of selfhood, and thus, in maintaining the conditions of possibility of selfhood. Friends and just institutions not only protect against the suffering of self-destruction to which one is always vulnerable, they provide the means for reconstructing and redeeming damaged lives. The theme of redemption runs right through Ricoeur’s work, and no doubt it has a religious origin. However, the notion of redemption can be viewed in secular terms as the counterpart to the constructive nature of one’s identity, and the temporal complexity of the human situation which calls for interpretation.
University of Tasmania
Last updated: July 7, 2005 | Originally published: