Roman philosophy is thoroughly grounded in the traditions of Greek philosophy. Interest in the subject was first excited at Rome in 155 BCE. by an Athenian embassy, consisting of the Academic Carneades, the Stoic Diogenes, and the Peripatetic Critolaus. Of more permanent influence was the work of the Stoic Panaetius, the friend of the younger Scipio and of Laelius; but a thorough study of Greek philosophy was first introduced in the time of Cicero and Varro. In a number of works they tried to make it accessible even to those of their countrymen who were outside the learned circles. Cicero chiefly took it up in a spirit of eclecticism ; but among his contemporaries Epicureanism is represented in the poetical treatise of Lucretius on the nature of things, and Pythagoreanism by Nigidium Figulus. In Imperial times Epicureanism and Stoicism were most popular, especially the latter, as represented by the writings of Seneca, Cornutus, and the emperor Marcus Aurelius; while Eclectic Platonism was taken up by Apuleius of Madaura. One of the latest philosophical writers of antiquity is Boethius, whose writings were the chief source of information as to Greek philosophy during the first centuries of the Middle Ages.
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Last updated: April 21, 2001 | Originally published: April/21/2001
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