Richard Rorty (1931—2007)
Richard Rorty was an important American philosopher of the late twentieth and early twenty-first century who blended expertise in philosophy and comparative literature into a perspective called “The New Pragmatism” or “neopragmatism.” Rejecting the Platonist tradition at an early age, Rorty was initially attracted to analytic philosophy. As his views matured he came to believe that this tradition suffered in its own way from representationalism, the fatal flaw he associated with Platonism. Influenced by the writings of Darwin, Gadamer, Hegel and Heidegger, he turned towards Pragmatism.
Rorty’s thinking as a historicist, anti-essentialist found its fullest expression in 1979 in his most noted book, Philosophy and the Mirror of Nature. Abandoning all claims to a privileged mental power that allows direct access to things-in-themselves, he offered an alternative narrative which adapts Darwinian evolutionary principles to the philosophy of language. The result was an attempt to establish a thoroughly naturalistic approach to issues of science and objectivity, to the mind-body problem, and to concerns about the nature of truth and meaning. In Rorty’s view, language is to be employed as an adaptive tool used to cope with the natural and social environments to achieve a desired, pragmatic end.
Motivating his entire program is Rorty’s challenge to the notion of a mind-independent, language-independent reality that scientists, philosophers, and theologians appeal to when professing their understanding of the truth. This greatly influences his political views. Borrowing from Dewey’s writings on democracy, especially where he promotes philosophy as the art of the politically useful leading to policies that are best, Rorty ties theoretical inventiveness to pragmatic hope. In place of traditional concerns about whether what one believes is well-grounded, Rorty, in Philosophy and Social Hope (1999), advises that it is better to focus on whether one has been imaginative enough to develop interesting alternatives to one’s present beliefs. His assumption is that in a foundationless world, creative, secular humanism must replace the quest for an external authority (God, Nature, Method, and so forth) to provide hope for a better future. He characterizes that future as being free from dogmatically authoritarian assertions about truth and goodness. Thus, Rorty sees his New Pragmatism as the legitimate next step in completing the Enlightenment project of demystifying human life, by ridding humanity of the constricting “ontotheological” metaphors of past traditions, and thereby replacing the power relations of control and subjugation inherent in these metaphors with descriptions of relations based on tolerance and freedom.
Table of Contents
- Thoughts and Work
- Major Influences
- References and Further Reading
Richard McKay Rorty was born on October 4, 1931 in New York City. He held teaching positions at Yale University from 1954 to 1956, Wellesley College from 1958 to 1961, Princeton University from 1961 to 1982, and the University of Virginia since 1982. In addition he has held many visiting positions.
As he relates in his autobiographical piece, “Trotsky and the Wild Orchids,” Rorty’s early and informal education began with the books in his parents’ library, particularly Leon Trotsky’s two books History of the Russian Revolution and Literature and Revolution as well as two volumes on the Dewey Commission of Inquiry into the Moscow Trials. These materials, along with his family’s association with noted socialists such as John Frank and Carlo Tresca, introduced Rorty to the plight of oppressed peoples and the fight for social justice.
At the age of fifteen in 1946, Rorty entered the University of Chicago where he eventually earned B.A. and M.A. degrees. After initially embracing Platonism and its replacement of passion by reason as a method to harmonize reality with the ideals of justice, a reluctant Rorty came to hold that this rapprochement was impossible. Opting rather for the rigors of the study of the philosophy of mind and analytic philosophy, Rorty left Chicago for Yale University, where he received his Ph.D. degree in 1956. He developed the theory of eliminativism materialism in “Mind-body Identity, Privacy and Categories” (1965), The Linguistic Turn (1967) and “In Defense of Eliminative Materialism” (1970). Here he clarifies and adjusts his commitment to the analytic tradition, a commitment that began with his Ph.D. dissertation “The Concept of Potentiality.” He eventually was to become disenchanted with analytic philosophy.
After reading Hegel’s Phenomenology of the Spirit, Rorty began to appreciate the degree to which the incessant conflict of philosophers and their competing first principles might, with the cunning of reason, be transformed from a seemingly interminable debate into a conversation that weaves itself into a “conceptual fabric of a freer, better, more just society.” This appreciation matured with Rorty’s study of Heidegger’s works.
During his tenure at Princeton University, Rorty was reintroduced to the works of John Dewey that he had set aside for his studies on Plato. It was this reacquaintance with Dewey, along with an acquaintance with the writings of Wilfrid Sellars and W. V. Quine that caused Rorty to redirect his interest to the study and development of the American philosophy of Pragmatism.
The publication of his first book, Philosophy and the Mirror of Nature in 1979, the same year he became President of the American Philosophical Association, publicly marked Rorty’s thorough break with Platonic essentialism as well as with Cartesian foundationalism. He attacked assumptions at the core of modern epistemology—the conceptions of mind, of knowledge and of the discipline of philosophy.
Calling himself “raucously secularist,” Rorty rejected contemporary attempts at holding justice and reality in a single vision, declaring this to be a remnant of what Heidegger called the ontotheological tradition whose metaphors had frozen into dogmatic truisms about truth and goodness. In Contingency, Irony and Solidarity (1989), Rorty extended this claim by abandoning all pretenses to an analytic style. Opting for a Proust-inspired narrative approach where arguments for universal rights, common humanity, and justice are replaced with references to pain and humiliation as motivation for society to form solidarities (contingent groupings of like-minded individuals) in opposition to suffering, Rorty substituted hope for knowledge as the main thrust of his efforts. Tolerant conversations rather than philosophical debates and idiosyncratic re-creation rather than self-discovery have been hallmarks of his pragmatic pursuit for social hope, the pursuit of which can be characterized as a historicist quest for human happiness that abandons a search for universal truth and timeless goodness in favor of what works. Rorty’s pragmatic aim was and continues to be the development of a liberal society where there is freedom from pain and humiliation and where open-mindedness is practiced.
More recently, Rorty developed his notion of the uses of philosophy by using as his template a reading of Darwinian evolution applied to Deweyan democratic principles. This development appears most notably in Achieving Our Country (1998), Truth and Progress: Philosophical Papers III (1998) and in Philosophy and Social Hope (1999). Rorty died on June 8, 2007.
The failure of Rorty’s youthful attempt to synthesize into one vision his identification with the downtrodden together with his search for the “Truth beyond hypothesis” was the making of his career in philosophy. As early as 1967, Rorty had moved away from an initial interest in linguistic philosophy as a way of finding a neutral standpoint from which to establish a strict science of language, and he began his shift to pragmatism. With the publication of Philosophy and the Mirror of Nature (1979), Rorty further elucidated his maturing anti-essentialist, historicist positions as applied to topics such as the philosophy of science and the mind-body problem, as well as the philosophy of language as it pertained to issues of truth and meaning. With Consequences of Pragmatism (1982), Rorty developed in greater detail the themes covered in his 1979 work.
With Contingency, Irony and Solidarity (1989), Rorty first implicitly linked his rejection of philosophical appeals to ahistorical universals with that of his pragmatist narrative, a narrative of free, idiosyncratic individuals who, inspired by intuitions and sensibilities captured in great works of literature, commit themselves to contingent solidarities devoted to social and political liberalism. Furthermore, these individuals, detached from the need to justify their world-view by an appeal to the way the world is, would see moral obligation as a matter of social conditioning by cultural forces, which are in turn structured by the prevalent human needs and desires of a specific era.
In Part III of Objectivity, Relativism and Truth (1991), Rorty continued to develop his pragmatist views on politics in a democratic society. In Parts I and II he set his sights on contemporary ideas about objectivity, using the writings of Donald Davidson and others for support in debunking the claim that the human mind is capable of discovering ahistorical truth concerning the nature and meaning of reality from a “God’s-eye,” ideal perspective. Supporting the entire work is Rorty’s challenge to the notion of a mind-independent, language-independent reality to which scientists, philosophers, and politicians appeal when professing that they have a corner on the truth. His Essays on Heidegger and Others (1991) is devoted to harmonizing the works of Heidegger and Derrida with the writings of Dewey and Davidson, particularly in their anti-representational insights and stances on contingent historicism.
Later writings, such as Truth and Progress (1998); Achieving our Country: Leftist Thoughts in Twentieth-Century America (1998); and Philosophy and Social Hope (1999), clarify his anti-essentialist stance by integrating a neo-Darwinian perspective into a Dewey-inspired pragmatism.
Although the writing of any philosopher will have countless influences, there are generally only a handful which stand out as major inspirations. Rorty is no exception. While Nietzsche, Wittgenstein, Derrida, James, Quine, and Kuhn contribute much to his worldview, of central importance to Rorty’s narrative of New Pragmatism are five influential thinkers: G. W. F. Hegel, Charles Darwin, Martin Heidegger, John Dewey, and Donald Davidson, each contributing a significant layer to Rorty’s complex take on questions central to contemporary philosophy.
It was G. W. F. Hegel’s willingness in his Phenomenology of the Spirit (1977) to abandon certainty and eternity as philosophical and moral goals/ideals that inspired Rorty to appreciate the irreducible temporality of everything as well as to understand philosophy as a contingent narrative readable without a moral precept existing behind the storyline. Calling Hegel’s switch from the metaphor of individual salvation through contact with a transcendental reality to salvation through the achievement of the completion of an historical process “protopragmatism,” Rorty asserts that this move was a critical step forward in human thinking, taking us from the notion of how things were meant to be to a perspective on how things never were but might be. The change of focus from epistemological stasis, the adequate discernment of God’s Will or Nature’s Way, to interpretive processes opened the way for subsequent intellectuals to envision their task as that of constructing a better future rather than the discovery and conforming to a static idea of the Good Life. The refocused purpose of philosophy, from Rorty’s perspective, would be best captured by Hegel’s phrase “time held in thought,” that is, a narrative of a community’s progress across time that can be described in terms of its current and parochial needs; societal growth not measured against some non-human, eternal standard. Thus, Rorty contends, Hegel helped us to begin to substitute pragmatic hope for apodictic knowledge.
Of course, Hegel saw his own philosophical efforts as elucidating the progression by which the rational becomes real. That is, he conceived history as the process of the Absolute becoming increasingly self-manifest (the Incarnate Logos) through the development toward, and concrete realization in, the human consciousness. This Rorty rejects as a form of pantheistic fantasy that attempts to maintain a “closeness of fit” between word and world by rendering humanity as the mere manifestation of the Divine Mind, and one that is not consistent, ironically, with Hegel’s own anti-representational doctrine of historicism. To address this inconsistency and for a corrective to Hegel’s Absolute Idealism, Rorty turns to Charles Darwin.
In 1998 Rorty contended that Darwin has demonstrated how to naturalize Hegel by the former’s dispensing with claims that the real is rational while allowing for a narrative of change understood as an endless series of progressive unfolding. Purpose that transcends a given organism is eliminated in favor of a particular organism’s fitness for the local environment. It is an evolutionary process, one that fully involves human beings; we are no exception. What we, as creatures of the earth, do and are, Rorty maintains, “is continuous with what amoebas, spiders, and squirrels do and are.” Consciousness and thought are not distinct kinds; they are inextricably linked to the use of language. Language is the practice of using long and complex strings of noises and marks to successfully adapt to one’s environment. If language is at all a break in the continuity between other species and humans, it is only insofar as it is a tool that humans have at their disposal, which amoebas, squirrels, and the like do not. Nevertheless, just as other species have developed the tools of night-hunting, migration and hibernation to adapt to environmental change, we have used language as a tool for our survival. Thus, for Rorty, language is not a mysterious add-on over and above human creaturehood, but part of our “animality,” as he puts it. As a conveyer of meaning, language should be understood as the use of sentences to achieve a practical goal through a cooperative effort. It is “the ability to have and ascribe sentential attitudes” that contributes to our species’ successful survival in a world of dynamic possibilities. In this way, borrowing from Darwin, Rorty naturalizes language.
Darwin also has made materialism respectable to an educated public once, according to Rorty (Truth and Progress, 1998), his “vitalism” is dismissed. Darwin’s detailed account of the way in which both life and consciousness might have evolved from non-living, non-conscious chemical soup gave plausibility to their emergence free from teleology. Taking the new-found respectability of materialism along with the recognition of the human species’ full-fledged animality, the search for a non-natural cause for the prolific display of life on earth can be dispensed with as misguided. So too can a hunt for a non-human purpose for human life. “After Darwin,” Rorty asserts, “it became possible to believe that nature is not leading up to anything—that nature has nothing in mind.”
Without transcendent standards or intrinsic ends to aspire to, we humans find ourselves radically free to invent the purpose of human life and the means to achieve it. Rorty, well aware of the need for a consistent anti-representationalist narrative, acknowledges that even Darwin’s theory of evolutionary change is just one more image of the way things “are,” one no more privileged than any other coherent narrative in representing reality in-itself—an impossible task. In fact Rorty suggests that the main, albeit unintended, contribution of Darwin is the de-mythologizing of the human self (considered as part of an unnarrated, objective reality). Rorty argues that we should “read Darwin not as offering one more theory about what we really are but as providing reasons why we do not need to ask what we really are.” Old habits of deferentially attributing to an immaterial spirit or to nature’s intrinsic life-force (for example, élan vital) the power to determine the structure, meaning of, and means to our existence ought to be set aside as outmoded and replaced by a story of dynamic cultural innovation and humanistic pluralism. This is the pragmatic vocabulary that Rorty envisions Darwin preparing with his notion of evolutionary change, a vocabulary that is further molded by the writings of Martin Heidegger.
Martin Heidegger influenced Rorty in the direction of process over permanence. Labeling the history of Western metaphysics “the ontotheological tradition,” Heidegger postulated that an underlying assumption persisted from Plato down to the positivists: the power relation of “the stronger overcoming the weaker.” Rorty (in “Heidegger, Contingency, and Pragmatism,” 1991) notes that Heidegger finds that thinkers as diverse as Aristotle, St. Paul, Descartes, and Hegel assume this sort of asymmetrical power relation in the process of searching for the truth that overcomes ignorance, tames sensual desire by reason, or defeats sin with the aid of God’s grace. Each thinker in his own fashion seeks a force that overwhelms the subject as it makes its project evident. By doing so, the individual ceases to create and live his own projects in deference to the presence of the stronger influence. The submission to this influence would be both a concession to a power greater than oneself and identification with it. And it is in this identification, Heidegger claimed, that a subtle shift from an attitude of subservience to one of control and domination occurs within the seeker.
Rorty agrees with Heidegger that the “quest for certainty, clarity, and direction from outside can also be viewed as an attempt to escape from time, to view Sein as something that has little to do with Zeit.” For the ontotheological tradition, time, in its fleeting manifestations, receives the unfavorable comparison with the reality of the eternal. Thus the unspoken goal of the metaphysically-inclined advocates of this philosophical tradition is to be free from the contingency, the uncertainty, and the fragility of the human condition by a release into and identification with the eternal. Valuing power above fragility, propositions over words, truth to metaphor, philosophy above poetry, in the hands of pre-Heideggerian philosophers the use of language becomes merely a means in the pursuit of a reality and a force which rises above the signifier.
Heidegger rejected this family of philosophical thinking along with its “quest for disinterested theoretical truth” as an over-intellectualized escape from the human condition. It is at its core inauthentic. The will to truth of the metaphysician is actually the poetic urge in disguise. Since antiquity, the ontotheological tradition is the attempt by (poetic) thinkers to deploy a series of metaphors to break away from the contingency of poetic metaphor. More than hypocritical, in Heidegger eyes, the ontotheologian exhibits hubris in his belief that Western philosophy is capable of getting it right and be clear about what is real, rather than appreciating his attempt as just one of many practices trying to give voice to the “reality” of Being. Instead Heidegger urged that an amalgamation of beliefs and desires had to be made in order to recover and reassert the “force of words” heard as when they were first spoken—original and potent—in order to open a space for Being.
Rorty understands Heidegger to be saying that there are just we humans and the power of the words we happen to speak. There is no designer, no controller, and no choreographer of human projects, only ourselves and the languages we create. “We are nothing save the words we use.” Thus the poet, in dealing forthrightly with the contingency and historicity of words is an authentic coiner of metaphor. And metaphor is what discloses Being, just as Being is formed and manifested in metaphor. As Rorty writes in “Heidegger, Contingency, and Pragmatism,” “As long as an understanding of Being is ontically possible ‘is there’ Being.”
The use of the term “Being” by Heidegger is, for Rorty, somewhat problematic. With Heidegger, Rorty agrees that there is no hidden power called Being. Rorty interprets Heidegger’s Being as what “final vocabularies” are about. When he declares that “Being’s poem is the poem of Being,” Rorty is not claiming that there is a work of reality that Being “writes”; rather he means that there is no meta-vocabulary to distinguish the adequacy of one final vocabulary above others. Nor is there any non-linguistic, pre-cognitive access to an already present Being that underscores some narrative as preferred. There is no way to escape the contingencies of language to get at Being-in-itself. We are all enmeshed in final vocabularies that present Being in diverse and incommensurate ways. No understanding of Being is better than any other understanding. Heidegger thus cleared the way for Rorty’s dismissal of the realism-antirealism debate and his gloss of Western tradition as the development of pragmatic practices designed to cope with contemporary conditions while remaining open to future descriptions.
Nevertheless, for Heidegger the evolving pattern of power relations that has been the history of Western metaphysics culminates in the “technical,” pragmatic interpretation of thinking. Rorty obviously must differ with Heidegger in the latter’s rejection of pragmatism as the concluding, and unfortunate, outcome of the ontotheological tradition. In “Heidegger, Contingency, and Pragmatism,” Rorty suggests that if Heidegger had only to choose between pragmatism and Platonism, pragmatism would be his choice, fully aware of Heidegger’s distain for pragmatism and his offering of a third option: authentic Dasein’s primal understanding of Being. Yet Rorty maintains that he opts for the early Heidegger’s construal of the “analytic of Dasein” as an interpretation of the Western world-view rather than the later Heidegger’s reading of it as “an account of the ahistorical conditions for the occurrence of history.” In doing so Rorty dismisses all suggestions by Heidegger that some historically embedded language-users’ understanding of Being (for example, the ancient Greeks’) can be more open to (less forgetful of) Being than any subsequent appreciation due to their status as “primordial” inventors of the Western tradition’s metaphors. Yet Rorty also insists that it is impossible to rank understandings because no descriptive account can better help us get behind that which is poetically construed. There is no validating reality behind our narrative; Being and interpretive narrative arise together. Therefore, Rorty appropriates for pragmatism only Heidegger’s sense of contingency and the transitory condition of human life, along with the ability to radically redescribe Western culture. He sets aside Heidegger’s nostalgia for an authentic world-view that says something neutral about the structure of all present and possible world-views. By doing so, Rorty aligns himself more with John Dewey’s brand of anti-essentialism and anti-foundationalism than with Heidegger’s project. For Dewey’s vision of a democratic utopia includes “technical,” pragmatic thinking that is put in service to social practice for the purpose of achieving the integration of inquiry and poetry, theory and practice.
As with Hegel and Darwin, Rorty intentionally “misreads” or “redescribes” John Dewey from a late-Twentieth-century pragmatist’s perspective. This “hypothetical Dewey” is shorn of what Rorty considers to be dead metaphors in the former’s philosophy (that is his “scientistic” empirical rhetoric and panpsychic notion of experience). Conversely for Rorty, a continuing live option in Dewey’s thought is his naturalism and pragmatism. Seen in this light, Rorty’s Dewey becomes the synthesis of historicism and the expediency of evolutionary adaptation. Most notably, Dewey manifested this fusion in his rejection of the “crust of convention” born of a tradition that took language as representational of reality rather than as instrumental in satisfying a society’s shared beliefs and hopes. The fading conviction originating with Plato that language can adequately represent what there is in words opens the way for a pragmatic utilization of language as a means to address current needs through practical deliberations among thoughtful people.
This view of language is critical for Rorty. With the shift in attitude away from the expectation, on one hand, that through narrative a revelation of moral perfection may become manifest, or, on the other, that through the clear and methodical use of language epistemic certainty may be achieved, humanity is freed to view morality and science as being evolving processes, where means lead to ends and those ends in turn become means toward future aims. Rorty characterizes this, Dewey’s means-ends continuum, as the claim that we change our ideas of what is true, right and good on the basis of the particular blend of success and failure produced by our prior labors to fulfill our hopes. Rorty writes that philosophers such as Dewey “have kept alive the historicist sense that this century’s ‘superstition’ was the last century’s triumph of reason and the relativist sense that the latest vocabulary, borrowed from the latest scientific achievement, may not express privileged representations of essences, but be just another of the potential infinity of vocabularies in which the world can be described.”
In rejecting representationalism and the essentialism that it implies, Dewey abandons the Cartesian-inspired spectator account of knowledge, which radically separates the knowing subject from the object being studied. No longer considering that objectivity a result of a detachment from the material under study but rather as an ongoing interaction with that which is at hand, Dewey elevates practice over theory; better said, he puts theory in service to practice. From Rorty’s perspective, while Dewey had a great insight, he ought to have taken the next step and rejected scientism—the claim that scientific method allows humanity to gain a privileged insight into the structural processes of nature. His failure to reject the alleged epistemologically privileged stance is one main reason Rorty must re-imagine Dewey. Nevertheless, Dewey’s elevation of practice continues the movement away from the pre-Darwinian attachment to the belief in a non-human source of purpose and the immutability of natural kinds toward a contingent “world,” where humans define and redefine their social and material environments. It is within a social practice or a “language-game” that specific marks and sounds come to designate commonly accepted meanings. And, as Rorty states in “Feminism and Pragmatism,” (1995) no set of marks or sounds (memes) can ever bring cognitive clarity about the way the world is or the way we as humans are. Instead, memes compete with one another in an evolutionary struggle over cultural space, just as genes compete for survival in the natural environment. Unguided by an immanent or transcendent teleology, the memes’ replication is determined by their usefulness within a given social group. And it is through their utility for the continued existence and prospering of a social group that the group’s memes—like their genes—are carried forward and flourish. They establish their niche in the socio-ecological system.
By the linkage of meme selection with Darwinian natural selection, Rorty can reasonably say that “the history of social practices is continuous with the history of biological evolution.” He adds a crucial caveat: memes gradually usurp the role of genes. Thus the driving force in human existence becomes the socio-linguistic. And as in the process of natural selection there is no social practice that is privileged and final; no one cultural “species” is intrinsically favored over another. It follows that, as Dewey has said “The worse or evil is a rejected good.” Before deliberation and choice there can be no intrinsic good, no God’s-Eye clarity as to what the true, the right and the just are. All options are competing goods. It is only with the triumph of one set of memes over another by means of manipulation, coercion or force that the determination of a society’s memes as the good (or the bad) of the situation can be asserted. Rorty recognizes that the Deweyan approach, which denies that knowledge is the stable grasping of an independent reality and which asserts “reality” to be a term of value, may lead to the charge of relativism and power-worship. But he believes that the benefits for a democratic society where there is an unfettered competition of ideas outweigh the downside of his anti-universalist stance. Therefore, given the historicist belief that there is no viable alternative to being immersed within the contemporary understanding of one’s time, place and culture, then to abandon the memes with which one chooses to be identified—together with the solidarity one has formed with like-minded others around those memes—would be an absurd denial of one’s self and one’s beliefs. (This is the basis of Rorty’s ethnocentricism.)
Rorty wishes to promote consciously a democracy of plurality and hope rather than one where either private autonomy or communal solidarity dominates. This sentiment can be found most clearly beginning with Contingency, Irony and Solidarity (1989), culminating in Philosophy and Social Hope (1999). By developing an evolutionary sense of history through Dewey’s writings Rorty associates a generalized Darwinism directly with democracy. Growth, or the flourishing of ideas in a political environment that is conducive to the flowering of ideas and practices, is the hope for the future. While there is no metaphysical grounding of this hope in the essence of humanity or in the structure of the world, Rorty maintains that a future where we may continue to be astounded by the latest creative endeavors is a future where human happiness has the best chance.
This democratic trope is acceptable to Rorty because he agrees with Dewey that the essentialist-foundationalist worldview was a product of Europe’s inegalitarian past. The conservative, leisure-class’s desire to maintain the status quo was incorporated into a philosophy that favored eternal necessities over the temporal contingencies and the uncovering of static natures over the engagement with the dynamic processes. As such it stood in the way of growth and constructive change. By shifting attention away from traditional memes to those that focuses on the future, Dewey meant to reconstruct philosophy into the exercise of practical judgment, a dedication to the kinds of understanding that are geared to contemporary obstacles that obstruct the flow of expressive creativity. Rorty endorses Dewey’s intention.
As Rorty characterizes Dewey’s vision, Pragmatism would, for the first time, “put the intellectuals at the service of the productive class rather than the leisure class.” Theory is to be treated as an aid to practice, rather than practice being seen as defective theory. With the assent of practice, the distinctions characteristic of dualism, those between mind and matter, thought and action, and appearance and reality, blur and fall away. Following precisely on this notion is political egalitarianism. If there is not to be dualistic distinction in the abstract, then none should be manifested in practice. Rorty accepts that individual self-reliance ought to be exercised on a communal level. Dewey promotes philosophy as the art of the politically useful. His is a social democracy where the policies that bring social utility are the policies that are best. This is where theoretical creativity ties into Rortyan pragmatic hope: “that one should stop worrying about whether what one believes is well-grounded and start worrying about whether one has been imaginative enough to think up interesting alternatives to one’s present beliefs.” Rorty holds that this is uniquely possible for all citizens in a democratic environment, where the clash of memes can happen under an auspicious tolerance that suppresses to a minimum pain and humiliation and allow for a flourishing of diversity. This is where pragmatism fuses with utilitarian values. Rorty suggests that it is reasonable to offer persuasive rhetoric rather than the use of physical assault or its preludes of mockery and insult, because coming to terms with people will likely increase human happiness in the long run. That is, by keeping open the lines of communication, new and exciting projects for the betterment of our condition has the best chance to develop than if fear and intimidation are the norm. It is the establishment of conditions conducive for human happiness that is the utopian hope within the human heart.
Rorty had claimed (prior to Ramberg’s essay—see section 5b below) that there was no more of a gap between human psychology and biology than between biology and chemistry (“McDowell, Davidson, and Spontaneity”, 1998). This follows easily from his Deweyan take on Darwinism. Once we accept Dewey’s pragmatism, then the vocabularies that allegedly could distinguish between the human and the natural come under serious challenge. Different disciplines are founded to achieve different purposes. There is no way for a discipline to try to be more “adequate to the world” than any other when, with Rorty, one gives up on, say, Quine’s physicalism which ranks some vocabulary (physics) as ontologically superior to others. If we generalize this rejection, as Rorty does, then one is able to reject scientism, a position which holds that a descriptive practice’s success or failure depends on its capture of a determinative material reality. Once we abandon the idea that one vocabulary is best suited to express the intrinsic order of things, then the ability to express the truth through the use of one vocabulary but not another is due to the different focus of interest that each vocabulary has, and not because one excels beyond all others in the expression of facts. There is a flat, deontologized, playing field among different descriptive strategies. These strategies are tools in the pragmatist’s toolbox to be utilized under appropriate conditions of need-fulfillment. So, for instance, if psychology is rightly conceived as a different practice than, say, economics, it is a practice that is geared to achieve a particular outcome deemed as important by the discipline of psychology, but not necessarily to economics, or for that matter, physics, ethics, and so forth. Psychology is merely a different causal strategy which an individual may choose to engage “nature” to achieve a specific outcome. But no strategy can claim to have the unique language-strategy that gets things right. Rorty believes there is no “super-language” that achieves a more adequate description of our relation to something other than ourselves because all vocabularies merely describe our practices as we engage in a causal interaction with “reality” as understood through those practices.
This position is available to Rorty largely due to Donald Davidson’s argument against the content-scheme distinction. This distinction, common in all dualisms, is seen as necessary only when credence is given to there being disparate ontological realms—one containing beliefs, the other containing non-beliefs (for example, matters of fact). Truth then becomes the correct analysis of the non-causal relation between particular beliefs and specific non-beliefs. But Davidson argues that such a dichotomy lacks credibility. That there is a mysterious relation between human and the non-human which tertia such as “experience,” “sensory stimulation,” “the world,” and so forth, act as epistemological bridges is, according to Davidson, an illusion created by the endeavor to take language as a medium or an instrument used to define truth. Rorty explains that Davidson avoids this representationalist pitfall by understanding “true” in terms of one’s own linguistic know-how. The “language I know,” the way that one’s community copes with the environment in practice, is enough to erase the alleged schism between intentional objects (the objects that most of the rules of action of one’s—or some other—linguistic community are true of; that is, are good for dealing with) and their referents. This is Davidson’s “Principle of Charity.”
The central understanding that Rorty draws from Davidson’s notion of “radical translation” at the heart of the “Principle of Charity” is that we language-users have already the causal link established between our beliefs and their referent(s). There is no need to establish a connection, it is the human condition. This linkage allows us to get things for the most part correct and thus make most of our statements about the world true, and to recognize that any translation is a faulty translation which renders as wrong most of a speaker’s beliefs about the world. Rorty suggests that it follows that any wholesale gap between intentional objects and referents would be impossible since survival depended upon humanity’s pragmatic application of beliefs to the environment. This carries over to our own individual webs of belief. Most of anyone’s beliefs must be, on the whole, true. Rorty uses this insight to explain that though we cannot get outside our beliefs and our language to establish some test besides the coherence of our own or others’ webs of belief we can still speak objectively and have knowledge of a public world not of our personal design.
It is through a Davidsonian holistic view of language that Rorty, contra Davidson, takes “truth” as a misguided slide back into representationalism. For Davidson, truth is a transparent term that in itself does not explain anything but emerges when the rules for action causally interact successfully with the world. Rorty rejects all appeals to truth, Davidsonian or otherwise, in favor of social justification. Because there are no comprehensive barriers between oneself and the world, we are free to advance beliefs with the aim of persuading others as to their efficacy in obtaining the outcomes they most desire. This is how Rorty blends Davidson’s notion of radical translation with Dewey’s naturalism to yield Rorty’s neopragmatism.
The overarching theme of Rorty’s writing is a promotion of a thorough-going naturalism. Recognizing the value of the Enlightenment challenge to religious speculation, and its offering of a humanist philosophy in its place, Rorty argues that the Enlightenment program was never completed. It fell short of its goal by keeping one foot in the past. By substituting the notion of Truth as One in place of a monotheistic worldview, the Enlightenment reformers repeated the tradition’s error by continuing to seek non-human authority, now in the guise of what Wilfrid Sellers called “the Myth of the Given.” Holding that reality has an intrinsic nature, and by advancing the correspondence theory of truth, Enlightenment philosophers turned away from full-blown naturalism, ironically, in service to a scientific objectivity that required a radical separation of the observer from the observed. Rorty’s neopragmatism is meant to ameliorate this perceived shortcoming by rigorously following through on Immanuel Kant’s distinction between causality and justification.
Rorty holds that our relation with the environment is purely causal. However, the way in which we describe it—the linguistic tools we employ to cope with the recalcitrance of that environment in an effort to achieve our purposes and desires, as natural creatures in the natural world—determines how we understand that world. Once we are causally prompted to form a belief, justification may take place in a social world where, as Davidson notes, only a belief can justify a belief. In short, Rorty maintains that there can be no norms derived from the natural, but only from the social.
This position allows Rorty to reject scientism (the representationalist view that cleaves to the Myth of the Given) while endorsing the development of a fully-naturalized science as an extremely useful tool for prediction and control. It also opens the way for Rorty to advance naturalized democracy with confidence. Instead of seeking some underlying fact about human nature which is essential, ahistorical, and universalizable, Rorty proposes we seek the justifications that are relevant to a contextually embedded practice. The loss of the unconditionality associated with long-established notions of truth is actually a gain, pragmatically speaking. While truth is an aim that is unachievable due to its definitional ambivalence prior to commitment to action, justification is a recognizable (and contingent) goal that permits practical satisfaction without closing the door on future recalibrations in response to inevitable challenges to such justifications. The best way to allow for justification of a belief with no neutral standpoint, Rorty suggests, is to allow competing beliefs to be evaluated on their performance capabilities and not on their ability to ground themselves in universal validity. This leads directly to Rorty’s ethnocentricism.
The following are various positions Rorty takes in accordance with his project of New Pragmatism.
For Rorty one of the results of the merging of Dewey’s naturalism with Davidson’s view of truth is the dropping of the realist-anti-realist issue. One is always in touch with reality as a language user, thus the distinction between truth-conditions and assertibility-conditions dissolves. However, it is important to note that although we humans use language to engage the environment it does not make the process artificial, in the sense of language concealing a transcendent reality behind social constructs, or by its being in wholesale error concerning the inherent character of the natural world. Rorty writes in Objectivity, Relativism, and Truth (1991) that “Davidson, on my interpretation, thinks that the benefit of going ‘linguistic’ is that getting rid of the Cartesian mind is the first step toward eliminating the tertia which, by seeming to intrude between us and the world, created the old metaphysical issues in the first place.” He continues that once we dispense with the tertia that try to breach the now discredited scheme-content gap, the distinction between appearance (“useful fictions”) and reality (“objective facts”) disappears. What remain are one’s community practices unfolding in a seamless and endless process of reweaving webs of beliefs in response to current and future conditions. From his rejection of the realist-anti-realist distinction springs Rorty’s anti-essentialist nominalism and anti-foundationalism.
Related to Rorty’s rejection of what he characterizes as the false dichotomy between realism and antirealism, is his dismissal of all ideas of essentialism. The Neurath’s Boat thought experiment poses no problem for Rorty. Terms like “boat” or “self” are strictly linguistic in nature. That is, they do not refer to Platonic Forms or Aristotelian essences, but to linguistically constructed, intentional objects. Boats or selves may undergo complete change piece-by-piece and still maintain their identity if and only if there is social agreement about the continuance of such notions. What is radical in Rorty’s linguistic principle is that there is no ultimate difference between the human and the non-human “entities;” they are definable and redefinable “all the way down.” There is nothing standing under [sub-stance] or above to anchor the ever-evolving linguistic parsing of metaphors.
Similarly, reference to reflexive consciousness, the hallmark of unique and private Cartesian self distinct from all non-conscious objects is, for Rorty an illegitimate attempt to nest metaphysical assertions about the existence of a separate human mind in the epistemology of first-person, self-evident awareness. Equally illegitimate is the appeal to materialism common to scientism. Language that reduces consciousness to brain functions creates a vocabulary that attempts to explain mental events as happenings of material alteration. There is a metaphysical assumption in materialism that Rorty, as an anti-essentialist, cannot countenance: that there is a physical world that is “really there” adequate to the cause of the mental.
Neither a reductive materialist nor dualistic subjectivist, Rorty opts for nominalist-pragmatism. That materialists deal with reality is to be understood as their concentrating on the concepts and descriptors they find most useful to discuss. When dualists maintain that there is an awareness which stands distinct from that which is extended and non-conscious, it shows their stubborn commitment to the dead Cartesian metaphor. Descartes’ reconstruction of the world was designed to secure the study of physics in a religious environment hostile to its practice. To reify Descartes’ “mind as a mental eye” metaphor as that which “perceives” itself as a self-evident “given” is to misunderstand the application of language to personal experience. This is a major theme of Rorty’s Philosophy as the Mirror of Nature (1979), as captured in his “Antipodean Analogy.” It is a challenge and reminder to the reader that the way we speak about the mental can (and will at some future time) be radically reconceived. If there can be found nothing essential to the mental that extends beyond and grounds our description of it, the very process with which we seem most intimate, then it follows that there is nothing essential—non-linguistic—to the non-mental either. There is no essential constitution to our minds. Rorty declares that privacy, immediacy, introspectibility, intentionality, incorrigibility, and self-evidency can be redescribed in terms that do not involve subjectivism (see also “Dennett on Awareness”).
Rorty denies the utility of all foundational philosophies (for example, Cartesian clear and distinct ideas, Kantian a priori truths, and so forth) on the basis that they share with representationalism a belief that the mind is the “mirror of nature.” Once the metaphysical distinction between appearance and reality disappears, so too ought the need for a knowing subject with a special faculty for apodictic truth. Seen by Rorty as secular theories meant to identify the necessary grounding of knowledge previously provided by the Divine or natural order, foundationalisms of all stripes have in common the desire for the subject to escape temporality and contingency into a transcendent viewpoint capable of experiencing the power of truth (for example, “truth resists attempts to refute it”), pressing rational minds toward consensus. Thus, in Rorty’s opinion, the invention of the transcendent subject is an attempt to salvage epistemologically a relation to a metaphysical realm that has been abandoned by post-Kantian thinkers. He holds that foundationalists arbitrarily raise to the level of universal the mundane linguistic practices and social norms that have dominated minds at some moment and in some locale. Rorty rejects the cultural hegemony implied in foundationalist narratives, and by doing so asserts a historicist belief in the inescapable embeddedness of the human condition in the flux and flow of evolutionary change. There is, from his perspective, no neutral, ahistorical standpoint, no “God’s-eye viewpoint” from which to gain a Parmenidean perspective on what there is. What we can assent to is a plurality of standpoints that achieve social acceptance because of their utility in and for the here and now.
A natural order of reason is one more “relic” of the idea that truth consists of correspondence to the intrinsic nature of things. Absent an ahistorical standpoint from which to judge the intrinsic nature of reality, there is no such thing as a proposition that is justified without qualification or an argument which will better approximate the truth per se. For Rorty, there is no natural context-independent reason which somehow heralds and underlies all descriptive vocabulary. He considers the idea of context-independent truth a misguided effort to hypostatize the adjective “true” by repackaging it in epistemological terms of the Platonic attempt to hypostatize the adjective ‘good.’ Only such hypostatization causes one to believe that there is a goal of inquiry beyond justification to relevant contemporary audiences. Rorty holds: “All reasons are reasons for a particular people, restrained by spatial, temporal, and social conditions.” When we have justified our beliefs to an audience considered pertinent, we need not make any further claims, universal or otherwise.
To insist on context-independence would be to endow reason with causal powers that enable a particular descriptive vocabulary to resist refutation regardless of time, place, and social conditions. Alternately, one could suppose an ideal audience with the ability to speak a privileged vocabulary that allows its speakers to escape human limits and achieve a God-like grasp of the totality of possibility. But Rorty insists that there is neither such an audience, nor a privileged vocabulary that provides a priori a language of justification with the potential to draw all mundane audiences into universal consensus. There are only diverse linguistic communities, each of which has its own final vocabulary and its shared context-embedded perspective on reality, a reality that is forever and already interpreted from that standpoint.
Since, from the Rortyan outlook, the reality-appearance distinction is a relic of our authoritarian ontotheological tradition—the transmutation of the extrinsic, non-human power (that must be submitted to) into the secularized intrinsic nature of reality that still carries with it all the authoritarian drawbacks inherent in the tradition’s outdated metaphor (for example, Habermasian “universal validity”)—then the secularized metaphor of power/submission ought to be discarded along with the remnants of its religious origin.
But Rorty does not want to throw out entirely the fruits of Western culture. To the contrary, he says that he is “lucky” to having been raised within this cultural tradition, especially because of its tendencies for critical analysis and tolerance. In this vein, Rorty responds to a Habermasian critique: “I regard it a fortunate historical accident that we find ourselves in a culture . . . which is highly sensitized to the need to go beyond (dogmatic borders of thought).” Nevertheless, he does not hold that his luck is any different from that felt by Germans who considered themselves fortunate to enroll in the Hitler Youth. It’s simply a chance matter as to which society one is born, and what set of beliefs is valued therein.
Carrying forward his naturalistic, Darwinian views, Rorty sees humans as creatures whose beliefs and desires are for the most part formed by a process of acculturation. With no non-relative criteria or standards for telling real justifications from merely apparent ones, it follows that there can be no teleological mechanism independent of specific social narratives to determine the socioethical superiority of one solidarity over another. Since we all acquire our moral identity and obligations from our native culture (the niche in which we find ourselves), why not embrace our own social virtues as valid and try to redefine the world in terms of them? This is Rorty’s argument for ethnocentricism; a position from which one “can give the notion such as ‘moral obligation’ a respectable, secular, non-transcendental sense by relativizing it to a historically contingent sense of moral identity.” And if this is a form of cultural relativism, so be it. Rorty does not fear relativism, since fear grows from the concern that there is nothing in the universe to hang onto except ourselves. This is his humanist point against the claim that reason transcends local opinion; there is only ourselves nested in the habits of action evolving over time into the current, contingent societal solidarities we find useful for achieving our purposes.
In line with Rorty’s nominalism is his idea of philosophy as metaphor. Once one abandons the search for truth and for a reality that is concealed behind the everyday world, the role of a social practice in the vanguard of cultural change and innovation (philosophical or otherwise) is, or ought to be, to liberate humanity from old metaphors that are rooted in superstition, mystification, and a religion-inspired mindset. He suggests that this can be done by offering new metaphors and reshaping vocabularies that will accommodate new, “abnormal” insights. In this function, philosophy will note the fears kindled by past practices as well as the hopes springing from the present, and reconcile them by avoiding ancient fallacies while projecting contemporary justified beliefs into the future. Key to this project is the acknowledgement that philosophical theories have tended to reify that which had been proposed in the past as useful metaphors. This cognitive “idolatry” is an outgrowth of the adoption of the correspondence theory of knowledge. Beginning with Plato’s use of perception to analogize the relation of the psyche to the Forms, philosophers have mistakenly tried to make a word-world connection in order to ground reality in thought. The trouble with this approach is that it causes one to look behind the vocabulary for a non-human entity or force which grounds its meaning in our consciousness. Rorty thinks that this representational scheme is wrongheaded because it confuses use for content. He holds that it is rather in the use of words that we come to grips with our ever-changing environment. Successful adaptation of metaphors to new conditions is more likely when one drops the expectation that words are made adequate by that environment, or a creative agency of that environment. It is left to humans to consciously fashion their own metaphors to cope with the world. Freed from the tyranny of locating and adopting a non-human vocabulary, human ingenuity and creativity will craft undreamt of possibilities as surely as Galileo reinvented our understanding of the “heavens” by jettisoning of the outmoded Aristotelian crystalline celestial metaphor, or as Thomas Kuhn reinvented our understanding of paradigms by recasting the Kantian idiom.
Rorty’s anti-representationalism is closely associated with his anti-essential nominalism. While Rorty does not doubt that there is a reality that is recalcitrant to some (but not all) linguistic approaches (that is to say that not all attempts at constructing language-games prove useful to our local purposes work), he rejects that there can ever be a narrative that has a privileged viewpoint and/or has the final determination on “What there is.” Traditional Western Philosophy’s establishment of, alternately, rationalist, empiricist or transcendental worldviews to address the problem of depicting in words and ideas what is, in fact, does not so much outline a pattern of progress in expressing more adequate illustrations of reality; rather, it presents a history of the “idea idea” which Rorty holds as a red herring. Since the time of Plato, struggles over first principles have yielded academic debates that are seemingly endless attempts to characterize the world, but that are counterproductive to conversations aimed at changing the world. Rorty suggests that philosophers change the subject. Subject-changing is possible because there can be no common framework in which all minds participate. The possibility of different language-games offers a multitude of frameworks from which to choose, given Rorty’s anti-representational stance. No framework is more or less part of the fabric of the universe. Rather, dialogue ought to supersede certainty; interpretation to trump the search for truth. First-order philosophical search for a stable, final vocabulary that coherently captures the world in words or accurately corresponds to it drops out and is replaced with narrative-driven conversation. The plurality of interpretations that follows opens the way for an ever-evolving exchange concerning the function of proposed statements relative to a context; a series of pragmatic dialogues about what course of action is best fitted to a contemporary situation.
A special case stands out for Rorty’s anti-representationalist critique, that of scientism. Since the Enlightenment, objectivity via method has been the standard for scientific investigators. The systematic reading of the material world by those who are expert in the vocabulary of the sciences (that is, the quantification of observation statements) privileges these “rational” interpretations over all others. The assumption is that the universe is at its core a unified complex readily available for accurate and thorough analysis once one assumes the proper epistemological stance. And once taken that stance will build upon itself in an ever-increasing accumulation of objective knowledge. This optimistic progressivism is questioned by Rorty. Following Dewey’s dismissal of the dispassionate, autonomous knower of culturally neutral, objective knowledge, Rorty criticizes scientism’s image of the givenness of the world and the ability of scientists to discover the rational structures inherent in it. Viewing knowledge as an historical and cultural artifact, Rorty wishes to replace scientism’s systematic worldview with an “edifying” philosophy that treats science as just one among many non-privileged approaches, each of which projects sets of rules designed to bring about the well-being of a community. The choice of which of these approaches is most beneficial is the topic of the open-ended, interdisciplinary conversation favored by Rorty. Being free from teleological constraint, this sort of dialogue carries with it the expectation that convergent consensus is never possible; thus science cannot be the focal point of, or unique conduit for, an ever improving meeting of minds. Instead, Rorty considers all consensuses as contingent, partial, and on-going solidarities directed toward some specific practical outcome.
With no neutral ground from which to establish convergent consensus, all positions are competing ideas; presumed goods struggling for their existence. Thus, each is a live option until the practice is accepted by, or it is abandoned as non-workable for, a society. Appeals beyond the social environment have been eliminated by Rorty’s anti-foundational and anti-essential stances. Without a vocabulary that captures either the way the world is or a core human nature, there is never any possibility to locate a metaphysical foundation for truth. Equally unrealizable is a distinct epistemological platform from which to resolve differences between incongruent intuitions. Without transcendent or transpersonal standards, Liberal and Conservative narratives, atheist and fundamentalist ideologies, and realist and pragmatist approaches all vie equally for a cultural niche determining what works for a group at a given time. With everything unanchored and in flux, there is never a settled outcome, no final vocabulary that prevents the emergence of novel practices that threaten to eclipse the established ways of life. A plurality of metaphors thrives and in doing so upsets the settled, the canonical, the convergent consensus, keeping the conversation going. Rorty contends that it is the bruising competition among rival frameworks, including his own, that will result in a shakeout of the best framework fit for the times, around which will form a solidarity (albeit, contingently) of similarly-minded individuals. And the bounty of ideas, project, and programs will be surprisingly novel and astoundingly different.
The idea of a convergent consensus is built around the expectation that there is a grounding metaphysical standard “beyond” the flux of time, culture and circumstance, and that this standard has been the object of search for millennia. But to locate this standard, the seekers already must be at the consensus point which is being sought; they must already know what this is in order to find the real. Rorty considers this sort of Platonist reminiscence to be a vicious circle that assumes the consequent, i.e., that an objective point of view, in fact, exists. Even the Kantian attempt to circumvent this problem by asserting that we can have a priori knowledge of objects that we constitute ignores the troubling fact, according to Rorty, that Kant never explained how we have apodictic knowledge of the “constituting activities” of a transcendental ego. This attempt at self-foundation founders in another, more threatening way. In the placing of the “outer” into the “inner, constituting space,” the rational mind (seen as Reason itself) becomes the arbiter of cultural norms (“culture” being conceived as a collection of knowledge claims). Thus the discipline of philosophy becomes the keeper of the status quo, whose opinions and mode of thinking becomes the one true standard for any other discipline to measure itself against. However, Rorty emphatically denies that Philosophy as a discipline holds this crucial role. In fact, he argues that we should put aside the Kantian distinctions between disciplines as inegalitarian, and favor an open-mindedness based upon the Jeffersonian model of religious tolerance.
This Jeffersonian strategy, in line with Rorty’s historicist anti-foundationalism and anti-essentialist nominalism, is designed to encourage the abandonment of any claim of the discovery of an all-encompassing system of thought that serves as the legitimizer of all other practices. Seen as a remnant of the onto-theological period in human thinking, systematic philosophy suffers the same ills as traditional dogmatic theologies in that they both project as universal historically embedded, cultural values. The remedy that Rorty wishes to apply to this systematizing is to split public practices from private beliefs, treating all theories as narratives on par with each other, and to shelter edifying impulses toward poetic self-creativity from all pressures to conform. This dual strategy levels the playing field in the public sector, allowing unrestricted democratic dialogue between groups holding rival narratives (solidarities), while at the same time liberating creative thought from the normalizing restraints of the alleged privileged rationality asserted by Theological, Philosophical or Scientific solidarities. What is denied in Rorty’s Jeffersonian strategy is any universal commensuration in either the epistemological or metaphysical sphere, as well as the privilege of the rational in a supposed hierarchical system of reality. What is gained is the possibility for the expression of alternative, “abnormal” voices in the conversation of humankind, which, in potential, may prove to be persuasive enough to draw a growing number of adherents into its ranks, thereby creating a new solidarity better adapted to the contemporary environment, with its unique set of issues and requirements than are prior narratives. The evolution of unique narratives is progressive in the sense that each society and every era can discard encrusted customs and embrace novel practices that seem best in addressing the problems at hand. It is also contingent because there can be no final vocabulary that gets it right about human nature or the nature of existence. All is in play “all the way down” in an essence-less world where any foundational pretence to a harmony between the human subject and the objects of knowledge is eschewed, and where justification is confined to “beliefs that cannot swing free from the nonhuman environment.”
Rorty sees the division between reductive materialism and subjectivism as a pseudo-problem originating with the Cartesian mind-body dualism. These incommensurate descriptions both pose as the sole truth on the subject of the nature of ontologically real objects. Wishing to “dedivinize” philosophy, science and discussions on the self, Rorty occasionally concentrates on the last of this troika in an effort to unsettle the western notion about an underlying substantial metaphysical center grounding existence. In his “Contingency of Selfhood,” Rorty defends contingencies and discontinuities of the “I” against realist thought. It is plausible that most Enlightenment thinkers could not fathom how inert matter and its motion could account for the first person experience of human consciousness. Rorty suggests that fear against the association of selfhood to the dying human animal may be a motivation for philosophers since Plato to posit a central essence for individuals. To this concern Rorty resorts to non-reductive materialism to explain away the mind-body issue that has concerned thoughtful people for the last four hundred years.
The use of descriptive vocabularies plays an important part in Rorty’s gloss on the human “self.” In his narrative, one vocabulary is centered on the description of physical objects and another is concerned with the discursive agent. The discursive agent may redescribe all objects, including him/herself, as subject in ever more “abnormal” terms without limits. Nevertheless, once a description is dedicated to a physicalist’s accounts of brain activity, it becomes incumbent upon the describing agent to note differences in human experience with a different vocabulary, vocabulary that does not assume the consequent concerning the alleged existence of the mind independent from the body. Rorty claims to do this by assigning parallel descriptions to both mind and brain without claiming that there is a center to either.
Whereas the brain can be redescribed as the continual reweaving of the electrical charges across the web of neural synapses, the mind can be redescribed as the constant reweaving of different beliefs and desires, redistributing truth values among the web of interlocking statements. Under Rorty’s description the brain is simply the amalgamation of synapses with no center, i.e., nothing that is independent of this agglomeration. Equally, Rorty holds that the mind is exactly a contingent network of beliefs and desires, having nothing at its core to which the bundled beliefs and desires adhere. It follows there is no self that has these mental elements, rather the self is these elements, and nothing more. Gone is the Cartesian tendency to reify the self and a material object as substantial in order to acknowledge that they each have causal effects. Gone is the mistaken idea of a self as an object represented to ourselves (for example, Descartes’ claim that he is a “thinking thing”). And gone also is the urge to completely separate the mental from the physical ontologically. There are two incommensurate descriptions of causal interaction. In this way, Rorty’s non-reductive materialist account of the self accords well with his nominalism, which rejects the sentence-fact dichotomy as firmly as his anti-essentialism rejects the subject-object split.
Of course, in keeping with Rorty’s narrative, there is no reason why one should limit the descriptions of the self, the mind, and the brain to Rorty’s vocabulary usage. If sometime in the future it serves the purpose of those who live at the time to redescribe Rorty’s account, say along strictly neuron-physiological lines that may accurately pair specific beliefs and desires to identifiable brain functions, then its utility would demand the adoption of this narrative. But until then, Rorty would argue for a holistic approach that does not seek a one-to-one identity between brain functions and mental occurrences, or a reduction of one to the other.
A philosophy that is controversial and iconoclastic as Richard Rorty’s is bound to have an abundance of critics. Space permits the consideration of only a few, those considered serious objections to his neopragmatism. Here is a representative sample of philosophers who pose challenges to key aspects of Rorty’s philosophy.
Hilary Putnam doubts Rorty’s ability to sustain his claim to be a pragmatic realist. Turning to Rorty’s pivotal view of justification, Putnam, in Rorty and His Critics (Brandom: 2000), characterizes it as having two aspects: contextual and reforming. About the former, Putnam says that Rorty, by making justification a sociological matter, has apparently made a commitment to majority sentiment. Nevertheless, Putnam declares, by allowing that the majority can be wrong, Rorty is being either incoherent or illicitly introducing a standard that is independent of the social context. Knowing that Rorty rejects ahistorical foundations Putnam takes up the reformist aspect of Rortyan justification to see if Rorty can escape his apparent inconsistency. Rorty’s reformist position suggests that progress in talking and acting results not from being more adequate to some non-human (natural or transcendent) independent standard than one’s predecessors. Rather progress occurs because it seems to us to be clearly better. To this definition of progress Putnam responds that whether the outcome of some reform is deemed to be good or bad is logically independent from whether most people see it as a reform. Otherwise, the meaning of “progress” reduces to a subjective notion and “reform” to an arbitrary preference for a way of life. Therefore, the implication is that if we are to meaningfully use the terms “progress” and “reform,” there has to be better and worse non-subjective standards and norms. So it follows that there are non-sociological, objective ways to appreciate reality. Otherwise in a Rortyan anti-representationalist world of competing “stories” enabling one to cope or failing to help one cope with the “environment,” Rorty’s own narrative of redescriptions becomes one among many non-privileged, solipsistic perspectives, and thus loses its persuasive power.
James Conant and John McDonald complement Putnam’s position. James Conant argues that Rorty’s narrative, when taken to its logical conclusion ultimately undermines the tolerant, liberal, egalitarian society Rorty claims to value. Conant offers that a liberal democratic community must contain three internally-linked, non-transcendent concepts necessary for human voice: freedom, community, and truth. He argues that in the absence of this interlocking troika an alternative triad arises: the prevalence of solitude, uniformity, and an Orwellian doublethink. This latter threesome force upon those inculcated into such a social order barren conformity to meta-ideology that denies the very ability to reformulate language in ways that might threaten the veracity of that order. This is accomplished by relativizing truth; by reducing truth to the status of empty compliments and by utilizing cautionary doubt as a method by which each individual replaces inconvenient memories with group ‘justified’ assertions.
John McDowell refines Putnam’s position, by offering a distinction that actually makes Rorty, Putnam, and Kant allies! He attempts this difficult association by distinguishing the fear of a contingent life and the subsequent appeal to a Freudian father-like force that provides us iron-clad answers and norms to live up to from the desire to have us answerable to the way things are. McDowell suggests that Kant too wished to combat the denial of human finitude, and the consequent withdrawal from the contingent into the safety of an eternal realm, by claiming that appearance was not a barrier preventing us from gazing at reality objectively, but is the very reality we as rational human beings aspire to know. In this way McDowell thinks that Kant, admittedly anti-metaphysical, was as anti-priesthood as Dewey—extending the Protestant Reformation’s idiosyncratic connection to a non-human reality into Philosophy—and in line with Rorty’s anti-epistemology stance—that we are always ensconced within the human frame of reference. The upshot of McDowell’s distinction of objectivity from epistemic escapism is that even as we are located inextricably within a vocabulary there can be joined a unified discourse where the combination of a disquotational, descriptive use of the word “true” and the use of “true” that treats this term as a norm of inquiry is possible.
Conant builds Putnam’s and McDowell’s arguments for the ascendancy of objectivity (properly understood) over solidarity by linking Orwell’s “Newspeak” and Rorty’s New Pragmatism. Conant constructs his argument first by offering the non-controversial claim that freedom of belief is achievable only when one can decide for oneself concerning the facts in a community that nurtures this sort of freedom. This community can only be sustained when its norms of inquiry are not biased toward lock-step solidarity with one’s peers, but are geared toward the encouragement of independent attempts at relating one’s claims about the way things are with the way things are, in fact (or as Conant writes: ‘turning to the facts’). Real human freedom can be expressed when one is able to autonomously believe and to test one’s belief for its truth and falsity in a public forum unconstrained by sociological determinants. Freedom, Conant claims, is therefore a human capacity that emerges from the human condition and need not be attributable to any Realist thesis. Thus, Conant agrees with Rorty that there is nothing deep within us; there isn’t any indestructible nature or eternal substance. Nevertheless, a systematic effort to eliminate the vocabulary containing terms such as ‘eternal truths,’ ‘objective reality,’ and traits ‘essential to humanity’ would be akin to George Orwell’s Newspeak, in that such an elimination would render impossible human freedom by making it impossible to share in language such ideas and concepts. The very possibility of interpretive communication and dialogue among free thinkers engaged in the search for truth would be banished by the sort of control exerted over language that Rorty ironically insists is necessary to change vocabularies and to establish a liberal democratic utopia.
Donald Davidson combines the theory of action with the theory of truth and meaning. For him an account of truth is simultaneously an account of agency and vice versa. By referring to “rationality,” “normativity,” “intentionality,” and “agency” as if they were co-extensive predicates, Davidson is able to claim that descriptions emerge as descriptions of any sort only against a taken-for-granted background of purposeful action. Agency—the ability to offer descriptions rather than merely make noise—only appears if a normative vocabulary is already in use. Normative behavior on the part of the communicators involved makes the case that the intentional stance is unlike the biological stance. In Rorty and His Critics, Davidson raises the “underdetermination/radical interpretation” issue, disputing Rorty’s long-held pragmatic claim that there is no significant philosophical difference between the psychological and the biological, as there is no significant difference between the biological and the chemical, once we abandon the idea of “adequacy to the world.”
Bjorn Ramberg, in support of Davidson’s contention in “Post-ontological Philosophy of Mind: Rorty Versus Davidson,” suggests that the linkage between mind and body is not the irreducibility of the intentional to the physical, but the understanding of the inescapability of the normative. Considering each other as persons with mutual obligations presupposes all pragmatic choices of descriptive vocabularies. We could never deploy some descriptive narrative unless we first deployed a normative vocabulary. As followers of norms, we cannot stop prescribing and just describe. Describing is part and parcel of a rule-governed conversation, an exchange conducted by people who talk to each other assuming the vocabulary of agency. Thus, members of a community are to be considered as interlocutors and not as “parametrics” (causal happenings). Rorty is correct in that there are many descriptive vocabularies (ways to bring salience to different causal patterns of the world) and many different communities of language-users. Yet, until recently, Rorty did not accept Davidson’s position that all individuals who engage others in descriptive language-use must speak prescriptively (see section 3e above), or that it is the inescapability of the vocabulary of normality (rather than the claims about the irreducibility of intentionality, rejected by Rorty) that marks off agency from biology. This leads directly to Davidson’s Doctrine of Triangulation. We are a plurality of agents (one corner of a triangle) each engaged in the project of describing to each other the “world” (a second corner), and interpreting each other’s descriptions of it (the third corner). As Ramberg writes:
We can while triangulating criticize any given claim about any description, we cannot ask for an agreement on the process of triangulation itself, for it would be another case of triangulation. The inescapability of norms is the inescapability—for both the describers and agents—of triangulation.
Davidson’s insight, as elucidated by Ramberg, has caused Rorty to revise his view that norms are set within solidarities alone. Rorty now holds that norms hover, so to speak, “over the whole process of triangulation.” While he still does not accept the positing of a second norm of factual reality as suggested by John McDowell, the emergent property of norms springing from dialogue cannot be reduced to, or identified with its biological (in a fashion similar to flocking, schooling, etc) or chemical (like H2O from hydrogen and oxygen, and so forth) counterparts.
Daniel Dennett, in “Faith in the Truth” and “Postmodernism and Truth,” rejects postmodern critiques of physicalist science. Dennett’s target is relativism. Specifically, he charges that Rorty’s stance against the “chauvinism of scientism” leads to blurring the line between serious scientific debate and frivolous historicist exchanges that include science merely as one of many voices in the conversation of humankind. Thus, there is a danger in jettisoning “the matter of fact versus no matter of fact distinction.” What is lost is the ability to make true assertions about reality in terms other than the sociological. Dennett objects to the postmodern notion that what is true today—that leads us to assert, for example, that DNA is a double helix—may not be true tomorrow if the conversation shifts. Rather, he claims that there are actual justifications of what certain sociological facts obtain when it comes to the natural sciences (that is, that there is more agreement among scientists, that the scientific language-game is a better predictor of future events than other vocabularies, and so forth). To confirm our observations we must form good representations of reality. This is what allows these representations to be justified, beyond being good tools that lead to further coping strategies vis-à-vis nature. Otherwise, Rorty’s attitude—expressed as “give us the tools, make the moves, and then say whatever you please about their representational abilities. . . (f)or what you say will be, in the pejorative sense, ‘merely philosophical’”—dismisses scientific objectivity while aiding and abetting postmodern relativists who threaten to replace theory with jargon. Dennett considers writers holding such attitudes to be in “flatfooted ignorance of the proven methods of scientific truth-seeking and their power.”
Jürgen Habermas writes in “Richard Rorty’s Pragmatic Turn,” “In forfeiting the binding power of its judgments, metaphysics also loses it substance.” With its loss philosophy can be rescued from its drift only by a post-metaphysics “metaphysics.” This is what Rorty is attempting to do. In his hands, philosophy must become more than academic; it must become relevant in a practical way. Recasting Heidegger in post-analytic terms, Rorty see the deflationary trends in contemporary philosophy as leading to its own negation if left unchecked by edifying creativity. It is a pattern that can lead to extinction if there is not new life breathed into old metaphors by restating them, stripped of their Platonic bias. Central to this bias, according to Habermas’ understanding of Rorty, is the Platonic distinction between “convincing” and “persuading.” Rorty wishes to replace the representational model of knowledge with a communication model that means to replace objectivity with successful intersubjective solidarity. But, Habermas contends that the vocabulary which Rorty employs blurs the line between participant and observer. By assimilating interpersonal relationships into adaptive, instrumental behaviors, Rorty cannot distinguish between the use of language directed towards successful actions and its use oriented toward achieving understanding. Without a conceptual marker to distinguish manipulation from argumentation, “between motivating through reason and causal exertion of influence, between learning and indoctrination,” Habermas concludes that Rorty’s project results in a loss of critical standards that make a real difference in our everyday practices.
Nancy Fraser provides in her “From Irony to Prophecy to Politics: A Response to Richard Rorty” a Habermasian case of Rorty’s difficulty in distinguishing between edification and indoctrination. While Fraser is sympathetic to Rorty’s anti-essentialist stance and his linguistic turn relative to politics and power, she has objected to his depiction of the process he suggests for the advancement of causes, Feminist or otherwise. In her response to Rorty’s “Feminism and Pragmatism,” Fraser rejects the notion advanced by Rorty that women must make a complete break with the memes that have been employed by males in Western cultures and redefine themselves out of whole cloth. The reason she gives for her objection is that the neo-Darwinian revolutionary vision that Rorty offers to Feminism is itself too embedded in the chauvinism of the past. Likening the suggested redefinition of memes to form a new feminist solidarity to the Oedipal struggle between a son and his father—manifested in the need for women to confront and overthrow those males who currently assert their semantic authority—Fraser dismisses Rorty’s zero-sum-game struggle over semantic space as one that replicates the male competitive model and does not easily fit into the psychological profile of pluralist, communal dialogue that contemporary feminists favor.
Furthermore, Fraser questions the notion of women forming solidarities, or as Rorty puts it “feminist clubs,” for the purpose of redefining themselves. She wonders which of the various definitions (for example, radical, liberal, Marxist, socialist, traditionalist, and so forth) will count as “taking the viewpoint of women as “women”? Would this not be an imposition of semantic authority by one elite, privileged “club” onto all other women? And would this not be a return to the Oedipal, confrontational style she is rejecting by inflaming the definitional differences among women along masculinist lines of class, sexual preference, and racial categories? Therefore, Fraser wants there to be a political movement along the lines of democratic socialism, where the various voices of women (and other feminists) move to create (and not discover or be assigned even in the most supportive terms) their own post-rationalist meanings, thus empowering women to speak for themselves, not as “prophets” but as themselves.
Similarly, Norman Geras takes exception to Rorty’s liberalism and his democracy of hope. Geras’s “Solidarity in the Conversation of Humanity (1995) is concerned with the possibility (more to the point, the impossibility) of a (Deweyan) humanism without any human nature. In this work, Geras refers to a lecture given by Rorty in the 1993 Oxford Amnesty series on “Human Rights”: the culture of human rights is, Rorty says, a “welcome fact of the post-Holocaust world”; it is “morally superior to other cultures.” Such affirmations, Geras notes, are part of the more general viewpoint Rorty recommends to western cultures: the viewpoint of liberalism without philosophical foundations, a pragmatically inspired hope for a tolerant and open democratic society on the basis of historical contingencies only. But in answering Geras’ rhetorical question “To whose morality is Rorty referring?” it seems, at first glance, that Rorty would answer that it is the solidarity of western liberal individuals’ values. Upon reflection, however, it would be a surprise if most of these liberals agreed with Rorty’s view on the denatured self and the ungroundedness of supporting humanitarian principles. Therefore, with principles being ad hoc adaptations of past ethnocentric norms and without the firm peg of a centered self upon which to hang his web of beliefs, Rorty has to be advancing his own idiosyncratic values. Furthermore, his values are packaged persuasively by the artful use of equivocations, allegedly as part and parcel of the human right’s culture based on a universalist notion of transcultural human integrity, notions that Rorty stoutly rejects. In short, Rorty’s reading of the human rights culture appropriates the notion of rights for his own anti-foundational, pragmatic ends: the command of semantic space of his view of humanity’s future. By doing so, Geras contends, in line with Habermas, there can be no clear distinction between the Rortyan democratic contribution to a dialogue on human ideals and a subtle insinuation of his idiosyncratic viewpoint into everyday practices making the world in his own image.
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