Sir William David Ross was a British philosopher, college administrator, WW I veteran, civil servant, and humanities scholar best known for his important contributions to moral philosophy and the study of classical literature. In the field of classical studies, in addition to shorter works on Plato and Aristotle, his major triumph was his editorship of the Oxford English translations of Aristotle’s complete works, a production of historic magnitude and impact. In moral philosophy, in addition to a short critique of Kantian ethics, his great accomplishment was the formulation of a major new ethical theory, a unique and still controversial system that combines deontological pluralism, ethical intuitionism, non-naturalism, and so-called prima facie duties. Taken as a whole, Ross’s work represents an impressive and in some respects singular and unprecedented achievement. Indeed, apart from Sir Isaiah Berlin who was his peer at Oxford University, it is hard to think of another modern British academic philosopher who similarly distinguished himself not only as a first-rate critic and original theorist, but also as a high-level scholar, educator, editor, translator, administrator, and public official. Dry, rigorous, unostentatious, Ross resembles Aristotle and Kant. Like them, he is seldom electrifying, but always thoughtful, provocative, and edifying. Certainly, the “worthy thane of Ross,” as his namesake is hailed in Macbeth, rates as a key figure in modern intellectual history and as one the most important British philosophers of the twentieth century.
Sir William David Ross was born in Thurso, a small industrial, fishing, and tourist community in the county of Caithness on the northern coast of Scotland. He was the son of John Ross, an eminent teacher and school administrator. After spending the first six years of his life in India, where his father served as the first Principal of the Maharajah’s College at Travancore, Ross returned to Scotland and received his early education at the Royal High School in Edinburgh. He attended college at the University of Edinburgh and in 1895 graduated with first-class honors in classical studies. He continued his education at Balliol College, Oxford, graduating in 1898 with firsts in classics and humanities. In 1900 he was offered a lectureship at Oriel College, Oxford. In 1906 he married the former Edith Helen Ogden (d. 1953) with whom he had four daughters. Ross remained at Oxford for nearly fifty years, serving on the faculty and in various administrative positions, including Provost of Oriel College (from 1929 to 1947) and Vice-Chancellor of the University (from 1941 to 1944).
In the course of his distinguished academic career Ross achieved international recognition and acclaim for his contributions to ethical theory and classical studies. In addition to studies of Plato, Aristotle, and Kant, he also published two important and highly influential works of moral philosophy: The Right and the Good (1930) and Foundations of Ethics (1939). One of his foremost academic accomplishments was his editorship of the Oxford English translations of the complete works of Aristotle, a production of 11 volumes (1908-1931), to which he himself contributed well received and still widely used translations of the Metaphysics and the Nichomachean Ethics. In 1939 Ross served as President of the Aristotelian Society, the London-based organization founded in 1880 and dedicated to the promotion of philosophy as an intrinsically rewarding, life-enhancing communal enterprise.
In addition to his academic work, Ross also compiled a notable record of public service and civil administration. In 1915 he joined the British army and served in the Ministry of Munitions, rising to the rank of major and the position of Deputy Secretary. After the war he was awarded the OBE, and in 1938, in further recognition of his military accomplishments, he was officially knighted. From 1936-1940 he served as President of the British Academy, and in 1947 he was named president of the world’s oldest and largest academic federation, the Union Académique Internationale, an organization noted for its promotion of international cooperation in the pursuit of learning.
During and after WW II, Ross continued to serve in some type of public capacity or civic role, occupying a seat on an appeals panel for conscientious objectors and also serving as a member of Britain’s National Arbitration Tribunal (which set wage and price controls, arbitrated work stoppages, established anti-inflation policies, and settled economic conflicts and legal disputes during the war). After his retirement from academic and public life, Ross continued his lifelong study of philosophy. He died at Oxford on May 5, 1971.
In 1948, at the invitation of Queen’s University, Belfast, Ross delivered the annual Dill Memorial Lecture, named in honor of Sir Samuel Dill, a respected scholar and professor of Greek and Roman history. This lecture became the basis for an eventual book, Plato’s Theory of Ideas, which was originally published in 1951 and then later revised and corrected in a second edition of 1953.
Ross’s book is a formidable work of scholarship on Plato’s metaphysics and epistemology with special emphasis on the philosopher’s celebrated, historically important, and still highly controversial doctrine of Ideas. Ross’s method is that of classical philology, and his study follows in the footsteps of the previous work of James Alexander Stewart (1846-1933), his predecessor in the White’s chair of moral philosophy at Oxford. In essence, Ross provides close readings and commentaries on selected Platonic dialogues, with his main purpose being to show how each dialogue adds to, revises, or modifies Plato’s evolving theory.
Ross begins his inquiry by offering his best guess as to the probable chronology of Plato’s works, drawing not only on the consensus of scholarly opinion but also on the internal stylometric evidence of the dialogues themselves. (Stylistically and structurally, the earlier dialogues tend to be relatively simple and straightforward, the middle ones – especially the Cratylus and the Symposium – tend to be more playful, ironic, and experimental, and the later ones tend to be less fanciful and more controlled, though still relatively intricate and complex)
Ross contends that it is in the Euthryphro, a comparatively early work, that the word ἰδέα (literally something visible; something that can be seen) first appears in its “special Platonic sense” of an ideal Form or universal. He goes on to argue that the theory of forms is more fully developed and explained in two relatively late dialogues, the Philebus and the Timaeus, and maintains that it is in two of the latest and most complex of Plato’s writings, the Laws and the Seventh Letter, that the doctrine is given its richest and most mature formulation.
According to Ross, the pivotal text in the development of Plato’s philosophy is the Parmenides, a middle to late text in which the title character and his colleague Zeno probe for defects and attempt to punch holes in the theory of universals as maintained by the young Socrates. Ross was one of the first scholarly commentators on Plato to interpret this dialogue not, as several previous critics had viewed it, as a mere whimsical parody or “philosophical jest,” but as a serious experiment in self-criticism on Plato’s part in which the philosopher takes the opportunity to cross-examine himself and evaluate the strengths and weaknesses of his own doctrine. In effect, Ross sees Plato here articulating and attempting to come to grips with two major objections to his theory. The first is the so-called “third man” argument, which accuses the theory of leading to an infinite regress. (It is claimed, for example, that if a man is a man by virtue of his sharing or imitating the Form of Man, there must also be another Form of Man that both the man and the Form of Man share, and so on ad infinitum). Ross defends Plato’s theory against this argument and shows that it arises as a result of the slipperiness and ambiguity inherent in Plato’s own language (specifically, in the Greek verbs for “share,” “imitate,” and “participate.”)
The second criticism that Plato anticipates and tries to defend himself against (not entirely successfully in Ross’s view) is an objection that was later raised by Aristotle: namely, to affirm that the Ideas and their appearances are completely separate (that is, to claim that they indeed inhabit two entirely different realms with no interconnection or relationship of any kind), would seem to lead to a logical contradiction and philosophical absurdity. At some level, and to at least a minimal extent, Forms must stand in some type of relation with the particulars that exemplify them.
Ideal Redness, that is to say, has to share at least some definable relationship with apples, cherries, fire trucks, and other actual red things. Unfortunately, as Ross points out, Plato is seldom clear or consistent in describing the exact nature of this relationship. In the early dialogues, for instance, he seems to view the Ideas as immanent attributes or qualities (that is, as universal properties present within and manifested through sensible things). However, in the later writings he more often describes the Ideas as if they were transcendent paradigms; indeed he describes them (in the Phaedrus) as if they inhabited a pure realm or space of their own – a “hyper-uranian” or “supra-celestial” world entirely separate and independent from the world of material things and the objects of sense.
According to Ross, what makes this issue especially problematic is that even in the later dialogues Plato frequently reverts to the language of immanence. Ross speculates that this is probably because Plato himself never reached a definitive view of the matter and thus found it convenient to use the language of immanence in some cases (as, for example, when he suggests that a particular may exemplify or partake of a universal property) and the language of transcendence in others (as when he describes a particular as being an imperfect copy or imitation of a paradigmatic Form).
According to Ross, even though Plato is vague and inconsistent on the exact relationship of the Ideas to the objects of sense, he is clear and emphatic on two other important points: (1) He maintains that there is at least one respect in which Ideas are essentially different from the sensible things that embody or imitate them: namely, the Ideas are eternal and immutable whereas the objects of sense are impermanent and subject to change. (2) He holds that Ideas aren’t merely subjective phenomena that exist only in the mind, but are instead ultimate realities and “completely objective.” In other words, they would exist even if there were no human minds to apprehend or perceive them.
In the end, Ross winds up in the camp of critics who view Plato as ultimately closer to the metaphysics and ontology of Aristotle (according to whom Ideas and particulars are deeply intertwined and practically inseparable) than to the view of Plotinus (who viewed the realm of being as a grand hierarchy, emanating from and ultimately surmounted and transcended by an indefinable, absolute, ideal reality, The One).
Surprisingly, Plato’s Theory of Ideas contains hardly any discussion at all of Platonic ethics. Indeed, despite Ross’s deep personal interest in and original contributions to moral theory, he never actually comments on any of the ethical concerns or lively moral disputes (for example, whether right and wrong are objective or subjective, whether all wrong-doing is due to ignorance on the part of the agent, whether virtue and goodness can be taught, and so on) that occupy Socrates in several of the Platonic dialogs.
Although Ross foregoes any direct commentary on these debates, he does make several references to Plato’s enigmatic Idea of the Good, the ultimate object of knowledge in Plato’s philosophy and the font and origin of all being and value in the Platonic system. This idea, most famously expressed via the simile of the Cave and the Sun (in the Republic, Book VII), appears to have exercised a considerable influence on Ross’s own philosophical thought (indeed, Ross’s notion that we grasp moral truths “intuitively,” as if via some type of innate knowledge or through an immediate, subliminal process of recognition and intellection is essentially Platonic in origin). In the end, it is therefore a bit disappointing not to find, if not a detailed examination of the Idea of the Good or of the intimations of moral intuitionism present in Platonic ethics, at least some acknowledgment on Ross’s part of his personal debt and kinship to his great Greek predecessor.
Even if he had never published The Right and the Good and become one of the leading figures of the analytic school and an important name in twentieth-century moral philosophy, Ross would still have gained lasting renown as a classics scholar. Indeed, during his lifetime, he earned as much acclaim for his accomplishments as the general editor of the 11-volume (eventually 12-volume) Oxford translation of the complete works of Aristotle as he did as for his innovative and provocative work in ethics.
The “Oxford,” as it is still popularly known, is a magisterial and historic literary achievement. At the time of its undertaking, there was but one extant English-language edition of Aristotle’s complete works, Thomas Taylor’s 10-volume translation of 1810. And since Taylor’s century-old edition had received only a limited printing, copies of it were scarce and nearly impossible to come by. Consequently, there was an urgent need for a new and authoritative set of translations in a format suitable and convenient not only for students and scholars but for non-academics and general readers as well. Along came Ross and his team of translators, a mix of veteran scholars and rising young talent specially selected to meet this exacting new challenge.
The project, spearheaded by Ross and his assistant editor J. A. Smith, took more than two decades. The first volume to be published (which became volume 8 in the completed series) was Ross’s own translation of the Metaphysics, which appeared in 1908. The final published volume (volume 3 of the completed edition) appeared in 1931. It contained translations of Meteorology, On the Soul (De Anima), the so-called Short Physical Treatises (Parva Naturalia), and On the Universe (De Mundo; a work that Ross himself dismissed as either spurious or of dubious authorship and which is now generally considered pseudepigraphical). In 1952 Ross added his own translation of various fragments of Aristotle. Although not part of the original project, this compilation was published as volume 12 of the Oxford series.
As general editor, Ross carefully reviewed existing English translations of Aristotle’s works and solicited and supervised the production of new ones from colleagues both within and outside the walls of Oxford. The final collection included an earlier (1885) translation of The Politics by the former Oxford vice-chancellor and renowned translator of Plato and Thucydides Benjamin Jowett. Jowett’s translation had already been hailed as “an English classic,” so Ross apparently judged that it was unnecessary and probably even futile to try to come up with a better one. The complete edition of the Oxford also included the still unsurpassed translation of the History of Animals (Historia Animalium) by Ross’s fellow countryman (and later fellow peer) Sir D’Arcy Wentworth Thompson.
The Oxford bears many earmarks and virtues of Ross’s own style and editorial preferences: plain diction; lucidity; straightforward syntax; precise logical organization; a tone that is serious, but not grave or ponderous; and an utter absence of needless adornment, euphuism, and gaudy rhetoric. Moreover, since Ross himself seemed to model his own prose after that of the scientific and analytic Aristotle, rather than the more poetic and dramatic Plato, it is neither surprising nor coincidental that the Oxford translations faithfully reproduce many of the best qualities and typical attributes of Aristotle’s own expository style. These attributes include clarity, directness, orderly and systematic presentation, and a meticulous exactness and thoroughness. Aristotle and Ross even share some of the same vices: both can be dry and over-technical at times and both (in time-honored professorial fashion) have a tendency to over-explain things.
Aristotle spiced his discourse with quotations and examples from the Homeric poems and indulged an occasional fondness for wordplay and neologisms (he invented the word “syllogism” along with terms like energeia – translated by Ross as “actuality” – and entelecheia – translated by Ross as “complete reality”). Ross favored examples and analogies from math and physics rather than imaginative literature – though he does light-heartedly quote Milton’s Satan at one point (“Evil, be thou my good,” R&G, 163). And despite his general preference for plain English, he was not averse to using an occasional jargon term or fancy Latinism (for example, “optimific” and “bonific”) as well as phrases of actual Latin, most notably his customized use of the tag prima facie (which, thanks to his usage, took on a new and specialized meaning in the field of deontological ethics).
Aristotle is highly metaphorical; Ross’s translations are not. The famous opening sentence of the Metaphysics provides a good example. Joe Sachs, perhaps the finest contemporary translator of Aristotle, renders it “All human beings by nature stretch themselves out toward knowing” (Metaphysics, Sachs, trans., 1). Ross translates it simply as “All men by nature desire to learn.” Sachs’ version is truly Aristotelian (capturing both the motion and effort in ὀρέγονται), but it is not exactly ordinary English. Ross’s translation is plain, spare, unadorned. It has the virtue of delivering the essence of Aristotle’s thought without drawing attention to itself – which is pretty much the case with the Oxford as a whole.
In 1923, while supervising the production of the Oxford, Ross published a general overview of the works of Aristotle. In the introduction to the 6th edition of the book, the philosopher J.L. Ackrill, an Oxford colleague of Ross’s, aptly describes it as a “concise and comprehensive account of Aristotle’s philosophical works,” pointedly adding that “no better account exists” (Ross, Aristotle, vii)
Besides being a convenient introduction to its subject, Ross’s Aristotle also serves as an illuminating guide to the author’s own philosophical thought, especially in the field of ethics. For even though Ross never became a major proponent of virtue ethics per se, his theory of prima facie duties has much in common with and was clearly influenced by core elements and principles of Aristotelian moral philosophy. To begin with, Aristotle’s pronouncement near the beginning of the Nichomachean Ethics that ethics is not an exact science like mathematics, but instead deals with “things that are only for the most part true” (1094 b 20), is a view frequently echoed by Ross. Of course in acknowledging this, Ross is by no means approving or endorsing relativism. He is simply pointing out that moral judgments are often difficult, and that people can (and frequently do) disagree about what is right or wrong in a given case. (The mere fact of their disagreement doesn’t mean that right and wrong are relative any more than, say, the fact that jurors may disagree on a verdict in a criminal trial means that the guilt or innocence of the accused is relative)
A key phrase in The Right and the Good is taken directly from the Nichomachean Ethics: — “the decision rests with perception” (Nichomachean Ethics, 1109 b 23, 1126 b 4; R&G, 42). In Aristotle this phrase is used in connection with the doctrine of the mean and refers to the fact that in many situations the exact mean (that is, the truly virtuous and appropriate action in a particular situation) may not be clear. In such doubtful instances the individual must rely on personal judgment to decide what is right. For example, suppose you observe a parent “correcting” a child in public. The behavior of the parent strikes you as lying somewhere in the twilight zone between extremely stern but still acceptable discipline and downright vicious and unacceptable verbal and physical abuse. What is your judgment of the situation, and how should you react? Should you say something to the parent? Should you intervene? According to Aristotle, “the decision rests with perception,” and if you are a person of good judgment and character, with a sense of what a truly virtuous person would do in the same situation, you’ll probably decide correctly and do the right thing.
In the case of Ross’s system of deontological pluralism and prima facie duties, “the decision rests with perception” refers to the resolution of ethical dilemmas, especially dilemmas that arise from the fact that rules of proper action and conduct may at times contradict each other. For example, my duty to tell the truth may conflict with my duty not to cause harm to another person. According to Ross, we typically resolve such dilemmas through an intuitive faculty and reasoning process similar to the personal judgment that Aristotle says we must employ when determining the truly virtuous action in a given case. Indeed, Ross even goes so far as to suggest that there is no moral decision or action that is not fraught with at least some element of conflict, however slight (R&G, 33-34). In many cases the conflict may seem relatively easy to resolve. For example, most of us would have little difficulty telling a lie if it saved innocent lives. Similarly, few of us would approve of enriching ourselves if it meant putting other people’s health at serious risk. On the other hand, many people find certain dilemmas (such as so-called “trolley problems” in which they must choose between causing the death of one person or permitting the death of several others) difficult and even stressful.
Another feature that Ross’s theory of prima facie duties shares in common with Aristotelian ethics is the respect that each theory gives to well established moral traditions and commonly held beliefs – the considered views, that is to say, of “the many and the wise.” At the beginning of the Nichomachean Ethics, Aristotle argues that a critical inquiry into moral values properly begins with and must take into account the “common opinions” (endoxa) of persons with broad life experience (1095 a 5) and of those who have been “brought up in good habits” (1095 b 5). His underlying assumption is that every reasonable and thoughtful adult will have at least a partial grasp of basic moral truths; and so wherever we find widespread agreement among a large number of such individuals, or among the most knowledgeable and experienced members of such a group, the more likely we are to discover moral perceptions and principles that are accurate and reliable (1098 b 27-29). Such commonly held principles and basic perceptions represent the appropriate starting point for any higher ethical inquiry or theoretical investigation:
We must . . . set the observed facts before us and, after first discussing the difficulties, go on to prove, if possible, the truth of all the common opinions about these affections of the mind, or, failing this, of the greater number and the most authoritative; for if we both refute the objections and leave the common opinions undisturbed, we shall have proved the case sufficiently. – Aristotle, Nichomachean Ethics, 1145 b 2-7 (emphasis added).
Ross’s theory rests on similar assumptions. Like Aristotle, Ross regards the common-sense moral opinions of “ordinary people,” and especially the views of “the many and the wise,” as a kind of ground zero or point of departure for moral theory. By ordinary people he means not just anyone or everyone, but only those who have reached a certain level of “mental maturity” and personal development (R&G, p. 12, 29). In addition, he looks upon principles and perceptions that have persisted for generations as having particular moral force and authority, and thus any theory that repeatedly contradicts those principles becomes immediately suspect. For example, if an ethical theory proved to be irreconcilably at odds with our “common-sense” or “everyday” conviction that we ought to keep promises, that fact in itself would be reasonable grounds for suspecting it of being erroneous or defective:
The existing body of moral convictions of the best people is the cumulative product of the moral reflection of many generations, which has developed an extremely delicate power of appreciation of moral distinctions; and this the theorist cannot afford to treat with anything other than the greatest respect. The verdicts of the moral consciousness of the best people are the foundation on which he must build; though he must first compare them with one another and eliminate any contradictions they may contain. (R&G, 41)
According to adherents of virtue theory, doing the right thing ultimately has less to do with defining and upholding basic ethical rules and duties than with molding good character and cultivating good habits of behavior. Ross, on the other hand, departs from virtue theory by insisting that there are certain fundamental rules or duties (such as our duty to keep promises or our duty to assist people in need) that are self-evident, duties that we know to be true and that we are obligated to uphold.
Despite the fact that Ross himself never fully subscribed to virtue ethics, he was nevertheless, through his scholarly work and through his leadership role in helping to make Oxford a magnetic center and focal point for Aristotle studies, highly instrumental in facilitating the rebirth and resurgence of Aristotelian ethics that began in England during the 1950’s. That resurgence effectively started with the ground-breaking work of Elizabeth Anscombe and continued during the latter half of the century with the contributions of Philippa Foot and Alasdair MacIntyre. Anscombe, Foot, and MacIntyre all had Oxford connections, and their achievement can thus be viewed as in some degree a continuation and extension of Ross’s philosophical legacy.
In 1954, well after the publication of his own important contributions to ethical theory (R&G and FofE), Ross produced a brief introduction and critique of Kantian ethics. Subtitled A Commentary on the Grundlegung zur Metaphysik der Sitten, Kant’s Ethical Theory is written from the point of view of a rival theorist and skeptical critic who is at the same time a scholarly student and admirer of the great German philosopher. The book remains one of the best and handiest short introductions to Kant’s moral philosophy.
After analyzing Kant’s concept of goodwill, Ross takes up his argument that a morally good action must not simply conform with the moral law, but must be performed in order to conform with the moral law; that is, the act must be performed in recognition of and out of respect for the moral law. Ross basically accepts this claim and agrees that it is not enough merely to do the right thing. For an act to be morally good, we must perform it because it is the right thing. For example, if I repay a loan simply to avoid a heavy fine or some form of legal penalty, I will have done the right thing but my action will have no genuine moral significance. Only if I repay the loan out of a sincere sense of personal obligation and a willing adherence to principle will my right action also be morally good. However, while conceding this important point, Ross takes issue with Kant’s further claim that only actions performed in conformity with a priori moral laws can be morally good. Why, Ross wonders, shouldn’t an action performed in accordance with a moral rule that we have formulated or adopted based on personal experience also be morally good? For example, suppose that based on his experience in armed service and through contact and interviews with other war veterans a soldier abandons his earlier belief that active participation in warfare is virtuous and honorable and instead comes to a new understanding (which now strikes him as self-evident and unassailably true) that engaging in war is wrong and that he has a moral obligation to oppose it. According to Ross, he would have the same duty to act in accordance with his newly formulated a posteriori moral conviction as he would an a priori moral principle. (Ross, by the way, had to deal with several cases of exactly this type in his role on a British panel reviewing applications for conscientious objector status during WW II. After the war, British law was modified to allow even veteran servicemen, based on their experience in combat, to redefine themselves as CO’s)
Over the course of his commentary, Ross repeatedly demonstrates his adroit critical powers and relentless skill in semantic and logical debate. Again and again he takes Kant to task for drawing some dubious distinction, or for using a term or phrase in some vague, questionable, or inconsistent way. “It is extremely hard to see what Kant’s meaning here is,” he wryly observes at one point (KET, 71). Elsewhere he chides Kant for his tendency to divide things into formal and material components, inevitably honoring the former and disparaging the latter, as if matter itself and the things of earth, as in the view of Christian neo-Platonism, were defective or corrupt. He even quibbles with Kant’s use of the phrase “categorical imperative” for his central principle, rightly pointing out that any unconditional rule or command is technically and by definition a categorical imperative, and so it is incorrect to speak of the categorical imperative as if there were only one.
Ross’s main objection to Kant’s system is its super-abstract, indeed virtually seraphic, and absolutist character. He argues that Kant’s absolutism makes his theory impractical and contrary to plain thinking and common-sense morality and shows how the test of universalizability comes out differently if it is applied in very specific cases rather than in general, abstract ones.
The whole method of abstraction, if relied upon, when used alone, to answer the question ‘What ought I to do?’, is a mistake. For the acts we have to choose between, say the telling of the truth or the saying of what is untrue, in some particular circumstances, or the keeping or the breaking of a promise, are completely individual acts, and their rightness or their wrongness will spring from their whole nature, and no element in their nature can safely be abstracted from. To abstract is to shut our eyes to the detail of the moral situation and to deprive ourselves of the data for a true judgment about it. . . . The only safe way of applying Kant’s test of universalizability is to envisage the act in its whole concrete particularity, and then ask ‘Could I wish that everyone, when in exactly similar circumstances, should tell a lie exactly similar to that which I am thinking of telling?’ But then universalizability, as a short cut to knowing what is right, has failed us. For it is just as hard to see whether a similar act by someone else, with all its concrete particularity, would be right, as it is to see whether our own proposed act would be right (KET, 33-34).
However, Ross acknowledges that although the method of abstraction, “cannot safely be relied on as the sole method of judging right or wrong, it is a necessary part of the true method.” The true method, he goes on to show, is a process of minute and careful analysis and “successive abstraction,” and if at any level in the abstractive process “we come across a feature of the proposed act that is prima facie wrong, then Kant is right in holding that no gain to our own convenience will make the act right” (KET, 35). In the end, despite all his criticisms and reservations, Ross winds up with a ringing endorsement of both Kant the ethical theorist and Kant the man:
Kant’s doctrine has both theoretical and practical value in insisting ruthlessly on the need for sensitiveness to every questionable feature of a proposed act. It is his own moral sensitiveness, and his insistence on sensitiveness in others, that makes him, to my mind, the most truly moral of all moral philosophers. (KET, 35)
Advanced students of Kant will probably find relatively little in Kant’s Ethical Theory that they have not already learned or encountered elsewhere. But for beginning students it is hard to imagine a better introduction or starting point for deeper study. Ross’s handling of a wide assortment of thorny Kantian terms and concepts (objective desires vs. subjective desires; necessary duties vs. contingent duties; perfect duties vs. imperfect duties, and so forth) is deft and expert, and his explication and critique of the categorical imperative (in all three of its formulations) is acute and unsurpassed.
At the time of his death in 1971, Ross was as well known and as widely esteemed for his work as a classical scholar as for his contributions to moral philosophy. However, in the four decades since his death the general estimate of his achievement has altered, and while he is still revered for his accomplishments as a scholar and editor he is now more highly regarded for his vital and original contributions to ethical theory.
There are several reasons for this critical revaluation. First of all, there’s the simple fact that the illustrious “Oxford,” which at the time of its publication represented one of the truly landmark achievements in modern classical scholarship, has gradually become, with the passage of two generations, a largely forgotten historical relic, a collector’s item for bibliophiles. Second, during the same time period, classical philology and the scholarly study of Latin and Greek have become contracting disciplines and no longer form a central or growing part of the university curriculum. Meanwhile, the study of ethics has seen its role in higher education expand, and as a result ethical theory is now taught not just in philosophy departments in liberal arts colleges but in most business and professional schools as well. Not surprisingly, Ross’s reputation has followed this same general trend, with a continuing but only moderate appreciation for his work as a classicist and an increasing interest in his writings on ethics. Furthermore, it was not long after the original publication of The Right and the Good (1930) that ethical intuitionism, of which Ross was a leading advocate, fell into general disfavor among moral philosophers. The intuitionist approach, its critics argued, smacked of metaphysics and even theology, and the doctrine was roundly criticized and even ridiculed, especially by ethical naturalists and logical positivists. One exasperated reviewer dismissed it as a “strange” and “totally unilluminating” phenomenon (Warnock, 16). In the last twenty years, however, intuitionism has enjoyed a substantial rebirth and has gained new theoretical support and new adherents. This recent revival was in part spearheaded by a superb new edition of The Right and the Good (2002), freshly edited and introduced by Philip Stratton-Lake, and it was further strengthened by the publication of Robert Audi’s The Good in the Right, a strong re-statement of the intuitionist view.
What follows is a general exposition and critical assessment of Ross’s theory, its basic components, principles, foundations and implications, limitations and strengths.
Ross’s system of ethics, originally set forth in his classic work The Right and the Good (1930) and then revised and supplemented by a later, more methodical, more analytical presentation in Foundations of Ethics (1939), combines elements and insights from several earlier moral theories and philosophical traditions. As noted above, it has certain affinities and features in common with the thought of Plato (notably the Idea of the Good), Aristotle (such as the view that ethics is an inexact science and inevitably involves some degree of individual judgment), and Kant (for example, anti-consequentialism and the idea that good actions involve a sense of duty and a respect for moral law). Ross himself acknowledged as the most significant and immediate influences on his ethical ideas two of the leading figures in early twentieth-century British moral philosophy: H.A. Prichard and G.E. Moore.
Prichard’s provocative essay “Does Moral Philosophy Rest on a Mistake?” outlined several key insights (that ethical theory ought to accord with common-sense morality, that “goodness” and “rightness” and “desire” and “duty” are distinct and by no means equivalent terms, that the terms “end,” “motive,” and “purpose” are also problematic and need to be precisely defined, and so on) that influenced Ross’s thinking and eventually worked their way into his theory. And in Moore, Ross found both an important ally (both philosophers were proponents of non-naturalism) and perhaps his greatest opponent (The Right and the Good can be viewed as essentially a forceful critique and counter-theory to Moore’s ideal utilitarianism)
Ross’s ethical theory, commonly known as the theory of prima facie duties, is a deontological system with three key elements or basic principles: a. Ethical Non-naturalism. b. Ethical Intuitionism. c. Ethical Pluralism.
Non-naturalism refers to the meta-ethical view, originally propounded by Moore in Principia Ethica, that moral properties such as goodness are simple, non-natural properties of certain acts or objects and are neither equivalent to, reducible to, nor definable in terms of some other natural, empirical property (such as “pleasure”). According to Moore, any attempt to define “good” in terms of a natural property – for example, by making the statement “X is good” equivalent to the statement “X is pleasant” or “X is harmonious” or “X is highly evolved,” and so forth – is an instance of a category error that he termed the Naturalistic Fallacy. In the case of Ross’s ethical theory, non-naturalism refers not only to this claim about the uniqueness and irreducibility of goodness and other moral properties but includes two other meta-ethical claims (characteristic of moral realism and cognitivism) as well. These are:
1. Moral statements are propositions and are either true or false independently of human opinion or belief.
2. Moral propositions are true when they accurately describe or correspond to an actual state of affairs (that is, when they reflect actual objective features of the real world) and are false when they do not.
In essence Ross claims that whenever we make a judgment such as “capital punishment is wrong” or “same sex marriages are bad” we are stating propositions that are either true or false. They are true if they correspond to actual, real-world states of affairs and false if they do not. Furthermore, since these statements purport to describe objective reality, they are essentially different from and cannot be reduced to statements that merely express personal emotions or describe states of mind. Contrary to emotivism and other forms of non-cognitivism and naturalism, the statement “Capital punishment is wrong” is not equivalent or reducible to statements like “I dislike capital punishment” or “Capital punishment is barbarous” or “Down with capital punishment.”
Intuitionism is the epistemological view that some moral truths can be known without logical inference or systematic thought; such truths, it is argued, can be known directly either through a “moral sense” (the empiricist view) or by means of non-empirical a priori knowledge (the rationalist view). Ross’s intuitionism is in the rationalist, Common Sense tradition of figures like Thomas Reid, William Whewell, and Henry Sidgwick.
Kant was among the first to use the term “intuition” (Anschauung; literally, an act of “looking at” something) in a special sense to mean a form of cognition characterized by perceptual immediacy. It is a way of knowing an object by sensation and immediate perception rather than by an intervening process of reason, analysis, or logical consideration.
Going well beyond Kant, Henri Bergson later used the term “intuition” almost mystically to refer to a kind of holistic, in-depth act of cognition – a direct and immediate apprehension of the object in its totality rather than as a sum of partial perspectives or fragmentary views. An example here would be a direct and total immersion or thorough sensation of the city of Paris vs. a sense or knowledge of it put together from various maps, overlays, photographs, perspectives, histories, and so forth. According to Bergson, no matter how many incremental elements you add to the latter, you can never achieve the full and absolute knowledge provided by the former.
Ross’s use of the term “intuition” is different from and extends beyond the limited, non-inferential, perceptual ability described by Kant yet falls well short of the vast, clairvoyant, ultra-sensory power delineated by Bergson. His use was anticipated to some degree by William Whewell, who adapted the term to explain the operations of conscience and to describe the way that we come to know fundamental moral principles: “Certain moral principles being, as I have said, thus seen to be true by intuition, under due conditions of reflection and thought, are unfolded into their application by further reflection and thought” (Whewell, xx).
Michael Huemer, a modern-day rationalist intuitionist, uses intuition in a sense that seems close to the way that Ross uses and understands the term. “Reasoning” Huemer observes, “sometimes changes how things seem to us. But there is also a way things seem to us prior to reasoning; otherwise, reasoning could not get started. The way things seem prior to reasoning we may call an ‘initial appearance’. An initial, intellectual appearance is an ‘intuition’” (Huemer, 102).
Ross also uses the term to mean something like an “initial intellectual appearance,” but in his usage an intuition is a great deal more than just a mere presentiment or a kind of “seeming” since it typically results in a high level of conviction, indeed in the kind of confident knowledge conveyed by the phrase “moral certainty” in both its original Aristotelian and modern legal sense.
In short, “intuition” in Ross’s sense is simply the means by which we apprehend and know moral truths. It may begin as little more than an initial impression or “gut feeling,” a more or less instinctive reaction which may then be strengthened and approved by further consideration and reflection. And although it is essentially different from deduction or induction or any other purely rational, logical procedure or mathematical process, the moral knowledge that it provides can nevertheless strike us with something like the full force of recognition and sense of certainty of a mathematical demonstration.
Indeed, according to Ross, certain moral propositions, such as the claim that we should fulfill promises or that we should promote the good of others, strike us as “self-evident”:
. . . not in the sense that it is evident from the beginning of our lives, or as soon as we attend to the proposition for the first time, but in the sense that when we have reached sufficient mental maturity and have given sufficient attention to the proposition it is evident without any need of proof, or of evidence beyond itself. It is self-evident just as a mathematical axiom, or the validity of a form of inference, is evident. The moral order expressed in these propositions is just as much part of the fundamental nature of the universe (and, we may add, of any possible universe in which there were moral agents at all) as is the spatial or numerical structure expressed in axioms of geometry or arithmetic. In our confidence that these propositions are true, there is involved the same trust in our reason that is involved in our confidence in mathematics; and we should have no justification for trusting it in the latter sphere and distrusting it in the former. In both cases we are dealing with propositions that cannot be proved, but that just as certainly need no proof. (R&G, 29-30)
It is in this deep sense of the term that Ross and other rationalist intuitionists consider “intuition” to be a way of knowing equal or superior to discursive argument and dialectic and beyond mere casuistical disputation and logical debate. One is reminded of Dr. Johnson settling the issue of freedom of the will with abrupt finality: “Sir, we know our wills are free, and there’s an end on it!”
Ross’s ethical system is deontological and anti-consequentialist since it is based on adherence to rules or duties rather than outcomes. It is pluralist in the sense that, unlike Kantian ethics and utilitarianism (monist systems based on a single, pre-eminent, all-encompassing rule or principle – namely the categorical imperative and the principle of utility, respectively), Ross recognizes several different fundamental rules or principles that he terms prima facie duties. Moreover – and this is a key element and a distinctive feature of his theory – he acknowledges that these duties can, and invariably do, collide and come into conflict with one another.
The phrase prima facie, since it has the connotation of a mere initial appearance or first impression, is to a certain extent unfortunate and misleading. In fact Ross uses it somewhat apologetically. But he is careful to explain that a prima facie duty is by no means simply an apparent duty or an obligation that we might seem to have at first glance, but which later reflection or deeper analysis might very well invalidate. On the contrary, he stresses that a prima facie duty is entirely real and self-evident, though it is always contingent on circumstances and never absolute.
Ross initially identifies seven distinct prima facie duties:
1. Fidelity. We should strive to keep promises and be honest and truthful.
2. Reparation. We should make amends when we have wronged someone else.
3. Gratitude. We should be grateful to others when they perform actions that benefit us and we should try to return the favor.
4. Non-injury (or non-maleficence). We should refrain from harming others either physically or psychologically.
5. Beneficence. We should be kind to others and to try to improve their health, wisdom, security, happiness, and well-being.
6. Self-improvement. We should strive to improve our own health, wisdom, security, happiness, and well-being.
7. Justice. We should try to be fair and try to distribute benefits and burdens equably and evenly.
In Foundations of Ethics, Ross suggests that the duties of beneficence, self-improvement, and justice could be subsumed under a single duty to promote intrinsic values (that is, things that are intrinsically good). Doing this would reduce the number of prima facie duties from seven to five. However, the important thing here is not so much the exact number of duties that we recognize (Robert Audi lists ten) or the precise terminology that we use to identify or describe them, but to agree that the duties enumerated and described are all valid and certified. As Stratton-Lake points out, “Ross is not simply listing whatever moral obligations we think we have . . . . He is, rather, attempting to systematize as much as possible the moral convictions we have” (R&G, xxxvi).
Ross doesn’t try to establish a ranked hierarchy among his prima facie duties since he acknowledges that context and circumstances matter decisively and that individual cases must be judged accordingly. (For example, a promise to attend a beach party or golf outing doesn’t carry the same moral weight as a promise to attend a wedding or funeral) But he also observes that certain duties seem likely to take precedence over and tend to over-rule others. For example, most people would probably agree that our duty of non-maleficence trumps our duty to be beneficent and that in most cases it would be wrong to steal something from one person in order to give it to someone else. On the other hand, there are classic cases like that of Jean Valjean and the loaf of bread. Would you approve stealing from a wealthy aristocrat to feed a starving infant? Many people would. But they might also think there was something morally dubious about the action, or they might approve it in an abstract way but not feel wholly comfortable performing it themselves.
The claim that not only do we have multiple moral obligations (instead of a single imperative or rule – for example, “always treat yourself and others as an end and never solely as a means”) but that these various obligations can also come into conflict with one another constitutes a core insight and distinctive feature of Ross’s theory. For example, my decision to stop and assist an accident victim (duty of beneficence) might conflict with my promise to attend an important meeting (duty to fulfill promises) or run counter to my doctor’s recommendation that I avoid high-stress situations (duty of self-improvement). What is one to do in such cases? According to Ross, there will always be one duty that will have a greater urgency or priority than the others, and that will be the right thing to do, or as Ross terms it one’s duty proper, in a given case. Of course that doesn’t meant that we’ll always be able to identify with certainty exactly what that duty is. “The decision rests with perception.”
In both The Right and the Good and in Foundations of Ethics, Ross offers his theory of prima facie duties as a major and in his view much-needed corrective to Kantian ethics and to the ideal utilitarianism of G.E. Moore. Ross’s critique of Kantian ethics, in essence a rejection of Kant’s monism and absolutism, has been dealt with above (see section 5 of this article). This section provides a brief overview of his critique of ideal utilitarianism.
Ideal utilitarianism, a form of consequentialism associated with Moore, can be defined as the view that right actions are those that in any given situation result in a maximum of overall good or (what amounts to the same thing) that produce the best possible outcome. Ross strongly opposes this view, although it should be pointed out that he doesn’t argue that ideal utilitarianism is completely wrong. He simply says that it is counter-intuitive (that is, contrary to common-sense ethics) and incomplete. In his view there are more duties and complications than are dreamt of in Moore’s philosophy.
In general, Ross has three main complaints against utilitarianism.
1. Ross claims that utilitarianism is simplistic and reductive. He argues that it overlooks or conflates the complicated ways in which human beings stand in relation, and thus in moral obligation, to one another:
[Utilitarianism] says, in effect, that the only morally significant relation in which my neighbors stand to me is that of being possible beneficiaries of my action. They do stand in this relation to me, and this relation is morally significant. But they may also stand to me in the relation of promisee to promiser, of creditor to debtor, of wife to husband, of child to parent, of friend to friend, of fellow countryman to fellow countryman, and the like; and each of these relationships is the foundation of a prima facie duty, which is more or less incumbent upon me according to the circumstances of the case. (R&G, 19)
2. Ross claims that utilitarianism is too general and abstract. He argues that it ignores or glosses over the “highly personal character” of moral relationships:
The essential defect of the “ideal utilitarian” theory is that it ignores, or at least does not do full justice to, the highly personal character of duty. If the only duty is to produce the maximum of good, the question of who is to have the good – whether it is myself, or my benefactor, or a person to whom I have made a promise to confer that good on him, or a mere fellow man to whom I stand in no such special relationship – should make no difference to my having a duty to produce that good. But we are all in fact sure that it makes a vast difference. (R&G, 22, emphasis added)
3. Ross claims that the fundamental principle of utilitarianism – that an act is right if it produces the most overall good – is at odds with common sense morality. He uses a series of hypothetical examples to illustrate his point:
Suppose . . . that the fulfillment of a promise to A would produce 1000 units of good for him, but that by doing some other act I could produce 1001 units of good for B, to whom I have made no promise . . . . Should we really think it self-evident that it was our duty to do the second act and not the first? I think not.
. . . Or again, suppose that A is a very good and B a very bad man, should I then, even if I have made no promise, think it self-evidently right to produce 1001 units of good for B rather than 1000 for A? Surely not. (R&G, 35)
One further example presents a classic showdown between Ross’s ethics and Moore’s. Suppose B promises A that upon A’s death he will pass A’s entire fortune on to C. However, it is evident that far more overall good will result from giving it to D. Should B give the estate to C or D? According to Moore and ideal utilitarianism, the answer is D. According to Ross, the answer is C.
Ross thinks this example is decisive and that it clearly illustrates the extent to which ideal utilitarianism contradicts our basic, common-sense morality. But does the example really do this? Wouldn’t our intuitive response to the dilemma depend a great deal, and perhaps decisively, on the specifics of the case and the actual identities of C and D? For example, what if C were a family pet and D were a charitable foundation with a spotless record of beneficence, efficiency, and goodwill? In that case, wouldn’t common-sense opinion judge that it is right for B to break his promise to A and to pass his estate on to D rather than C – in effect concluding that in this particular instance the duty to benefit others outweighs the duty to keep a promise?
The fact is, the apparently large theoretical distance between utilitarianism and Ross’s system of prima facie duties shrinks appreciably when the actual details of a given situation are filled in. And this is especially true if we compare later versions or modifications of each theory. For example, the “two-level” preference utilitarianism of R.M. Hare has a Level-1 “intuitive” component that takes into account our immediate, common-sense judgments as well as a Level-2 “critical” component that makes more advanced judgments based on a deeper and fuller scrutiny of the facts in the case. Robert Audi’s deontological system also makes provision for both intuitive and inferential/critical thinking. Hare’s theory focuses on outcomes; Audi’s is based on intrinsic values and prima facie duties. But when it comes down to making practical judgments about right actions, the two theories aren’t all that far apart. “The decision rests with perception.”
“Metaphysics,” F.H. Bradley famously observed, “is the finding of bad reasons for what we believe on instinct” (Bradley, p. xiv). Error theorists, non-cognitivists, and other moral skeptics have said much the same thing about ethics, and especially about moral realism in all its forms.
Ross’s theory has been criticized by anti-realists and realists alike. And, not surprisingly, in most cases the main targets have been Ross’s intuitionism and non-naturalism, undoubtedly the most controversial features of his theory. Some of these criticisms are the result of confusion or misunderstanding and can be easily rebutted. But some are pointed and well-aimed and cannot be so easily dismissed.
The whole concept of non-naturalism – that is, of properties (such as moral goodness) that are supposedly not subject to any form of empirical observation or detection and which, so it is claimed, cannot be reduced to, equated with, or defined in terms of some other natural property – has long been the object of skeptical criticism and occasionally even of ridicule. Such properties are often accused of being ineffable or other-worldly, indeed of being downright spooky, as if they defied comprehension and existed (if they exist at all) only in some timeless, trans-mundane or supra-celestial realm of their own, like the ideal Forms of Plato or the hidden, all-transcending God of the Gnostics. But as Philip Stratton-Lake has shown, it is a misconception or distortion of Ross’s theory to attribute to him anything like such a mystical or other-worldly view of moral properties (R&G, xxiii-xxiv).
What Ross actually claims is that some things in this world – namely certain human actions (such as sincere acts of honesty and beneficence) and certain pursuits like knowledge and pleasure – have intrinsic value and possess a property of being good or of being right. Of course he also admits there is no way for him to prove or authenticate that they have these qualities. Such a position (which is essentially no different from maintaining that moral judgments can be true or false even if we can never empirically confirm or disprove them) is indeed problematic, especially when viewed from the standpoint of naturalism or positivism. But it is nevertheless wrong to characterize Ross’s non-naturalism as in any way mystical or unearthly. Ross, after all, makes no appeal to an invisible moral order or to some type of supra-sensual reality to justify his view; on the contrary, he appeals directly to our ordinary, day-to-day experience – that is, to common-sense morality and the way things actually seem to us.
In addition to being assailed for its non-naturalism, Ross’s theory has also been sharply criticized for its embrace of intuitionism. Moral intuitionism has been controversial in virtually all its forms, starting with the early 18th century “moral sense” theories of Lord Shaftsbury and Francis Hutcheson. However, these empiricist versions of intuitionism, which claim that we have a special moral faculty (indeed a kind of moral sense, analogous to our primary senses of sight, hearing, touch, taste, and smell) that enables us to directly perceive right and wrong, are essentially different from and in some ways at odds with the rationalist form of intuitionism upheld by Ross. Ross in fact denies that we directly “see” or perceive moral properties or moral truths. What he claims is that we have an intuitive (that is, non-inferential or proto- or meta-logical) ability to apprehend certain self-evident, fundamental moral facts – such as that lying and harming others are prima facie wrong. He says that we can then test and confirm these initial, intuitive impressions on the basis of further reflection or deeper consideration. Such a process is no more mysterious nor any more a matter of some type of uncanny, preternatural perception than the fact that we can instantly know the truth of a mathematical axiom. Intuition then, as Ross uses and understands the term, is an act of cognition, more or less immediate, whereby we apprehend prima facie duties. These duties then serve as a foundation or touchstone for further moral inquiry.
So much, then, for the accusation that Ross’s intuitionism is magical or strange. A more serious and wounding indictment of intuitionism comes from critics who are less bothered by its alleged mysteriousness than by the fact that it can be unreliable and lead to moral judgments that are highly questionable and possibly even false. Peter Singer, for example, accuses intuitionists of forging normative ethical rules out of “moral intuitions” that are actually little more than biochemical reflexes, instinctive emotional responses that are in large part the product of our evolutionary past. (Singer, 338-9). Singer acknowledges that these “intuitions” are both very common and very compelling; and far from regarding them as being of mysterious or supernatural origin, he readily admits that they are entirely natural, intelligible, and real. Indeed, he regards their existence as to a large extent scientifically proven, since we can now actually “see” intuitive thinking at work using fMRI scans. Similarly, the compelling force and prevalence of many common moral intuitions can be neatly explained by evolutionary psychology.
But Singer questions whether intuitive judgments that can be traced to biologically-based instincts or semi-automatic emotional responses should be given special priority as a foundation for normative moral values – especially when research shows that such judgments are prone to error and are not easily overturned by further reflection. Intuitionists can respond by pointing out that regardless of their origin, and regardless of whether we call them intuitions, instincts, first impressions, or whatever, such judgments still provide the initial starting point for ethics and a vital platform for further inquiry. Ross, in particular, doesn’t claim that our moral intuitions and initial, common-sense judgments are infallible; instead, he acknowledges that they may benefit from and sometimes require deeper reflection and consideration. In this respect his intuitionism actually bears a slight resemblance to the “reflective equilibrium” of John Rawls (Rawls, 48). Of course Ross also admits, and indeed repeatedly emphasizes, that ethics is an approximate and inexact science which deals in probabilities, not certainties. In the final analysis, making accurate moral judgments is difficult since moral acts always “have certain characteristics that tend to make them at the same time prima facie right and prima facie wrong” and “there is probably no act . . . that does good to any one without doing harm to someone else, and vice-versa” (R&G, 33-34). The final decision, as is always the case with Ross’s theory, rests with perception.
W. D. Ross is one of a select number of modern intellectuals who made important and lasting contributions to two different academic fields: in his case, ethics and classical letters. In the area of classical studies, his signal achievement was undoubtedly his editorship of the “Oxford,” the 11-volume English translation of Aristotle’s complete works that ignited a renewal of interest in the philosopher throughout the English-speaking world and to which he himself contributed elegant translations of the Metaphysics and the Nichomachean Ethics. One of the important secondary effects of this renewed interest in Aristotle was the re-discovery and eventual re-flourishing of virtue ethics during the second half of the 20th century. This powerful revival of virtue theory and eudaimonism would have been practically impossible if it had not been prepared and facilitated decades earlier by the appearance of the Oxford.
In the case of ethics, Ross occupies a well-deserved place in the long and distinguished line of British moral philosophers in the analytical-critical tradition, a group that includes such important names as Bentham, Mill, Sidgwick, Moore, Prichard, Hare, and Ayer. The Right and the Good (1930), his critique of ideal utilitarianism and exposition of this own deontological system, remains a classic text and a key document in the history of modern ethical theory, influencing later revisions or variations of intuitionism by Philip Stratton-Lake, Robert Audi, Michael Huemer, and others. C.D. Broad called the book “the most important contribution to ethical theory made in England in a generation” and applauded Ross for applying his considerable “good sense, acuteness, and clarity” to “elucidating questions of perennial significance” (Broad, 228).
David L. Simpson
U. S. A.
Last updated: July 21, 2012 | Originally published: