Metaphysics is not a school or tradition but rather a sub-discipline within philosophy, as are ethics, logic and epistemology. Like many philosophical terms, “metaphysics” can be understood in a variety of ways, so any discussion of Bertrand Russell’s metaphysics must select from among the various possible ways of understanding the notion, for example, as the study of being qua being, the study of the first principles or grounds of being, the study of God, and so forth. The primary sense of “metaphysics” examined here in connection to Russell is the study of the ultimate nature and constituents of reality.
Since what we know, if anything, is assumed to be real, doctrines in metaphysics typically dovetail with doctrines in epistemology. But in this article, discussion of Russell’s epistemology is kept to a minimum in order to better canvas his metaphysics, beginning with his earliest adult views in 1897 and ending shortly before his death in 1970. Russell revises his conception of the nature of reality in both large and small ways throughout his career. Still, there are positions that he never abandons; particularly, the belief that reality is knowable, that it is many, that there are entities – universals – that do not exist in space and time, and that there are truths that cannot be known by direct experience or inference but are known a priori.
The word “metaphysics” sometimes is used to describe questions or doctrines that are a priori, that is, that purport to concern what transcends experience, and particularly sense-experience. Thus, a system may be called metaphysical if it contains doctrines, such as claims about the nature of the good or the nature of human reason, whose truth is supposed to be known independently of (sense) experience. Such claims have characterized philosophy from its beginnings, as has the belief that they are meaningful and valuable. However, from the modern period on, and especially in Russell’s own lifetime, various schools of philosophy began to deny the legitimacy and desirability of a priori metaphysical theorizing. In fact, Russell’s life begins in a period sympathetic to this traditional philosophical project, and ends in a period which is not. Concerning these “meta-metaphysical” issues (that is, doctrines not in metaphysics but about it and its feasibility), Russell remained emphatically a metaphysician throughout his life. In fact, in his later work, it is this strand more than doctrines about the nature of reality per se that justify his being considered as one of the last, great metaphysicians.
Russell’s earliest work in metaphysics is marked by the sympathies of his teachers and his era for a particular tradition known as idealism. Idealism is broadly understood as the contention that ultimate reality is immaterial or dependent on mind, so that matter is in some sense derivative, emergent, and at best conditionally real. Idealism flourished in Britain in the last third of the nineteenth century and first two decades of the twentieth. British idealists such as Bernard Bosanquet, T.H. Green, Harold Joachim, J.M.E. McTaggart and F.H. Bradley – some of whom were Russell’s teachers – were most influenced by Hegel’s form of absolute idealism, though influences of Immanuel Kant’s transcendental idealism can also be found in their work. This section will explore British Idealism’s influence on the young Bertrand Russell.
Until 1898, Russell’s work a variety of subjects (like geometry or space and time) is marked by the presumption that any area of study contains contradictions that move the mind into other, related, areas that enrich and complete it. This is similar to Hegel’s dialectical framework. However, in Hegel’s work this so-called “dialectic” is a central part of his metaphysical worldview, characterizing the movement of “absolute spirit” as it unfolds into history. Russell is relatively uninfluenced by Hegel’s broader theory, and adopts merely the general dialectical approach. He argues, for example, that the sciences are incomplete and contain contradictions, that one passes over into the other, as number into geometry and geometry into physics. The goal of a system of the sciences, he thinks, is to reveal the basic postulates of each science, their relations to each other, and to eliminate all inconsistencies but those that are integral to the science as such. (“Note on the Logic of the Sciences,” Papers 2) In this way, Russell’s early work is dialectical and holistic rather than monistic. On this point, Russell’s thinking was probably influenced by his tutors John McTaggart and James Ward, who were both British idealists unsympathetic to Bradley’s monism.
Bradley, most famous for his book Appearance and Reality, defines what is ultimately real as what is wholly unconditioned or independent. Put another way, on Bradley’s view what is real must be complete and self-sufficient. Bradley also thinks that the relations a thing stands in, such as being to the left of something else, are internal to it, that is, grounded in its intrinsic properties, and therefore inseparable from those properties. It follows from these two views that the subjects of relations, considered in themselves, are incomplete and dependent, and therefore ultimately unreal. For instance, if my bookcase is to the left of my desk, and if the relation being to the left of is internal to my bookcase, then being to the left of my desk contributes to the identity or being of my bookcase just as being six feet tall and being brown do. Consequently, it is not unconditioned or independent, since its identity is bound up with my desk’s. Since the truly real is independent, it follows that my bookcase is not truly real. This sort of argument can be given for every object that we could conceivably encounter in experience: everything stands in some relation or other to something else, thus everything is partially dependent on something else for its identity; but since it is dependent, it is not truly real.
The only thing truly real, Bradley thinks, is the whole network of interrelated objects that constitutes what we might call “the whole world.” Thus he embraces a species of monism: the doctrine that, despite appearances to the contrary, no plurality of substances exists and that only one thing exits: the whole. What prevents us from apprehending this, he believes, is our tendency to confuse the limited reality of things in our experience (and the truths based on that limited perspective)- with the unconditioned reality of the whole, the Absolute or One. Hence, Bradley is unsympathetic to the activity of analysis, for by breaking wholes into parts it disguises rather than reveals the nature of reality.
The early Russell, who was familiar with Bradley’s work through his teachers at Cambridge, was only partly sympathetic to F. H. Bradley’s views. Russell accepts the doctrine that relations are internal but, unlike Bradley, he does not deny that there is a plurality of things or subjects. Thus Russell’s holism, for example, his view of the interconnectedness of the sciences, does not require the denial of plurality or the rejection of analysis as a falsification of reality, both of which doctrines are antithetic to him early on.
Russell’s early views are also influenced by Kant. Kant argued that the mind imposes categories (like being in space and time) that shape what we experience. Since Kant defines a priori propositions as those we know to be true independently of (logically prior to) experience, and a posteriori propositions as those whose truth we know only through experience, it follows that propositions about these categories are a priori, since the conditions of any possible experience must be independent of experience. Thus for Kant, geometry contains a priori propositions about categories of space that condition our experience of things as spatial.
Russell largely agrees with Kant in his 1898 Foundations of Geometry, which is based on his dissertation. Other indications of a Kantian approach can be seen, for example, in his 1897 claim that what is essential to matter is schematization under the form of space (“On Matter,” Papers 2).
There are several points on which Russell’s views eventually turn against idealism and towards realism. The transition is not sudden but gradual, growing out of discomfort with what he comes to see as an undue psychologism in his work, and out of growing awareness of the importance of asymmetrical (ordering) relations in mathematics. The first issue concerns knowledge and opposes neo-Kantianism; the second issue concerns the nature of relations and the validity of analysis and opposes Neo-Hegelianism and Monism. The former lends itself to realism and mind/matter dualism, that is, to a view of matter as independent of minds, which apprehend it without shaping it. The latter lends itself to a view of the radical plurality of what exists. Both contribute to a marked preference for analysis over synthesis, as the mind’s way of apprehending the basic constituents of reality. By the time these developments are complete, Russell’s work no longer refers to the dialectic of thought or to the form of space or to other marks of his early infatuation with idealism. Yet throughout Russell’s life there remains a desire to give a complete account of the sciences, as a kind of vestige of his earlier views.
When Russell begins to question idealism, he does so in part because of the idealist perspective on the status of truths of mathematics. In his first completely anti-idealist work, The Principles of Mathematics (1903), Russell does not reject Kant’s general conception of the distinction between a priori and a posteriori knowledge, but he rejects Kant’s idealism, that is, Kant’s doctrine that the nature of thought determines what is a priori. On Russell’s view, human nature could change, and those truths would then be destroyed, which he thinks is absurd. Moreover, Russell objects that the Kantian notion of a priori truth is conditional, that is, that Kant must hold that 2 + 2 equals 4 only on condition that the mind always thinks it so (Principles, p. 40.) On Russell’s view, in contrast, mathematical and logical truths must be true unconditionally; thus 2 + 2 equals 4 even if there are no intelligences or minds. Thus Russell’s attack on Kant’s notion of the a priori focuses on what he sees as Kant’s psychologism, that is, his tendency to confuse what is objectively true even if no one thinks it, with what we are so psychologically constructed as to have to think. In general, Russell begins to sharply distinguish questions of logic, conceived as closely related to metaphysics, from questions of knowledge and psychology. Thus in his 1904 paper “Meinong’s Theory of Complexes and Assumptions” (Essays in Analysis, pp. 21-22), he writes, “The theory of knowledge is often regarded as identical with logic. This view results from confounding psychical states with their objects; for, when it is admitted that the proposition known is not the identical with the knowledge of it, it becomes plain that the question as to the nature of propositions is distinct from all questions of knowledge…. The theory of knowledge is in fact distinct from psychology, but is more complex: for it involves not only what psychology has to say about belief, but also the distinction of truth and falsehood, since knowledge is only belief in what is true.”
In his early defense of pluralism, external relations ( relations which cannot be reduced to properties) play an important role. The monist asserts that all relations within a complex or whole are less real than that whole, so that analysis of a whole into its parts is a misrepresentation or falsification of reality, which is one. It is consonant with this view, Russell argues, to try to reduce propositions that express relations to propositions asserting a property of something, that is, some subject-term (Principles, p. 221.) The monist therefore denies or ignores the existence of relations. But some relations must be irreducible to properties of terms, in particular the transitive and asymmetrical relations that order series, as the quality of imposing order among terms is lost if the relation is reduced to a property of a term. In rejecting monism, Russell argues that at least some relations are irreducible to properties of terms, hence they are external to those terms (Principles, p. 224); and on the basis of this doctrine of external relations, he describes reality as not one but many, that is, composed of diverse entities, bound but not dissolved into wholes by external relations. Since monism tends to reduce relations to properties, and to take these as intrinsic to substances (and ultimately to only one substance), Russell’s emphasis on external relations is explicitly anti-monistic.
When Russell rebelled against idealism (with his friend G.E. Moore) he adopted metaphysical doctrines that were realist and dualist as well as Platonist and pluralist. As noted above, his realism and dualism entails that there is an external reality distinct from the inner mental reality of ideas and perceptions, repudiating the idealist belief that ultimate reality consists of ideas and the materialist view that everything is matter, and his pluralism consists in assuming there are many entities bound by external relations. Equally important, however, is his Platonism.
Russell’s Platonism involves a belief that there are mind-independent entities that need not exist to be real, that is, to subsist and have being. Entities, or what has being (and may or may not exist) are called terms, and terms include anything that can be thought. In Principles of Mathematics (1903) he therefore writes, “Whatever may be an object of thought,…, or can be counted as one, I call a term. …I shall use it as synonymous with the words unit, individual, and entity. … [E]very term has being, that is, is in some sense. A man, a moment, a number, a class, a relation, a chimera, or anything else that can be mentioned, is sure to be a term….” (Principles, p. 43) Russell links his metaphysical Platonism to a theory of meaning as well as a theory of knowledge. Thus, all words that possess meaning do so by denoting complex or simple, abstract or concrete objects, which we apprehend by a kind of knowledge called acquaintance.
Since for Russell words mean objects (terms), and since sentences are built up out of several words, it follows that what a sentence means, a proposition, is also an entity — a unity of those entities meant by the words in the sentence, namely, things (particulars, or those entities denoted by names) and concepts (entities denoted by words other than names). Propositions are thus complex objects that either exist and are true or subsist and are false. So, both true and false propositions have being (Principles, p. 35). A proposition is about the things it contains; for example, the proposition meant by the sentence “the cat is on the mat” is composed of and is about the cat, the mat, and the concept on. As Russell writes to Gottlob Frege in 1904: ‘I believe that in spite of all of its snowfields Mount Blanc itself is a component part of what is actually asserted in the proposition “Mount Blanc is more than 40,000 meters high.” We do not assert the thought, for that is a private psychological matter; we assert the object of the thought, and this is, to my mind, a certain complex (an objective proposition, one might say) in which Mount Blanc is itself a component part.’ (From Frege to Gödel, pp. 124-125)
This Platonist view of propositions as objects bears, furthermore, on Russell’s conception of logical propositions. In terms of the degree of abstractness in the entities making them up, the propositions of logic and those of a particular science sit at different points on a spectrum, with logical propositions representing the point of maximum generality and abstraction (Principles, p. 7). Thus, logical propositions are not different in kind from propositions of other sciences, and by a process of analysis we can come to their basic constituents, the objects (constants) of logic.
Russell sometimes compares philosophical analysis to a kind of mental chemistry, since, as in chemical analysis, it involves resolving complexes into their simpler elements (Principles, p. xv). But in philosophical analyses, the process of decomposing a complex is entirely intellectual, a matter of seeing with the mind’s eye the simples involved in some complex concept. To have reached the end of such an intellectual analysis is to have reached the simple entities that cannot be further analyzed but must be immediately perceived. Reaching the end of an analysis – that is, arriving at the mental perception of a simple entity, a concept – then provides the means for definition, in the philosophical sense, since the meaning of the term being analyzed is defined in terms of the simple entities grasped at the end of the process of analysis. Yet in this period Russell is confronted with several logical and metaphysical problems. We see from his admission in the Principles that he has been unable to grasp the concept class which, he sees, leads to contradictions, for example, to Russell’s paradox (Principles, pp. xv-xvi).
Russell’s extreme Platonist realism involves him in several difficulties besides the fact that class appears to be a paradoxical (unthinkable) entity or concept. These additional concerns, which he sees even in the Principles, along with his difficulty handling the notion of a class and the paradoxes surrounding it, help determine the course of his later metaphysical (and logical) doctrines.
One difficulty concerns the status of concepts within the entity called a proposition, and this arises from his doctrine that any quality or absence of quality presupposes being. On Russell’s view the difference between a concept occurring as such and occurring as a subject term in a proposition is merely a matter of their external relations and not an intrinsic or essential difference in entities (Principles, p. 46). Hence a concept can occur either predicatively or as a subject term. He therefore views with suspicion Frege’s doctrine that concepts are essentially predicative and cannot occur as objects, that is, as the subject terms of a proposition (Principles, Appendix A). As Frege acknowledges, to say that concepts cannot occur as objects is a doctrine that defies exact expression, for we cannot say “a concept is not an object” without seemingly treating a concept as an object, since it appears to be the referent of the subject term in our sentence. Frege shows little distress over this problem of inexpressibility, but for Russell such a state of affairs is self-contradictory and paradoxical since the concept is an object in any sentence that says it is not. Yet, as he discovers, to allow concepts a dual role opens the way to other contradictions (such as Russell’s paradox), since makes it possible for a predicate to be predicated of itself. Faced with paradoxes on either side, Russell chooses to risk the paradox he initially sees as arising from Frege’s distinction between concepts and objects in order to avoid more serious logical paradoxes arising from his own assumption of concepts’ dual role. (See Principles, Chapter X and Appendix B.) This issue contributes to his emerging attempt to eliminate problematic concepts and propositions from the domain of what has being. In doing so he implicitly draws away from his original belief that what is thinkable has being, as it is not clear how he can say that items he earlier entertained are unthinkable.
Another difficulty with Russell’s Platonist realism concerns the way concepts are said to contribute to the meaning of propositions in which they occur. As noted earlier, propositions are supposed to contain what they are about, but the situation is more complex when these constituent entities include denoting concepts, either indefinite ones like a man or definite ones like the last man. The word “human” denotes an extra-mental concept human, but the concept human denotes the set of humans: Adam, Benjamin, Cain, and so on. As a result, denoting concepts have a peculiar role in objective propositions: when a denoting phrase occurs in a sentence, a denoting concept occurs in the corresponding proposition, but the proposition is not about the denoting concept but about the entities falling under the concept. Thus the proposition corresponding to the sentence “all humans are mortal” contains the concept human but is not about the concept per se – it is not attributing mortality to a concept – but is about individual humans. As a result, it is difficult to see how we can ever talk about the concept itself (as in the sentence “human is a concept”), for when we attempt to do so what we denote is not what we mean. In unpublished work from the period immediately following the publication of Principles (for example, “On Fundamentals,” Papers 4) Russell struggles to explain the connection between meaning and denoting, which he insists is a logical and not a merely psychological or linguistic connection.
In his early work, Russell treats logical questions quite like metaphysical ones and as distinct from epistemological and psychological issues bearing on how we know. As we saw (in section 1.d.i above), in his 1904 “Meinong’s Theory of Complexes and Assumptions” (Papers 4), Russell objects to what he sees as the idealist tendency to equate epistemology (that is, theory of knowledge) with logic, the study of propositions, by wrongly identifying states of knowing with the objects of those states (for example, judging with what is judged, the proposition). We must, he says, clearly distinguish a proposition from our knowledge of a proposition, and in this way it becomes clear that the study of the nature of a proposition, which falls within logic, in no sense involves the study of knowledge. Epistemology is also distinct from and more inclusive than psychology, for in studying knowledge we need to look at psychological phenomena like belief, but since “knowledge” refers not merely to belief but to true belief, the study of knowledge involves investigation into the distinction between true and false and in that way goes farther than psychology.
Even as these problems are emerging, Russell is becoming acquainted with Alexius Meinong’s psychologically oriented philosophical concerns. At the same time, he is adopting an eliminative approach towards classes and other putative entities by means of a logical analysis of sentences containing words that appear to refer to such entities. These forces together shape much of his metaphysics in this early period. By 1912, these changes have resulted in a metaphysic preoccupied with the nature and forms of facts and complexes.
Russell becomes aware of the work of Alexius Meinong, an Austrian philosopher who studied with Franz Brentano and founded a school of experimental psychology. Meinong’s most famous work, Über Gegenstandstheorie (1904), or Theory of Objects, develops the concept of intentionality, that is, the idea that consciousness is always of objects, arguing, further, that non-existent as well as existent objects lay claim to a kind of being – a view to which Russell is already sympathetic. Russell’s 1904 essay “Meinong’s Theory of Complexes and Assumptions” (Papers 4) illustrates his growing fascination with descriptive psychology, which brings questions concerning the nature of cognition to the foreground. After 1904, Russell’s doctrine of the constituents of propositions is increasingly allied to epistemological and psychological investigations. For example, he begins to specify various kinds of acquaintance – sensed objects, abstract objects, introspected ones, logical ones, and so forth. Out of this discourse comes the more familiar terminology of universals and particulars absent from his Principles.
Classes, as Russell discovers, give rise to contradictions, and their presence among the basic entities assumed by his logical system therefore impedes the goal, sketched in the Principles, of showing mathematics to be a branch of logic. The general idea of eliminating classes predates the discovery of the techniques enabling him to do so, and it is not until 1905, in “On Denoting,” that Russell discovers how to analyze sentences containing denoting phrases so as to deny that he is committed to the existence of corresponding entities. It is this general technique that he then employs to show that classes need not be assumed to exist, since sentences appearing to refer to classes can be rewritten in terms of properties.
For Russell in 1903, the meaning of a word is an entity, and the meaning of a sentence is therefore a complex entity (the proposition) composed of the entities that are the meanings of the words in the sentence. (See Principles, Chapter IV.) The words and phrases appearing in a sentence (like the words “I” and “met” and “man” in “I met a man”) are assumed to be those that have meaning (that is, that denote entities). In “On Denoting” (1905) Russell attempts to solve the problem of how indefinite and definite descriptive phrases like “a man” and “the present King of France,” which denote no single entities, have meaning. From this point on, Russell begins to believe that a process of logical analysis is necessary to locate the words and phrases that really give the sentence meaning and that these may be different than the words and phrases that appear at first glance to comprise the sentence. Despite advocating a deeper analysis of sentences and acknowledging that the words that contribute to their meaning may not be those that superficially appear in the sentence, Russell continues to believe (even after 1905), that a word of phrase has meaning only by denoting an entity.
This has a marked impact on his conception of analysis, which makes it a kind of discovery of entities. Thus Russell sometimes means by “analysis” a process of devising new ways of conveying what a particular word or phrase means, thereby eliminating the need for the original word. Sometimes the result of this kind of analysis or construction is to show that there can be no successful analysis in the first sense with respect to a particular purported entity. It is not uncommon for Russell to employ both kinds of analysis in the same work. This discovery, interwoven with his attempts to eliminate classes, emerges as a tactic that eventually eliminates a great many of the entities he admitted in 1903.
In 1903, Russell believed subsistence and existence were modalities of those objects called propositions. By 1906, Russell’s attempt to eliminate propositions testifies to his movement away from this view of propositions. (See “On the Nature of Truth, Proc. Arist. Soc., 1906, pp. 28-49.) Russell is already aware in 1903 that his conception of propositions as single (complex) entities is amenable to contradictions. In 1906, his worries about propositions and paradox lead him to reject objective false propositions, that is, false subsisting propositions that have being as much as true ones.
In seeking to eliminate propositions Russell is influenced by his success in “On Denoting,” as well as by Meinong. As he adopts the latter’s epistemological and psychological interests, he becomes interested in cognitive acts of believing, supposing, and so on, which in 1905 he already calls ‘propositional attitudes’ (“Meinong’s Theory of Complexes and Assumptions,” Papers 4) and which he hopes can be used to replace his doctrine of objective propositions. He therefore experiments with ways of eliminating propositions as single entities by accounting for them in terms of psychological acts of judgment that give unity to the various parts of the proposition, drawing them together into a meaningful whole. Yet the attempts do not go far, and the elimination of propositions only becomes official with the theory of belief he espouses in 1910 in “On the Nature of Truth and Falsehood” (Papers 6), which eliminates propositions and explains the meaning of sentences in terms of a person’s belief that various objects are unified in a fact.
By 1910 the emergence of the so-called multiple relation theory of belief brings the notion of a fact into the foreground. On this theory, a belief is true if things are related in fact as they are in the judgment, and false if they are not so related.
In this period, though Russell sometimes asks whether a complex is indeed the same as a fact (for example, in the 1913 unpublished manuscript Theory of Knowledge (Papers 7, p. 79)), he does not yet draw the sharp distinction between them that he later does in the 1918 lectures published as the Philosophy of Logical Atomism (Papers 8), and they are treated as interchangeable. That is, no distinction is yet drawn between what we perceive (a complex object, such as the shining sun) and what it is that makes a judgment based on perception true (a fact, such as that the sun is shining). He does, however, distinguish between a complex and a simple object (Principia, p. 44). A simple object is irreducible, while a complex object can be analyzed into other complex or simple constituents. Every complex contains one or more particulars and at least one universal, typically a relation, with the simplest kind of complex being a dyadic relation between two terms, as when this amber patch is to the right of that brown patch. Both complexes and facts are classified into various forms of increasing complication.
In this period, largely through Meinong’s influence, Russell also begins to distinguish types of acquaintance – the acquaintance we have with particulars, with universals, and so on. He also begins to relinquish the idea of possible or subsisting particulars (for example, propositions), confining that notion to universals.
The 1911 “On the Relations of Universals and Particulars” (Papers 6) presents a full-blown doctrine of universals. Here Russell argues for the existence of diverse particulars – that is, things like tables, chairs, and the material particles that make them up that can exist in one and only one place at any given time. But he also argues for the existence of universals, that is, entities like redness that exist in more than one place at any time. Having argued that properties are universals, he cannot rely on properties to individuate particulars, since it is possible for there to be multiple particulars with all the same properties. In order to ground the numerical diversity of particulars even in cases where they share properties, Russell relies on spatial location. It is place or location, not any difference in properties, that most fundamentally distinguishes any two particulars.
Finally, he argues that our perceived space consists of asymmetrical relations such as left and right, that is, relations that order space. As he sees it, universals alone can’t account for the asymmetrical relations given in perception – particulars are needed. Hence, wherever a spatial relation holds, it must hold of numerically diverse terms, that is, of diverse particulars. Of course, there is also need for universals, since numerically diverse particulars cannot explain what is common to several particulars, that is, what occurs in more than one place.
Though he eliminates propositions, Russell continues to view logic in a metaphysically realist way, treating its propositions as objects of a particularly formal, abstract kind. Since Russell thinks that logic must deal with what is objective, but he now denies that propositions are entities, he has come to view logic as the study of forms of complexes. The notion of the form of a complex is linked with the concept of substituting certain entities for others in a complex so as to arrive at a different complex of the same form. Since there can be no such substitution of entities when the complex doesn’t exist, Russell struggles to define the notions of form and substitution in a complex in a way that doesn’t rule out the existence of forms in cases of non-existent complexes. Russell raises this issue in a short manuscript called “What is Logic?” written in September and October of 1912 (Papers 6, pp. 54-56). After considering and rejecting various solutions Russell admits his inability to solve difficulties having to do with forms of non-existent complexes, but this and related difficulties plague his analysis of belief, that is, the analysis given to avoid commitment to objective false propositions.
An interest in questions of what we can know about the world – about objects or matter – is a theme that begins to color Russell’s work by the end of this period. In 1912 Russell asks whether there is anything that is beyond doubt (Problems of Philosophy, p. 7). His investigation implies a particular view of what exists, based on what it is we can believe with greatest certainty.
Acknowledging that visible properties, like color, are variable from person to person as well as within one person’s experience and are a function of light’s interaction with our visual apparatus (eyes, and so forth), Russell concludes that we do not directly experience what we would normally describe as colored – or more broadly, visible – objects. Rather, we infer the existence of such objects from what we are directly acquainted with, namely, our sense experiences. The same holds for other sense-modalities, and the sorts of objects that we would normally describe as audible, scented, and so forth. For instance, in seeing and smelling a flower, we are not directly acquainted with a flower, but with the sense-data of color, shape, aroma, and so on. These sense-data are what are immediately and certainly known in sensation, while material objects (like the flower) that we normally think of as producing these experiences via the properties they bear (color, shape, aroma) are merely inferred.
These epistemological doctrines have latent metaphysical implications: because they are inferred rather than known directly, ordinary sense objects (like flowers) have the status of hypothetical or theoretical entities, and therefore may not exist. And since many ordinary sense objects are material, this calls the nature and existence of matter into question. Like Berkeley, Russell thinks it is possible that what we call “the material world” may be constructed out of elements of experience – not ideas, as Berkeley thought, but sense-data. That is, sense-data may be the ultimate reality. However, although Russell thought this was possible, he did not at this time embrace such a view. Instead, he continued to think of material objects as real, but as known only indirectly, via inferences from sense-data. This type of view is sometimes called “indirect realism.”
Although Russell is at this point willing to doubt the existence of physical objects and replace them with inferences from sense-data, he is unwilling to doubt the existence of universals, since even sense-data seem to have sharable properties. For instance, in Problems, he argues that, aside from sense data and inferred physical objects, there must also be qualities and relations (that is, universals), since in “I am in my room,” the word “in” has meaning and denotes something real, namely, a relation between me and my room (Problems, p. 80). Thus he concludes that knowledge involves acquaintance with universals.
In 1911 Ludwig Wittgenstein, a wealthy young Austrian, came to study logic with Russell, evidently at Frege’s urging. Russell quickly came to regard his student as a peer, and the two became friends (although their friendship did not last long). During this period, Wittgenstein came to disagree with Russell’s views on logic, meaning, and metaphysics, and began to develop his own alternatives. Surprisingly, Russell became convinced that Wittgenstein was correct both in his criticisms and in his alternative views. Consequently, during the period in question, Wittgenstein had considerable impact on the formation of Russell’s thought.
Besides Wittgenstein, another influence in this period was A.N. Whitehead, Russell’s collaborator on the Principia Mathematica, which is finally completed during this period after many years’ work.
The main strands of Russell’s development in this period concern the nature of logic and the nature of matter or physical reality. His work in and after 1914 is parsimonious about what exists while remaining wedded to metaphysical realism and Platonism. By the end of this period Russell has combined these strands in a metaphysical position called logical atomism.
By 1913 the nature of form is prominent in Russell’s discussion of logical propositions, alongside his discussion of forms of facts. Russell describes logical propositions as constituted by nothing but form, saying in Theory of Knowledge that they do not have forms but are forms, that is, abstract entities (Papers 7, p. 98). He says in the same period that the study of philosophical logic is in great part the study of such forms. Under Ludwig Wittgenstein’s influence, Russell begins to conceive of the relations of metaphysics to logic, epistemology and psychology in a new way. Thus in the Theory of Knowledge (as revised in 1914) Russell admits that any sentence of belief must have a different logical form from any he has hitherto examined (Papers 7, p. 46), and, since he thinks that logic examines forms, he concludes, contra his earlier view (in “Meinong’s Theory of Complexes and Assumptions,” Papers 4), that the study of forms can’t be kept wholly separate from the theory of knowledge or from psychology.
In Our Knowledge of the External World (1914) the nature of logic plays a muted role, in large part because of Russell’s difficulties with the nature of propositions and the forms of non-existent complexes and facts. Russell argues that logic has two branches: mathematical and philosophical (Our Knowledge, pp. 49-52; 67). Mathematical logic contains completely general and a priori axioms and theorems as well as definitions such as the definition of number and the techniques of construction used, for example, in his theory of descriptions. Philosophical logic, which Russell sometimes simply calls logic, consists of the study of forms of propositions and the facts corresponding to them. The term ‘philosophical logic’ does not mean merely a study of grammar or a meta-level study of a logical language; rather, Russell has in mind the metaphysical and ontological examination of what there is. He further argues, following Wittgenstein, that belief facts are unlike other forms of facts in so far as they contain propositions as components (Our Knowledge, p, 63).
In 1914 -1915, Russell rejects the indirect realism that he had embraced in 1912. He now sees material objects as constructed out of, rather than inferred from, sense-data. Crediting Alfred North Whitehead for his turn to this “method of construction,” in Our Knowledge of the External World (1914) and various related papers Russell shows how the language of logic can be used to interpret material objects in terms of classes of sense-data like colors or sounds. Even though we begin with something ultimately private – sense-data viewed from the space of our unique perspective – it is possible to relate that to the perspective of other observers or potential observers and to arrive at a class of classes of sense data. These “logical constructions” can be shown to have all the properties supposed to belong to the objects of which they are constructions. And by Occam’s Razor – the principle not to multiply entities unnecessarily – whenever it is possible to create a construction of an object with all the properties of the object, it is unnecessary to assume the existence of the object itself. Thus Russell equates his maxim “wherever possible, to substitute constructions for inferences” (“On the Relation of Sense Data to Physics, Papers 8) with Occam’s razor.
In the 1918 lectures published as Philosophy of Logical Atomism (Papers 8) Russell describes his philosophical views as a kind of logical atomism, as the view that reality consists of a great many ultimate constituents or ‘atoms’. In describing his position as “logical” atomism, he understands logic in the sense of “philosophical logic” rather than “technical logic,” that is, as an attempt to arrive through reason at what must be the ultimate constituents and forms constituting reality. Since it is by a process of a priori philosophical analysis that we reach the ultimate constituents of reality – sense data and universals – such constituents might equally have been called “philosophical” atoms: they are the entities we reach in thought when we consider what sorts of things must make up the world. Yet Russell’s metaphysical views are not determined solely a priori. They are constrained by science in so far as he believes he must take into account the best available scientific knowledge, as demonstrated in his attempt to show the relation between sense-data and the “space, time and matter” of physics (Our Knowledge, p. 10).
Russell believed that we cannot move directly from the words making up sentences to metaphysical views about which things or relations exist, for not all words and phrases really denote entities. It is only after the process of analysis that we can decide which words really denote things and thus, which things really exist. Analysis shows that many purported denoting phrases – such as words for ordinary objects like tables and chairs – can be replaced by logical constructions that, used in sentences, play the role of these words but denote other entities, such as sense-data (like patches of color) and universals, which can be included among the things that really exist.
Regarding linguistics, Russell believed that analysis results in a logically perfect language consisting only of words that denote the data of immediate experience (sense data and universals) and logical constants, that is, words like “or” and “not” (Papers 8, p. 176).
These objects (that is, logical constructions) in their relations or with their qualities constitute the various forms of facts. Assuming that what makes a sentence true is a fact, what sorts of facts must exist to explain the truth of the kinds of sentences there are? In 1918, Russell answers this question by accounting for the truth of several different kinds of sentences: atomic and molecular sentences, general sentences, and those expressing propositional attitudes like belief.
So-called atomic sentences like “Andrew is taller than Bob” contain two names (Andrew, Bob) and one symbol for a relation (is taller than). When true, an atomic sentence corresponds to an atomic fact containing two particulars and one universal (the relation).
Molecular sentences join atomic sentences into what are often called “compound sentences” by using words like “and” or “or.” When true, molecular sentences do not correspond to a single conjunctive or disjunctive fact, but to multiple atomic facts (Papers 8, pp. 185-86). Thus, we can account for the truth of molecular propositions like “Andrew is kind or he is young” simply in terms of the atomic facts (if any) corresponding to “Andrew is kind” and “Andrew is young,” and the meaning of the word “or.” It follows that “or” is not a name for a thing, and Russell denies the existence of molecular facts.
Yet to account for negation (for example, “Andrew is not kind”) Russell thinks that we require more than just atomic facts. We require negative facts; for if there were no negative facts, there would be nothing to verify a negative sentence and falsify its opposite, the corresponding positive atomic sentence (Papers 8, pp. 187-90).
Moreover, no list of atomic facts can tell us that it is all the facts; to convey the information expressed by sentences like “everything fair is good” requires the existence of general facts.
Russell describes Wittgenstein as having persuaded him that a belief fact is a new form of fact, belonging to a different series of facts than the series of atomic, molecular, and general facts. Russell acknowledges that belief-sentences pose a difficulty for his attempt (following Wittgenstein) to explain how the truth of the atomic sentences fully determines the truth or falsity of all other types of sentences, and he therefore considers the possibility of explaining-away belief facts. Though he concedes that expressions of propositional attitudes, that is, sentences of the form “Andrew believes that Carole loves Bob,” might, by adopting a behaviorist analysis of belief, be explained without the need of belief facts (Papers 8, pp. 191-96), he stops short of that analysis and accepts beliefs as facts containing at least two relations (in the example, belief and loves).
By 1918, Russell is conscious that his arguments for mind/matter dualism and against neutral monism are open to dispute. Neutral monism opposes both materialism (the doctrine that what exists is material) and British and Kantian idealism (the doctrine that only thought or mind is ultimately real), arguing that reality is more fundamental than the categories of mind (or consciousness) and matter, and that these are simply names we give to one and the same neutral reality. The proponents of neutral monism include John Dewey and William James (who are sometimes referred to as American Realists), and Ernst Mach. Given the early Russell’s commitment to mind/matter dualism, neutral monism is to him at first alien and incredible. Still, he admits being drawn to the ontological simplicity it allows, which fits neatly with his preference for constructions over inferences and his increasing respect for Occam’s razor, the principle of not positing unnecessary entities in one’s ontology (Papers 8, p. 195).
During this period, Russell’s interests shift increasingly to questions belonging to the philosophy of science, particularly to questions about the kind of language necessary for a complete description of the world. Many distinct strands feed into Russell’s thought in this period.
First, in 1919 he finally breaks away from his longstanding dualism and shifts to a kind of neutral monism. This is the view that what we call “mental” and what we call “material” are really at bottom the same “stuff,” which is neither mental nor material but neutral. By entering into classes and series of classes in different ways, neutral stuff gives rise to what we mistakenly think of distinct categories, the mental and the material (Analysis of Mind, p. 105).
Second, Russell rather idiosyncratically interweaves his new monist ideas with elements of behaviorism, especially in advancing a view of language that moves some of what he formerly took to be abstract entities into the domain of stimuli or events studied by psychology and physiology. In neither case is his allegiance complete or unqualified. For example, he rejects a fully behaviorist account of language by accepting that meaning is grounded in mental images available to introspection but not to external observation. Clearly, this is incompatible with behaviorism. Moreover, this seems to commit Russell to intrinsically mental particulars. This would stand in opposition to neutral monism, which denies there are any intrinsically mental (or physical) particulars. (See Analysis of Mind, Lecture X.)
Third, he begins in this same period to accept Ludwig Wittgenstein’s conception (in the Tractatus Logico Philosophicus) of logical propositions as tautologies that say nothing about the world.
Though these developments give Russell’s work the appearance of a retreat from metaphysical realism, his conception of language and logic remains rooted in realist, metaphysical assumptions.
Because of his neutral monism, Russell can no longer maintain the distinction between a mental sensation and a material sense-datum, which was crucial to his earlier constructive work. Constructions are now carried out in terms that do not suppose mind and matter (sensations and sense-data) to be ultimately distinct. Consciousness is no longer seen as a relation between something psychical, a subject of consciousness, and something physical, a sense datum (Analysis of Mind, pp. 142-43). Instead, the so-called mental and so-called physical dimensions are both constructed out of classes of classes of perceived events, between which there exist – or may exist – correlations.
Meaning receives a similar treatment: instead of a conception of minds in a relation to things that are the meanings of words, Russell describes meaning in terms of classes of events stimulated or caused by certain other events (Analysis of Mind, Chapter X). Assertions that a complex exists hereafter reduce to assertions of some fact about classes, namely that the constituents of classes are related in a certain way.
His constructions also become more complex to accommodate Einstein’s theory of relativity. This work is carried out in particular both in his 1921 Analysis of Mind, which is occupied in part with explaining mind and consciousness in non-mental terms, and in his 1927 Analysis of Matter, which returns to the analysis of so-called material objects, that in 1914 were constructed out of classes of sense-data.
Despite his monism, Russell continues to distinguish psychological and physical laws (“On Propositions,” Papers 8, p. 289), but this dualist element is mitigated by his belief that whether an experience exists in and obeys the laws of physical space is a matter of degree. Some sensations are localized in space to a very high degree, others are less so, and some aren’t at all. For example, when we have an idea of forming the word “orange” in our mouth, our throat constricts just a tiny bit as if to mouth, “orange.” In this case there exists no clear distinction between the image we have of words in the mouth and our mouth-and-lip sensations (Papers 8, p. 286). Depending on your choice of context the sensation can be labeled either mental or material.
Moreover, tactile images of words in the mouth do not violate the laws of physics when seen as material events located in the body, specifically, in the mouth or jaw. In contrast, visual images have no location in a body; for instance, the image of your friend seated in a chair is located neither in your mouth, jaw, nor anywhere else in your body. Moreover, many visual images cannot be construed as bodily sensations, as images of words can, since, no relevant physical event corresponding to the visual image occurs. His admission that visual images are always configured under psychological laws seems to commit Russell to a doctrine of mental particulars. For this reason, Russell appears not so much to adopt neutral monism, which rejects such entities, as to adapt it to his purposes.
Immediately after the lectures conclude, while in prison writing up notes eventually published in the 1921 Analysis of Mind (Papers 8, p. 247), Russell introduces a distinction between what a proposition expresses and what it asserts or states. Among the things that are expressed in sentences are logical concepts, words like “not” and “or,” which derive meaning from psychological experiences of rejection and choice. In these notes and later writings, belief is explained in terms of having experiences like these about image propositions (Analysis of Mind, p. 251). Thus what we believe when we believe a true negative proposition is explained psychologically as a state of disbelief towards a positive image proposition (Analysis of Mind, p. 276). Despite this analysis of the meaning of words for negation, Russell continues to think that negative facts account for what a negative belief asserts, that is, for what makes it true. The psychological account doesn’t do away with the need for them, Russell explains, because the truth or falsity of a proposition is due to some fact, not to a subjective belief or state.
Russell continues to analyze truth in terms of relation to facts, and to characterize facts as atomic, negative, and so on. Moreover, he continues to assume that we can talk about the constituents of facts in terms of particulars and universals. He does not abandon his belief that there are universals; indeed, in the 1920s he argues that we have no images of universals but can intend or will that an image, which is always a particular, ‘mean’ a universal (“On Propositions,” Papers 8, p. 293). This approach is opposed by those like Frank P. Ramsey, for whom notions like “atomic fact” are analogous to “spoken word”: they index language rather than reality. For Ramsey – and others in the various emerging schools of philosophy for which metaphysics is anathema – Russell’s approach confuses categories about language with categories of things in the world and in doing so is too metaphysical and too realist.
To some extent, Russell accepts the syntactical view in the following sense. Beginning in 1918 he concedes that logical truths are not about the world but are merely tautologies, and he comes to admit that tautologies are nothing more than empty combinations of meaningless symbols. Yet Russell’s conception of language and logic remains in some respects deeply metaphysical. For example, when, following Ramsey’s suggestion, Russell claims in the 1925 second edition of Principia that a propositional function occurs only in the propositions that are its values (Principia, p. xiv and Appendix C), he again aligns that idea with a doctrine of predicates as incomplete symbols, that is, with a metaphysical doctrine of the distinction between universals and particulars. Opposing this, Ramsey praises what he thinks is Wittgenstein’s deliberate attempt to avoid metaphysical characterizations of the ultimate constituents of facts, a view he infers from Wittgenstein’s cryptic remark in the Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus that, in a fact, objects “hang together” like links in a chain.
The choice of years framing this final category is somewhat artificial since Russell’s work retains a great deal of unity with the doctrines laid down in the 1920s. Nevertheless, there is a shift in tone, largely due to the emergence of logical positivism, that is, the views proposed by the members of the Vienna Circle. Russell’s work in the remaining decades of his life must be understood as metaphysical in orientation and aim, however highly scientific in language, and as shaped in opposition to doctrines emanating from logical positivism and the legacy following Ludwig Wittgenstein’s claim that philosophical (metaphysical) propositions are nonsensical pseudo-propositions. Yet even as it remains metaphysical in orientation, with respect to logic Russell’s work continues to draw back from his early realism.
In his 1931 introduction to second edition of Principles of Mathematics, Russell writes that, “logical constants…must be treated as part of the language, not as part of what the language speaks about,” adopting a view that he admits is “more linguistic than I believed to be at the time I wrote the Principles” (Principles, p. xi) and that is “less Platonic, or less realist in the medieval sense of the word” (Principles, p. xiv). At the same time he says that he was too generous when he first wrote the Principles in saying that a proposition belongs to logic or mathematics if it contains nothing but logical constants (understood as entities), for he now concedes there are extra-logical propositions (for example “there are three things”) that can be posed in purely logical terms. Moreover, though he now thinks that (i) logic is distinguished by the tautological nature of its propositions, and (ii) following Rudolf Carnap he explains tautologies in terms of analytic propositions, that is, those that are true in virtue of form, Russell notes that we have no clear definition of what it is to be true in virtue of form, and hence no clear idea of what is distinctive to logic (Principles, p. xii). Yet, in general, he no longer thinks of logical propositions as completely general truths about the world, related to those of the special sciences, albeit more abstract.
In his later work, Russell continues to believe that, when a proposition is false, it is so because of a fact. Thus against logical positivists like Neurath, he insists that when empirical propositions are true, “true” has a different meaning than it does for propositions of logic. It is this assumption that he feels is undermined by logical positivists like Carnap, Neurath and others who treat language as socially constructed, and as isolable from facts. But this is wrong, he thinks, as language consists of propositional facts that relate to other facts and is therefore not merely constructed. It is this he has in mind, when in the 1936 “Limits of Empiricism” (Papers 10), he argues that Carnap and Wittgenstein present a view that is too syntactical; that is, truth is not merely syntactical, nor a matter of propositions cohering. As a consequence, despite admitting that his view of logic is less realist, less metaphysical, than in the past, Russell is unwilling to adopt metaphysical agnosticism, and he continues to think that the categories in language point beyond language to the nature of what exists.
Against logical positivism, Russell thinks that to defend the very possibility of objective knowledge it is necessary to permit knowledge to rest in part on non-empirical propositions. In Inquiry into Meaning and Truth (1940) and Human Knowledge: Its Scope and Limits (1948) Russell views the claim that all knowledge is derived from experience as self-refuting and hence inadequate to a theory of knowledge: as David Hume showed, empiricism uses principles of reason that cannot be proved by experience. Specifically, inductive reasoning about experience presupposes that the future will resemble the past, but this belief or principle cannot similarly be proved by induction from experience without incurring a vicious circle. Russell is therefore willing to accept induction as involving a non-empirical logical principle, since, without it, science is impossible. He thus continues to hold that there are general principles, comprised of universals, which we know a priori. Russell affirms the existence of general non-empirical propositions on the grounds, for example, that the incompatibility of red/blue is neither logical nor a generalization from experience (Inquiry, p. 82). Finally, against the logical positivists, Russell rejects the verificationist principle that propositions are true or false only if they are verifiable, and he rejects the idea that propositions make sense only if they are empirically verifiable.
Though Russell’s late period work is empiricist in holding that experience is the ultimate basis of knowledge, it remains rationalist in that some general propositions must be known independently of experience, and realist with respect to universals. Russell argues for the existence of universals against what he sees as an overly syntactical view that eliminates them as entities. That is, he asserts that (some) relations are non-linguistic. Universals figure in Russell’s ontology, in his so-called bundle theory, which explains thing as bundles of co-existing properties, rejecting the notion of a substance as an unknowable ‘this’ distinct from and underlying its properties. (See Inquiry, Chapter 6.) The substance-property conception is natural, he says, if sentences like “this is red” are treated as consisting of a subject and a predicate. However, in sentences like “redness is here,” Russell treats the word “redness” as a name rather than as a predicate. On the substance-property view, two substances may have all their properties in common and yet be distinct, but this possibility vanishes on the bundle theory since a thing is its properties. Aside from his ontology, Russell’s reasons for maintaining the existence of universals are largely epistemological. We may be able to eliminate a great many supposed universals, but at least one, such as is similar, will remain necessary for a full account of our perception and knowledge (Inquiry, p. 344). Russell uses this notion to show that it is unnecessary to assume the existence of negative facts, which until the 1940s he thought necessary to explain truth and falsity. For several decades his psychological account of negative propositions as a state of rejection towards some positive proposition coexisted with his account, using negative facts, of what justifies saying that a negative belief is true and a positive one is false. Thus Russell does not eliminate negative facts until 1948 in Human Knowledge: Its Scope and Limits, where one of his goals is to explain how observation can determine the truth of a negative proposition like “this is not blue” and the falsity of a positive one like “this is blue” without being committed to negative facts (Human Knowledge, Chapter IX). In that text, he argues that what makes “this is not blue” true (and what makes “this is blue” false) is the existence of some color differing from blue. Unlike his earlier period he now thinks this color other than blue neither is nor implies commitment to a negative fact.
Russell’s late work assumes that it is meaningful and possible to study the relation between experience and language and how certain extra-linguistic experiences give rise to linguistic ones, for example, how the sight of butter causes someone to assert “this is butter” or how the taste of cheese causes someone to “this is not butter.” Language, for Russell, is a fact and can be examined scientifically like any other fact. In The Logical Syntax of Language (1934) Rudolph Carnap had argued that that a science may choose to talk in subjective terms about sense data or in objective terms about physical objects since there are multiple equally legitimate ways to talk about the world. Hence Carnap does not believe that in studying language scientifically we must take account of metaphysical contentions about the nature of experience and its relation to language. Russell opposes Rudolf Carnap’s work and logical positivism, that is, logical empiricism, for dismissing his kind of approach as metaphysical nonsense, not a subject of legitimate philosophical study, and he defends it as an attempt to arrive at the truth about the language of experience, as an investigation into an empirical phenomenon.
The following is a selection of texts for further reading on Russell’s metaphysics. A great deal of his writing on logic, the theory of knowledge, and on educational, ethical, social, and political issues is therefore not represented here. Given the staggering amount of writing by Russell, not to mention on Russell, it is not intended to be exhaustive. The definitive bibliographical listing of Russell’s own publications takes up three volumes; it is to be found in Blackwell, Kenneth, Harry Ruja, and Sheila Turcon. A Bibliography of Bertrand Russell, 3 volumes. London and New York: Routledge, 1994.
City University of New York
U. S. A.
Last updated: August 12, 2008 | Originally published: