Conflicts Between Science and Religion
Generally speaking, science is the study of the empirically observable world, while religion pertains largely to what is immaterial and cannot be detected through the senses (if that description is even true of anything). There was a time when philosophy, theology, and natural science coexisted peacefully as equal partners in the quest for understanding. In the eyes of many, that harmony has turned into the strongest rivalry of our time. According to one very popular conception of the relationship between science and religion, the two are enemies locked in mortal combat. In this view, religious claims rail against science, which in turn undermines the credibility of religion. But not everyone sees the relationship in that light. For example, those at the forefront of the Intelligent Design movement think that theistic claims have only been bolstered by recent developments in science. To them, science and religion can and do support each other. Still others maintain that religion and science do not affect each other at all; they are separate, isolated areas of discourse with little or nothing to say to each other. There are also those who doubt that religion is a field of inquiry at all. For them, religion doesn’t study things. It’s not an area of knowledge on par with established scientific fields. In what follows, we will look more closely at these accounts of the relationship between science and religion: that the two are enemies locked in mortal combat, or that they support each other, or that they do not affect each other.
Table of Contents
- Defining Science
- Defining Religion
- The Hostility Theory
- The Harmony Theory
- The Indifference Theory
- References and Further Reading
In order to carry on a discussion about the relationship between science and religion, there needs to be a grasp on how the fields differ. It is important to note that the bifurcation of areas of knowledge into the myriad specialties one finds today is a relatively new phenomenon. Until the modern period, science was not a separate discipline from philosophy; scientists were known as natural philosophers, or experimental philosophers. In those expressions, one sees what it was that those men and women thought was distinctive about their investigations: their methods, and conclusions, were, at the risk of oversimplification, directed at empirical claims about the natural world. Their primary mission was to gather data about observable phenomena in nature, to categorize that data, and to generalize from specific observations to more general ones. In this vein, some scientists have described their work as being a quest to discover the laws of nature. Divergent descriptions of natural laws have been put forward, but there is a broad consensus that laws of nature describe the regular behavior of physical objects and systems. Newton’s famous Laws of Motion are paradigm cases of such laws: they posit, for example, that an object at rest will remain at rest unless compelled by an external force. Other candidates for natural laws, however, are probabilistic, rather than deterministic, in nature. Radioactive decay rates are examples of probabilistic laws: they state that half of a given quantity of some radioactive element will decay within the time known as its half life. The chance of any specific atom of that sample decaying within the half life is thus fifty percent.
Science aims at understanding the behavior of the natural world. Any propositions that are about supernatural objects, or abstract universals, or normative ethics, should not be considered scientific since they do not pertain to the study of natural, empirical objects. Even so, not every scientific claim is directly about empirical objects. But those claims that are not (for example, the claim that science ought to proceed by inductively-based generalizations, which is itself a claim about the enterprise of science, not about any empirical objects) are usually, at the very least, connected to or supportive of the investigation of nature and natural objects. That, however, is only a necessary condition, not a sufficient one. What might be needed to complete the definition of science is still a matter of considerable debate.
Religion can be understood in terms of either its practice or its propositional content. With respect to its practice, religious systems generally prescribe certain behaviors, rituals, rites, and celebrations that their adherents are, at least in some respect, expected to observe. In following these practices, members of a religion are united in a rhythm shared by all and only those who are fellow practitioners. In that sense there is an outwardly recognizable aspect to religion, and in that sense religion is clearly distinct from science, which prescribes no such ritual behavior. But it is not in the common celebrations and rites that science and religion are seen to conflict: it is in their propositional content instead.
Religious propositional content is often easy to recognize, and easy to distinguish from scientific propositions. Characterizing the differences that allow us to make those distinctions between them, on the other hand, is quite thorny. The first problem is that there is very little resemblance between the propositional content of different religions, making it difficult to say what the necessary and sufficient conditions are for a proposition to count as a religious proposition. For instance, not all religions agree about the existence of God, for there are atheistic versions of Buddhism. Among those religions that believe in the existence of God, there are widely ranging descriptions of what God is like: there are monotheistic, pantheistic, and polytheistic varieties of Hinduism, for example. Even monotheists do not all agree about what God is like: the Christian concept of the Trinity is fervently rejected by adherents of Islam and Judaism, despite their common historical origins.
Perhaps one could try to define religious propositions as metaphysical, and scientific propositions as empirical. To a certain extent that would hold. Religious claims are often metaphysical, whereas scientific claims are usually empirical. That distinction will prove too general, however, since many metaphysical claims would not be properly considered religious (for example, that propositions are abstract objects, or that time and space are mind-dependent). In addition, many metaphysical claims are thought of as scientific (for example, that there is no absolute reference frame), and many religious claims are empirical (for example, that Jesus’ body was taken from the earth).
Similar problems arise with attempting to define religious claims solely in terms of their ethical content. That is, one cannot define religious claims as ethical claims since there are claims that one would classify as religious that are not ethical (for example, that God exists), and ethical claims that are not religious (for example, that countries are obliged to honor their treaties). It will also not work to define religious propositions as those statements concerned with diagnosing a universal problem, or prescribing a cure to that problem. Freudianism and Marxism do that too, but they are not generally thought to be religions. Nor can one simply say that religious claims are all those claims that are not scientific. Surely there are non-scientific claims that are also non-religious.
The difficulty of finding clear and distinct markers that identify a given premise as either religious or scientific exacerbates the tension between the two camps. Some claims are considered by both religious practitioners and scientists to fall within their own proper realm of authority, but they disagree about the truth of those claims and about whether the other camp has any authority to pronounce on the claim in question. In what follows, we will concentrate on the relationship between the propositions that science and religion affirm. That is, our focus will be on how the propositions endorsed by science relate to the propositions embraced by religious practitioners.
The relationship between science and religion is frequently modeled as being hostile, with each side making claims that the other side denies. According to the hostility model, scientific claims are false if religious claims are true, and religious claims are false if scientific claims are true. The depiction usually goes beyond that, however, to the claim that the opponent is not simply incorrect, but operating under great and dangerous delusions. Consider this speech given by the character Matthew Harrison Brady from Inherit the Wind, the movie about the famed Scopes trial:
I have been to their cities and I have seen the altars upon which they sacrifice the futures of their children to the gods of science. And what are their rewards? Confusion and self-destruction. New ways to kill each other in wars. I tell you, gentlemen, the way of science is the way of darkness.
On the other end of the spectrum, Isaac Asimov made this statement in the Canadian Atheists Newsletter in 1994:
Imagine the people who believe [that God exists] and who are not ashamed to ignore, totally, all the patient findings of thinking minds through all the centuries since the Bible was written. And it is these ignorant people, the most uneducated, the most unimaginative, the most unthinking among us, who would make themselves the guides and leaders of us all; who would force their feeble and childish beliefs on us; who would invade our schools and libraries and homes. I personally resent it bitterly….
Both sides, according to the hostility model, consider the other side to be wrong even dangerously so. In what follows we will consider three of the most historically important areas of purported conflict between science and religion.
The conflict between the Catholic Church and empirical scientists over heliocentrism is often treated as if the scientists, interested only in the truth of the matter, were ruthlessly persecuted by the Church, which was blinded to the facts by its narrow-minded dogmatism. But that is almost certainly an exaggeration, if not an outright mischaracterization, of the early debate.
At issue was the question of which body orbited which: did the earth orbit the sun, or did the sun orbit the earth? The older view, inherited from Ptolemy, was that the sun and all other heavenly bodies were in orbit around the earth, the fixed center of the universe. Certainly the Church found justification for geocentrism in Christian scripture: “You have established the earth on its foundations; it cannot be moved,¨ says the psalmist. But it is not simply allegiance to a literal interpretation of the Bible that led the Church and Galileo into conflict.
To be sure, the Ptolemaic system, in an attempt to accommodate the growing astronomical data being gathered by diligent observers of the heavens, had become so elaborate and cumbersome by the time Nicolaus Copernicus came on the scene that a simpler system that accommodated the data would have been warmly welcomed.
In 1543, Copernicus published Revolutions of the Celestial Spheres, in which he laid out his model of heliocentrism. He had been working on the observations that led to the publication for thirty years, and it was only after considerable prompting that he published those findings at all. In his mind, the work was still incomplete and inconclusive. Contrary to the way it is often depicted, there was no clearly compelling case made in Revolutions sufficient for toppling the geocentric model favored by the Church. There was no new evidence presented in his publication. Instead, he wrote his proposal because he considered it more elegant and of greater explanatory power than the Ptolemaic system.
After Copernicus passed from the stage, Galileo made his great entrance. Aided by a newly invented means of magnification, the telescope, Galileo chronicled several observable features of our solar system that were in conflict with the claims of Ptolemy. For example, he observed that Jupiter had four moons in its orbit, that Venus also has phases like the earth’s moon, and that the surface of the moon was not smooth, as had been claimed by Aristotle, but full of peaks and valleys. As Richard J. Blackwell points out,
As the generations passed, some new evidence slowly accumulated that tended to make the new cosmic theory more likely to be true. In Galileo’s day, however, conclusive proof of Copernicanism still had not been found, despite his own lifelong efforts to establish such a proof. To understand the Galileo affair properly, it is essential to keep in mind that no one, including Galileo himself, was yet able to settle the scientific debate conclusively (Blackwell 109).
When Copernicus developed his heliocentric model, it fared no better at fitting the data than did the older, but admittedly more complicated, geocentrism based on Ptolemy. The early debate was not between a system that fit the data (Copernicus’s) and one that did not (Ptolemy’s). Instead, the two systems were in a dead heat in terms of according with observations. The apparent advantage to heliocentrism was not that it fit the empirical findings better than the geocentric model; instead, the advantage was that it did so while employing fewer brute facts.
One example of that is the different explanations offered of the retrograde motion of Mars. Normally, the path of a planet is to travel from west to east along with the rest of the stars. Sometimes, however, the planet seems to backtrack, temporarily drifting from east to west. Explaining this retrograde motion was a perennial problem for astronomers, and the Ptolemaic explanation was that Mars moved in two circles: there was a small circular path that Mars traversed, centered on a path that traced a wider circle with the earth at its center. If a person were to hold a (transparent) bicycle tire parallel to the ground, with a colored dot painted on the outer part of the tire, and were then to set the tire spinning counterclockwise while holding the center of the tire in a fixed position, the dot would appear to that person to travel from right to left, then from left to right, then right to left, then left to right, and so on as it circumscribed the hub. Suppose that the person then walked in a counterclockwise circle around a tree with the tire still spinning. From an observer in the tree, the colored dot on the tire would appear to travel generally from right to left, with periods of traveling from left to right. This system of postulating circles traveling around circles (known as epicycles) is how the Ptolemaic system accounted for retrograde motion.
The Copernican model is simpler. Retrograde motion results from the fact that planets further from the sun move in slower cycles than planets nearer to the sun. Retrograde motion results from the earth passing Mars on the inside as the two planets journey around the sun. Even though the Copernican model requires fewer cycles of motion it was not obviously superior. There were still problems with fitting the model to the data, problems which resulted mostly from the assumption (to be corrected later by Kepler) that all orbits had to be circular.
The Galilean controversy cannot be properly understood as long as it is treated simply as a question of data fitting one model but not the other. Some scholars have argued that there was strong reason to resist the abrupt paradigm change being offered by heliocentrism that went beyond the astronomical data itself. Aristotelian natural philosophy, which served as the broad framework for the geocentric model endorsed by medieval philosophers and Churchmen, had been remarkably successful at providing scientific insight and explanation. Though geocentrism and heliocentrism rated about the same when it came to fitting astronomical data, there were other theoretical points to consider, some of which gave geocentrism and Aristotelian natural philosophy an apparent advantage. Scripture was most naturally read as geocentric, as has been noted, and Aristotle’s physical principles in all areas of science had been so powerful and well-established that there was a strong presumption in their favor. As one commentator states, “The Aristotelian corpus offered a convincing framework and a powerful methodology for thinking and writing about cosmology, meteorology, psychology, matter theory, motion, light, sensation, and biological phenomena of all kinds– Aristotelian philosophy was simply too valuable to relinquish¨ (Lindberg 67). To frame the Galilean controversy simply in terms of religion versus science is inaccurate and unhelpful.
Faced with two equally able models, then, the Churchmen tried to settle the dispute by saying that one model (geocentrism) more naturally fit the claims of the Bible and was better suited to Aristotle’s highly successful broader scientific framework. Thus, both astronomical models fit the data equally accurately (or equally inaccurately); but one seemed to fit holy writ much more naturally, and required a less radical retooling of the entire body of scientific knowledge. It was those differences not empirical superiority that inclined the Church toward the Ptolemaic system. Such was the stage of the early debate.
In the seventeenth century, the brilliant work of Sir Isaac Newton gave rise to another issue that would strain the relationship between science and religion. Newton was able to model the behavior of celestial bodies (including the earth, moon, and sun) through mechanical means by positing that one force, the force of gravity, was responsible for terrestrial phenomena, such as the falling of heavy bodies to earth, as well as celestial phenomena, such as the earth’s orbit around the sun. Through his clever combination of observation and mathematical modeling, he also formulated his three famous laws of motion: (1) that a body at rest will stay at rest, and a body at motion will continue in uniform motion, unless acted on by an external force; (2) that a force of strength F applied to a body of mass m results in an acceleration of a; and (3) that every action is paired with an equal and opposite reaction.
The result of this comprehensive and powerful work was the ability to account for nearly all natural phenomena from a few carefully stated physical principles. Even though Newton frequently referred to the activity of God in nature (for example, that God might be directly responsible for gravitational attraction in the absence of a materially mediated force, or that the smallest particles of matter were made to be indestructible by God so that nature would have a constant character through time), there was nothing in his system of nature that required God, or any intelligent agent at all. The properties of matter in motion seemed sufficient to explain the behavior of natural objects. His was an apparently complete system and thoroughly naturalistic system.
Interestingly, this led to two diametrically opposed inferences. On the one hand, many people saw the success of Newton (and many people see the continued success of physics to the present day) as an argument for atheism. If God is not needed to explain the behavior of the world, and if the cosmos, like a giant clock, operates on mechanical principles alone, then one has no reason to suppose that God even exists. There are no explanatory gaps left for God to fill. Newton himself would have rejected this. He considered God to have a vital role in setting up the initial conditions for the universe. Not all of his followers agreed. Napoleon Bonaparte invited the great physicist and mathematician Pierre-Simon Laplace to give him a lesson on the history and origin of the cosmos, the nebular hypothesis of the origin of the planets and stars, and other current scientific speculations. After explaining all these things in purely mechanistic terms to Napoleon, Laplace was asked why he had made no mention of God in his account. “Sir,¨ Laplace quipped, “I have no need of that hypothesis.¨
Others saw the success of Newton’s work, and the picture he gave of the universe as an enormous machine, as a strong argument for theism. This was Newton’s own conclusion as well. It was just this image of the cosmos as a well-constructed machine that prompted William Paley to give his famous watch analogy. Paley argued that one would not suppose that a fine watch found in the forest was the result of chance, but would infer that there must have been a watchmaker. In the same way, Paley said the existence of a finely crafted universe compels us to believe that the universe must have been designed as well. For Paley, the complexity of the world spoke in favor of God’s existence, not against it. The world could have been chaotic, but it is not: it is lawlike, consistent in its behavior, and well-adjusted to support the needs of life.
A third battle between science and religion developed over the theories of Charles Darwin. Like the debates over heliocentrism and mechanism, the debate over evolution can be understood in a less rhetorically charged way than it is usually presented. One assumption that drove the initial resistance to Darwinism is the belief that no species can mutate into a different species. This doctrine, known as the fixity of species, was based on uniform observations, and no experimental or observational evidence was known to contradict it. Instead, it had always been the believed that “like produces like.¨ That is, chickens, when they reproduce, make chickens, bats make bats, and cucumbers make more cucumbers.
Scripture seemed to support this everyday observation. Genesis claims that God decreed creatures to reproduce “after their kind.¨ It also claims that species were created directly by God in the manner (more or less) that they exist today. So, on a literal reading of Genesis, a theological position, supported by uniform observation, provided grounds to dissent from Darwin about the origin of species. It is true that most theologians were not friendly to Darwin; it is untrue that they had no rational reason for taking the position they did.
There have been noteworthy attacks on evolutionary theory from within the scientific community itself rather than from outside in the theological community. For example, Darwin suggested that the eye may be too complex to arise through natural selection alone. After all, what evolutionary advantage would there be to a half-eye that couldn’t work as an eye? Seizing on Darwin’s idea that it is difficult to give an evolutionary explanation of the eye, because it is apparently irreducibly complex, a small number of scientists, such as the biochemist Michael Behe, are convinced that the world is the product of intelligent design. These complex systems, on Behe’s account, could not have arisen through slight, successive modifications, because they completely cease to function if any of their parts is removed. In response, evolutionists point out the discovery of an intermediate species with a half-eye that could be used for some purpose other than seeing, and success at doing this would help to make the species better fit for survival.
Since the original furor over Darwinism, many religious thinkers have re-examined their theological commitments and scriptural hermeneutical frameworks. The result has been that they have found a way to affirm the importance and accuracy of the historical narratives, while situating them in an evolutionary framework. Similarly, many biologists have happily carried on their work while, at the same time, assenting to the authority of sacred texts. To many Christian fundamentalists, on the other hand, Darwin’s biology is unacceptable, and the plain teaching of Genesis is that the world was created directly by God in a six-day period a few thousand years ago, a view known as “young earth creationism.¨ But not all Christians agree that Genesis is to be understood that way. Seeking harmony, these Christians have understood Genesis as being a polemic primarily against the Sumerian creation myth known as the Enuma Elish; and they have concluded that Genesis is not arguing for young earth creationism, or any specific timeline of creation: instead, it may have a completely different pedagogical agenda altogether, the agenda of asserting simply that God alone is the creator; or that creation is intentional and not accidental; or that there is nothing in existence that God did not create.
Not everyone has been pleased by these new harmonizations. Court records across the country reflect the tension that still infuses the debate: state and federal courts have been involved in multiple states where advocates of divine creationism have tried to have their position represented in official public school textbooks and curricula. Religious leaders are often at the forefront of these contests, arguing that evolutionary naturalism is bad science if it is science at all and that the activity of an intelligent designer is evident in nature, and ought to be discussed when origin theories are presented. Their proposals are met with stiff resistance from many civil rights organizations, as well as a preponderance of the scientific establishment. Activists from those camps allege that creationism (or creation science, or intelligent design) can be discussed at home or Sunday school, but it is nothing more than a thinly veiled attempt at establishing a theocratic educational system formulated by Christian fundamentalists. It is not, they say, a scientific theory.
All these conflicts have a central issue: the explanation of data. Frequently, the debate is not over what the data are, but what they mean. It is often thought that scientific data do not require any interpretation, but that position cannot withstand much scrutiny. The importance of interpretation in understanding how science and religion interact with data is brought into focus by the work of Pierre Duhem and W.V.O. Quine, with what has come to be called the Duhem-Quine thesis. According to this proposition, scientific hypotheses do not come free-floating. They are always situated against a large array of background hypotheses, which consist partly of other observations, partly of other empirical hypotheses, and partly of metaphysical and epistemological philosophical propositions. No single hypothesis, therefore, can be isolated and either decisively refuted or confirmed by experimental data. Suppose some scientific hypothesis h entails that a certain result r will come from some experiment e. That is, h implies r. When e is performed, however, suppose that the opposite of the expected result obtains: e yields ~r instead of the anticipated result r, apparently refuting h. But, caution Duhem and Quine, that move is too hasty: the Duhem-Quine argument is that one never simply has h and h alone as a driving hypothesis. Every hypothesis is coupled with a set of background assumptions b such that the argument above was represented without a key variable in place. A complete version would have (h & b) imply r, so if ~r is the result, then this is insufficient to determine whether the experiment shows ~h or instead ~b. That is, the result ~r might simply refute something within the vast set of background assumptions. This leads to an insuperable problem: the practical, and maybe theoretical, impossibility of elucidating all of b means that there can be no complete and conclusive refutation of any specific scientific hypothesis. Thus, almost any set of observations can be retained in the face of apparently disconfirming experimental data.
The Duhem-Quine thesis can be applied to another subject at the core of the conflicts between religion and science: the interpretation of sacred texts. Part of what the thesis highlights is the role of interpretation in understanding the relationships between experiments, hypotheses, confirmation, and explanation. In the same way, there is always a set of background assumptions that a reader takes to the interpretation of scripture. No single interpretive statement stands in isolation from the set of assumptions undergirding it. Certain experimental results or empirical observations may seemingly serve to disconfirm a scriptural claim (for instance, that the earth is fixed and cannot be moved), but it can never be certain that the data disconfirms that claim rather than one of the claims in the set of background assumptions. For example, Galileo’s observational data might not disconfirm the Bible’s claim that the earth is fixed and does not move but instead disconfirm some background assumptions that led Churchmen to suppose that the Bible did claim that the earth is fixed and does not move. In this way, the Bible is saved from disconfirmation, from refutation.
Since it is the most charged of the three cases discussed above, the evolution issue will serve as a good application of the Duhem-Quine thesis. Suppose that an evolutionist were strongly Darwinian; that is, they took not only the general contours of Darwinism, but Darwin‘s own specific claims as authoritative. One of the claims Darwin made about his theory was that, after a sufficient amount of geological data had been recovered from the earth, the fossil record would bear out his theory by displaying a series of inter-specific life forms, a series of species connecting a current species with its ancestor species, the so-called “missing links¨ between the species and its ancestors. Between humans and their earlier ancestors, a clear lineage would be displayed to support the adaptation/natural selection model that Darwin proposed.
Famously, the fossil record has been quite puzzling on this issue. On the one hand, many new (previously unknown) species have been discovered, and they have been placed in evolutionary chains that precede the set of species that currently populate the planet. On the other hand, the nature of the fossil record has been quite different from what Darwin predicted. Instead of the smooth transition from species to species, with the intermediary steps filled in by transitional life forms that have since passed from the scene, one sees nearly instantaneous proliferations of new species arising, seemingly, out of nowhere.
Divine creationists and evolutionists have both seen this as consistent with their beliefs. The evolutionist, not cowed by the apparent counter-evidence to Darwinism, has reformulated evolutionary theory to account for these abrupt changes. Stephen Jay Gould, for instance, has argued that evolution took place through “punctuated equilibrium¨: long, stable periods with no new species formation are followed by rapid species multiplication that happens too fast to be captured in the fossil record. Creationists have seen the nearly instantaneous proliferations of new species as supportive of their claim that God performed several discrete acts of creation, introducing a limited set of species at a time with gaps between those acts of direct creation.
Both sides are looking at the same data, but disagreeing over the interpretation of that data. How can that be? The Duhem-Quine thesis offers some insight here by pointing out that it will always be the case that a given set of data fit into different interpretive frameworks. Creationists see the fossil record as refuting Darwinism, and thereby evolutionary theory. Evolutionists see it as refuting Darwin’s background assumption that evolution would take place slowly and gradually. Evolutionists see the fossil record and the old age of fossils, as well as other independent lines of evidence that point to an ancient earth and an even more ancient cosmos, as a refutation of creationism. Many who believe that God is the creator and designer of the world see the same evidence as refuting a certain literal interpretation of Genesis, but not refuting creationism more broadly conceived (that is, creationism that is not young-earth creationism). There is, and will always be, an impasse whenever two sides disagree about data that can fit with contradictory sets of assumptions, and new disagreements will arise over whether this fit is a reasonable fit or instead a fit that is too ad hoc to be accepted as reasonable.
The creation-evolution debate serves as an excellent example of the philosophical problems involved in explanations of data and refutations of hypotheses, but it is by no means unique. The same kind of gridlock appeared over the interpretation of the experiments that led to quantum mechanics, and that debate still continues today. At stake is nothing less than the important question of whether the universe is completely deterministic, or whether it is partly indeterministic. For now, the indeterminists have the upper hand, with their Copenhagen Interpretation of quantum mechanics, but they have triumphed because they have persuaded more people with their metaphysical arguments, not because decisive experiments have settled the matter in their favor.
The above examples serve to illustrate a serious deficiency with a confrontational theory of the interaction between science and religion: it is at best an oversimplification of the relationship, and at worst a complete mischaracterization. During the heyday of scientific advancement in the modern period, countless thinkers have found themselves adhering to religious commitments and adding to scientific knowledge at the same time. People like Descartes, Newton, Pascal, Boyle, Kepler, Gassendi, and many more have sought the harmonization of science and religion. In his essay “Of Atheism,¨ Francis Bacon argued that recent advances in science (experimental philosophy), which supplanted the scholastic approach to physics with its four elements, provided a firm foundation for belief in God’s existence. He said,
God never wrought miracle to convince atheism, because His ordinary works convince it. It is true that a little philosophy inclineth man’s mind to atheism; but depth in philosophy bringeth men’s minds about to religion: for while the mind of man looketh upon second causes scattered, it may sometimes rest in them, and go no farther; but when it beholdeth the chain of them confederate and linked together, it must needs fly to Providence and Deity. Nay, even that school which is most accused of atheism doth most demonstrate religion. For it is a thousand times more credible, that four mutable elements, and one immutable fifth essence duly and eternally placed, need no God; than that an army of infinite small portions, or seeds unplaced, should have produced this order and beauty without a divine Marshall (Bacon 66-7).
In a similar vein, the Reformer John Calvin encouraged Christians to study nature through scientific investigation, because science was the study of God’s handiwork. As such, it both honored the Creator and taught creatures about the one who made them.
Sentiments like Calvin’s are still expressed by many experimental researchers who hold to religious beliefs. To them, the study of nature has led us to understand the world as being vastly more complex and intricate than anyone ever knew before. Because they believe the world is the direct result of God’s creative activity, advances in science have served, in William Paley’s words, to “increase the admiration of the contrivance¨ of nature’s workings. Science has not refuted their view of the world: it has confirmed and strengthened it.
Still others argue that science and religion make declarations that are completely unrelated to each other. On this theory, science and religion are attending to disparate issues, and the answers they give have no implications for the other discipline. Science pertains to the classification of empirical observations; religion pertains to ethics, ritual, and propositions (such as the assertion that a divine being exists) that have no empirical entailments.
Unlike the conflict model, where religious claims and scientific claims are seen to falsify each other, this description makes scientific declarations exempt from religious scrutiny and vice versa. One leading religious figure of the twentieth century, Karl Barth, espoused this view. In a letter to his niece, Barth said,
Has no one explained to you in your seminar that one can as little compare the biblical creation story and a scientific theory like that of evolution as one can compare, shall we say, an organ and a vacuum-cleaner–that there can be as little question of harmony between as of contradiction? (Johnson 4)
Barth’s claim is that a gulf separates science and religion. Their deliberations can no more be compared than can an astronaut and the number seven.
When it is advocated, this position frequently draws on the perceived distinction between questions of fact and questions of faith. This often touted difference is, despite its ubiquity, a murky one. Typically, the characterization is that faith is a question of belief without evidence, or even belief in the presence of what should normally be taken as decisively refuting evidence. Fact, on the other hand, is what is tangible and certain. Religious commitments are faith commitments on this position; the claims of science are factual (even if they are at least theoretically open for revision in the future). But this depiction is rife with difficulties. First of all, it seems that “F is a fact¨ simply means “F is true.¨ Therefore, if it is true that God exists, for example, it is a fact that God exists. But perhaps the connoted difference is better captured by defining facts this way: F is a fact if and only if F is true and obvious. This will not do either, however, for many things that are taken as facts are far from obvious. That apparently solid bodies, like tables, consist almost completely of empty space is thought to be a fact taught us by atomic theory; but that this table consists mostly of empty space is far from obvious from my own experience of it. Maybe, then, “F is a fact¨ means “F is true and experts agree that F is true.¨ In that case, though, if the term “experts¨ doesn’t apply only to scientific experts, the claims of religious experts could count as facts as well, and if they claim that God exists, it would be a factual claim. It cannot be countered here that “God exists¨ is not verified by the layperson’s everyday experience, for neither is the fact that tables are mostly empty space.
If one continues to refine the definition of fact to preserve a meaningful distinction between matters of fact and faith, one might be tempted to try this revision: “F is a fact¨ means “F is true and empirically verifiable.¨ Yet this approach has difficulties because there is a controversy over what counts as being empirically verifiable. Philosophers of science influenced by Karl Popper argue that scientific claims are refutable but never verifiable. Other philosophers of science argue that scientific claims are verifiable but usually very indirectly. For example, that there were no humans on earth three million years ago isn’t something we can directly view because we can’t go back three million years ago and look. The evidence for there being no humans is indirect, though empirical. Still others would argue that the claim that there were no humans on earth three million years ago is not empirically verifiable simply because no one can now directly view the past. In light of these problems, one might define a fact in a new way: “F is a fact¨ means “F is true and is a scientific claim.¨ This, of course, is to give up the game completely and succumb to a mere tautology because saying “scientific claims are different from religious claims because scientific claims are scientific¨ is hardly illuminating.
Coming from the other direction and supposing that “F is a fact¨ means simply “F is true,¨ there is still the problem of defining faith. “F is a matter of faith¨ cannot be understood as “F is true,¨ so there is apparently a distinction between matters of faith and facts. But what is the difference, and does it separate religion from science? Simply stating that “F is a matter of faith¨ means “F is not a fact¨ will not do; certainly matters of faith are at least possibly true, and if they are possibly true they are possibly facts.
It seems that the distinction has to do with evidence: “F is a matter of faith¨ means “F is unsupported by evidence.¨ If this is said of religious beliefs, however, it is clearly false. For example, there is the evidence of testimony in favor of the claim that Jesus rose from the dead. One typically allows testimony to serve as evidence for a belief (for example, Jones believes that his friend Smith is at the store because Smith’s wife told him so, and she is not known to lie about such things). Or, consider the arguments offered in favor of theism: the cosmological argument, teleological argument, ontological argument, moral argument, and more are given in support of religious belief. Thus, it would be false that there is no evidence for religious claims. Perhaps we should retreat to saying “F is a matter of faith¨ means “F is insufficiently unsupported by evidence.¨ But it is very difficult to settle on a good definition of “insufficiently.¨
Furthermore, even if some religious claims are unsupported by evidence, that does not put religion on shakier ground than science, for science also makes claims unsupported by evidence, or so some scholars have argued. That the senses generally report the truth about the world is not a claim supported by evidence; any evidence that would be cited as supportive of the claim would only be supportive if the claim is already known to be true. The same is true of many propositions assumed by scientists: that knowledge of the world is possible, or that scientific explanations should only refer to natural causes, or that all that exists is the material world. These propositions are no more supported by empirical evidence than their contraries, that knowledge of the world is impossible, or that scientific explanations may invoke God as a cause, or that the material world is not all that exists. Thus, it is argued, science makes many claims unsupported by evidence, and perhaps unsupportable by evidence.
In promoting the idea that science transcends the evidence, it has been suggested that in the Galileo affair, for example, both the faith claims and the scientific claims had much in common: the Church’s position was supported by evidence, even though their position would be considered religious as well. For that matter, Galileo’s own position on heliocentrism was lacking sufficient evidence to count as empirically well-established. Indeed, the whole history of natural theology is an effort to harmonize religious belief with evidence and rational argument. And like Galileo, Darwin also introduced an element of faith into his scientific assessment when he said his theory would be supported by the future work of geologists and paleontologists. His gradualism turned out to be contradicted by the fossil record he put so much hope in.
Presumably one can distinguish between claims that are generally agreed upon for instance, that there are material objects and those that are more controversial for instance, that the text Joseph Smith translated from the golden plates he received is Holy Scripture. But if the separation of fact from faith just amounts to separating less widely accepted premises from more widely accepted ones, one could carry that separation out in many ways with unexpected, and unwanted, results. If we take a poll across our society, the result is that it is few believe that particles can behave as waves, as quantum mechanics implies, but many believe that God exists, but the first claim is scientific fact whereas the second is religious. Wouldn’t reliance on the poll result make it a fact that God exists and make it only a matter of faith that quantum mechanics is correct? That hardly seems like the right result.
The relationship between science and religion is frequently commented on, but rarely understood with clarity. Though very few people would deny the importance of religion or of science, it is difficult to see what their importance is to each other. On the hostility theory, they make incompatible claims, and they pose grave risks to each other, and to society. Which camp endangers society–religion or science–and which camp helps it is the point of disagreement. But on another theory, the two are not opposed at all. According to some commentators, religion and science work together to present a fuller understanding of the world by mutually enlightening each other. Still other people think that science and religion pose no risks to each other, but they do not support each other either; they are simply concerned with isolated sets of questions. Since it is unlikely that either science or religion will pass from the stage any time soon, it is, and will continue to be, orth our time to reflect on their relationship.
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