A prominent salonnière in seventeenth-century Paris, Madame de Sablé has long occupied the background of early modern French philosophy. She has survived in intellectual history as the patron of La Rochefoucauld, as the hostess of a theological salon, and as the correspondent of Blaise Pascal and Antoine Arnauld. These ancillary roles have obscured her original contributions to moral philosophy in her writings. In her maxims, Sablé develops a distinctive critique of moral virtue. She claims that virtue is a mask of vice; usually of pride, and that self-interest is the habitual motor behind altruistic actions. This critique of virtue is a social critique inasmuch as it unmasks the mechanism of self-aggrandizement under the cover of virtue in the court hierarchy of the period. With her characteristic moderation, Sablé insists that friendship constitutes an exception to the social charade of masked self-interest. In the intimacies of mutually sacrificial friendship, authentic virtue can flourish. Sablé’s dismissal of the claims of natural moral virtue, and her fideistic insistence that true moral order can only be grasped in the light of faith, reflect her adherence to Jansenism, the neo-Augustinian movement in Catholicism which she defended in both civil and ecclesiastical circles.
Madeleine de Souvré was born in 1598 to an ancient aristocratic family in Le Perche, a region in western France. Prominent in court circles, her father Gilles de Souvré was a marshal of France and served as the governor of Louis XIII in his minority. Her mother was Françoise de Bailleul, dame de Renouard. In the political controversies of the period, the Souvré family sided with the parti dévot, a faction of militant Catholics who wanted France’s foreign policy to stress an international Catholic alliance (notably with Spain and Austria) against the Protestant, Orthodox, and Islamic powers. In 1610 Madeleine de Souvré was named lady-in-waiting to Queen Marie de Medicis, the mother of Louis XIII and the regent of France. Although little is known about Mademoiselle de Souvré’s education, it is clear that early in her education she acquired a knowledge of Spanish literature. Balthasar Gracián’s L’oraculo manual would prove especially influential in Sablé’s later reflections on the nature of virtue.
In 1614, Madeleine de Souvré married Philippe Emmanuel de Laval, marquis de Sablé. Although Madame de Sablé would bear nine children, only four survived childhood: Urbain, marquis de Bois-Dauphin; Henri, Bishop of La Rochelle; Guy, a military officer; and Marie, a cloistered nun. By all accounts, the marriage was an unhappy one, for both spouses conducted scarcely concealed romantic affairs as they led increasingly separate existences.
From the beginning of her marriage, Sablé frequented the literary salons of Paris. Three in particular developed her philosophical culture. In the celebrated chambre bleu of Madame de Rambouillet, Sablé became an ardent reader of the works of Montaigne and was introduced to the theories of Descartes. At the literary samedis of Mademoiselle de Scudéry, Sablé studied the gradations of love that were the central preoccupation of the salon’s literary production. At the salon of Mademoiselle de Montpensier, Sablé practiced the literary vogue of the portrait moral, in which the author sketched the characteristic vices and virtues of a prominent courtier presented under a pseudonym. This predilection for moral psychology and skepticism concerning the claims of knowledge helped shape the philosophical themes Sablé would treat in her writings of maturity.
The 1640s inaugurated a more somber period in Sablé’s life. In 1640, the death of her husband left her in a precarious financial situation, and a family quarrel over the inheritance provoked a lawsuit against her eldest son, Urbain. In 1646, the death of her son Guy at the battle of Dunkirk plunged her into prolonged mourning.
The period also marked a religious conversion. Sablé increasingly frequented the Parisian convent of Port-Royal, the citadel of the Jansenist movement. Jansenism stressed the depth of human depravity, complete reliance on grace for salvation, and the need to lead an austere moral life opposed to the amusements of the world. Sablé’s moral qualms about frequent reception of the sacraments occasioned Antoine Arnauld’s composition of On Frequent Communion (1642), a treatise attacking the alleged moral laxism of the Jesuits. By the 1650s Sablé would emerge as a partisan of Jansenism and as a prominent defender of the embattled convent of Port-Royal, but her continued participation in the salon culture of the capital would raise doubts as to the depth of her conversion to the cause’s moral rigorism.
By the end of the decade, Sablé emerged as the hostess of her own salon, first in the fashionable Place Royale (1648-1655) and then in the apartment she had constructed on the grounds of the Port-Royal convent (1655-1678). The salon specialized in the production of the literary genre of the maxime, a concise, epigrammatic phrase that explored the contradictions of human psychology. A salon member, François, duc de La Rochefoucauld, quickly emerged as the master of the genre. Sablé served as a critic and editor for La Rochefoucauld’s maxims, but she also composed her own maxims, which were published posthumously. Philosophical sessions included papers by Madame de Brégy on the Stoicism of Epictetus, Clausure on Cartesianism, Sourdis on the problem of the vacuum, and Arnauld d’Andilly on the limits of patriotism. As in other salons, the nature and varieties of love were the primary topic of debate. Leading philosophical members of the salon included Blaise Pascal, Gilberte Pascal Périer, Antoine Arnauld, Pierre Nicole, and Madame de Sévigné.
As she reemerged into Parisian high society, Sablé revealed her diplomatic skills. During the Fronde (1648-1653), the intermittent civil war that pitted aristocrats and parliamentarians against the throne, she managed to maintain close friendships with members of both sides. Despite her allegiance to Jansenism, she included Jesuits and anti-Jansenist laity among her salon guests. When the persecution of the Jansenists, especially the nuns of Port-Royal, intensified in the 1660s, she labored to affect the reconciliation of the warring factions. Pope Clement IX’s “Peace of the Church” (1669), which lifted the censures from the Port-Royal community, reflected in part her interventions at the papal court.
Madame de Sablé died in her Port-Royal apartment on January 16, 1678.
Sablé’s extant writings fall into three categories: a collection of maxims, a treatise on friendship, and her letters.
Published posthumously in 1678 by Abbé Nicolas d’Ailly, Maximes de Mme la Marquise de Sablé constitutes Sablé’s most substantial contribution to moral philosophy. In this collection of maxims, Sablé analyzes the vices that mask themselves as virtues in the aristocratic society of the period. Unlike her colleague La Rochefoucauld, however, she insists that love constitutes an exception to the domination of vice. Although her maxims focus primarily on questions of virtue and vice, Sablé also studies epistemological questions, especially those surrounding the relationship between power and knowledge. In her skeptical study of virtue and power, Sablé is clearly influenced by Montaigne, Graci‡n, and La Rochefoucauld. She differs from her sources, however, in the characteristic moderation by which she judges the influence of self-interest in social relations.
The subsequent history of Sablé’s maximes constitutes a cautionary tale on the survival of works by women philosophers. Often published in anthologies featuring La Rochefoucauld’s maxims, Sablé’s maxims were often falsely attributed to her protégé. Sablé’s most extensive maxim, actually a miniature essay condemning attendance at theatrical performances (maxim no. 80), was attributed for centuries to Blaise Pascal. A passage in Pascal’s Pensées condemning the theater bears a striking resemblance to the phrases of Sablé. Critics concluded that it must have been Sablé who copied Pascal, given the literary preeminence of the latter. The influential Brunschvicg (1904) and Lafuma (1951) editions of Pascal in the early twentieth century continued this misattribution. Only at the end of the twentieth century was this critique of theater reattributed to Sablé herself. Sellier’s recent edition of the Pensées (1991, 2000) notes that it was clearly Pascal who copied and altered the critique of theater originally authored by Sablé.
First published by Victor Cousin in the nineteenth-century, Sablé’s brief treatise On Friendship argues that virtue can be experienced within the confines of intimate friendship. Unlike other social relationships, where motivations remain masked and vulnerable to misinterpretation, friendship permits one to discover the internal motivation behind the external action of one’s partner.
An extensive correspondence of Sablé also survives in the archives of the Bibliothèque nationale de France and in scattered biographical publications. Barthélemy’s scholarly study of Sablé’s salon associates (1865) provides an ample selection of the letters written by and to the marquise. Although most of the letters deal with practical affairs concerning Sablé’s person, family, and salon, some of the letters deal with philosophical issues related to the religious controversies of the period. Such issues include the relationship between grace and free will, the limits of civil and ecclesiastical authority in matters of conscience, and the immortality of the human soul. Philosophical correspondents include Blaise Pascal, Antoine Arnauld, Mère Angélique Arnauld, Mère Agnès Arnauld, Mère Angélique de Saint-Jean Arnauld d’Andilly, Pierre Nicole, Antoine Menjot, and Jean Domat.
Sablé’s philosophical reflections are limited to the areas of ethics and epistemology. In moral philosophy, she focuses on the tendency of the vice of pride to disguise itself as virtue. In epistemology, she examines the relationship between power and the claims to truth. In both her moral theory and her theory of knowledge, she mitigates her skepticism. Despite the presence of vice behind many surface virtues, some apparently virtuous actions actually reflect authentic virtue in the agent. Although power has corrupted some claims to truth in court society, certain claims to truth – notably claims to religious truth based on obedience to divine revelation – are more than credible.
In many passages, Sablé condemns apparent exercises of virtue as expressions of vice. Altruism often masks the will to dominate the other. Self-aggrandizement is the motor of apparently charitable action. Her critique of virtue is a political critique, inasmuch as she examines the depredations of occulted egoism in the culture of the court.
Sablé analyzes how this masked vice operates within the polite society of the period. “Virtue is not always where one sees actions that appear virtuous. Sometimes one only recognizes a favor in order to establish one’s reputation or even to be more firmly ungrateful toward favors one does not wish to recognize” (Maxim no. 74). Rather than expressing spontaneous gratitude, public expressions of thanksgiving are a calculated expression of one’s desire to acquire social power or to elude the moral duty to recognize one’s actual debts. The pivot of salon culture, polite conversation, similarly turns on the self’s desire to remain the center of attention rather than on any concern to accommodate the needs of others. “Everyone is so busy with her interests and passions that she always wants to talk about them without entering into the interests and passions of those with whom she is speaking, although they have the same need to be heard and helped” (Maxim no. 29). Under the guise of charitable speech and action, high society’s conventions of politeness permit the individual to remain enclosed within selfish interests that refuse to recognize, let alone yield to, the more pressing claims of the neighbor.
Sablé’s moral critique of society is especially pronounced in her treatment of wealth. Genteel society’s surface claim to prize the acquisition of virtue is undercut by its emotional concentration on the vagaries of material fortune. It is social status, not moral status, that actually dominates human concern. “Good fortune almost always makes some change in the procedure, the tone, and the manner of conversation and action…if we esteemed virtue more than any other thing, then neither any favor nor any promotion would ever change the heart or the face of people” (Maxim no.32). Our emotional reaction to the slightest promotion or demotion in social status, contrasted with our emotional indifference to the commission of a vice, indicates that it is social power rather than perfection in virtue that constitutes our supreme good in the hierarchy of values. In particular, the acquisition of money focuses our desires. “It is quite a common fault never to be happy with one’s fortune and never unhappy with one’s soul” (Maxim no.67). Despite the insistence on the paramount value of religious and moral values in the political and educational rhetoric of the period, it is economic status that actually occupies pride of place. The hope of enhancement of that status and the fear of its erosion stubbornly poisons public virtuous action.
Despite the omnipresence of vice posing as virtue in the public arena, authentic virtue survives in the arena of interpersonal friendship. Sablé argues that in the experience of love, one acquires knowledge of the other’s moral motivation that cannot be doubted. It is here that altruism and self-sacrifice actually operate.
Unlike political exercises of altruism, love by its nature possesses an internal transparency that does not permit it to be mistaken for another disposition. “Love has a character so particular that one can neither hide it where it is nor pretend it exists where it is not” (Maxim no.80). Other virtues may be feigned if the agent has ulterior motives for dominating the other. In love, however, the external acts and the internal dispositions of the agent become one. “Love is to the soul of the one who loves what the soul is to the body of the one it animates” (Maxim no. 79).
Sablé insists that it is friendship rather than romance that constitutes the proper locus for the emergence of this virtuous love. Freed from passion, the mature experience of friendship permits one to appreciate the other moral virtues of one’s partner disclosed in the transparency of mutual love. “Friendship is a species of virtue which can only be founded upon the esteem of the person loved, that is, upon qualities of the soul, such as fidelity, generosity and discretion, and on good qualities of mind” (Of Friendship). This disclosure of the other person’s moral constitution through the experience of friendship requires a basic equality between the partners. “It is also necessary that friendship be reciprocal, because in friendship one cannot, as in romantic love, love without being loved” (On Friendship). Whereas romantic love can veil the moral motivations of the moral agent due to passion and the inequality of the partners, the sober, egalitarian relation of friendship permits a veridical disclosure of moral character through mutual respect and sacrifice.
Sablé’s praise of the virtue present in friendship contrasts sharply with the critique of love developed by her colleague La Rochefoucauld. In his own maxims, La Rochefoucald condemns friendship as only another outcropping of vicious self-centeredness. “What humanity has named friendship is only a business, a reciprocal arrangement of interests, only an exchange of services. At bottom, it is only a type of commerce where self-love is always designing to win something” (Maxim. No 83). For La Rochefoucauld, the egotism disguised as virtue permeates both the public and private spheres of human interaction. For Sablé, however, the empire of vice is more limited. In the intimate sphere of interpersonal love, authentic virtue can manifest itself and be properly interpreted by the beloved other. It is only in egalitarian friendship, however, that virtue can make such a rare and transparent manifestation, and not in the passion of romance nor in the hierarchy of marriage.
In critiquing the predominant vices of her society, Sablé devotes particular attention to the theater. Her most famous maxim is an extended paragraph-long meditation on the dangers of attendance at theatrical performances. Her condemnation of the theater is categorical. “All the great diversions are dangerous for the Christian life, but among all those which the world has invented, there is none greater to fear than the theater” (Maxim no. 80). This censure of the theater is typical of the moral rigorism of the Jansenist movement. Pierre Nicole, a close friend and correspondent of Sablé, presented the most sustained Jansenist brief against theatrical performances in his Traité de la Comédie (1667).
Sablé’s argument against attendance at theatrical performances differs sensibly from the standard arguments used by Christian moralists of the period. The moral argument against Christian involvement in the theater usually appeared for two reasons. First, many of the pieces played upon the stage of the period were licentious in nature. As such, they could only constitute occasions of sin, which the upright Christian should scrupulously avoid. Second, the theaters themselves were venues for moral licentiousness. Several Parisian theaters were notorious for the prostitution openly practiced in their corridors. Such moral considerations had led both the Catholic and Protestant churches to ban actors from the sacraments and to deny church burial to them.
For Sablé, however, it is not the licentiousness of the theater that constitutes its greatest moral danger. The actual moral danger lies in the attractiveness with which the theater can present counterfeits of reasonable love among the characters on the stage. Imitating the romantic plays they watch, audience members can easily develop sentiments of affection that have been ripped out of their proper place in the sober cultivation of friendship in actual life. “”It [the theater] is so natural and so delicate a representation of the passions that it makes them come alive and makes them arise in our hearts. This is especially true of love when one presents a chaste and honest love, because the more it seems innocent to innocent souls, the more are those souls susceptible to theater’s effects” (Maxim no. 81). The temptation of obvious vice in licentious plays can be easily combated, but the seduction of a more innocent, sentimental love in decent plays is more difficult to resist. By a mimetic effect, such romantic idylls encourage the audience to cultivate loving relationships rooted in sentiment for phantom partners rather than in virtuous sacrifice for actual partners. The one social venue where authentic virtue has the greatest place to emerge, egalitarian friendship, has been distorted by the theater into a realm of fantasy untethered from moral endeavor. The primness of the sentiments celebrated by decent theatrical pieces does not diminish the moral dangers fostered by such an illusion of love.
Echoing Montaigne, whom she had studied during her early career as a salonnière, Sablé often confesses skepticism concerning the claims of human knowledge. Authentic science ultimately affirms the incertitude of its own propositions and the depth of human ignorance. To this Renaissance vein of skepticism, Sablé adds her own distinctive emphases. Human error is not due to the generic infirmity of the human mind alone; it is often induced by the manipulations of power practiced in cultivated society. Faithful to her Jansenist creed, Sablé insists that religious and moral knowledge grounded upon divine self-revelation is exempt from the dangers of self-deception.
In several passages, Sablé develops her own version of Socratic ignorance. The truly wise person acknowledges his or her lack of knowledge. “The greatest wisdom of humanity is to know its folly” (Maxim no. 8). Authentic pursuit of knowledge permits the seeker to affirm the utter lack of certain knowledge that is the lot of the human mind. “The study of and search for truth only make us see, by experience, the ignorance that is naturally ours” (Maxim no. 38).
If error is endemic to human noetic experience, due to the finitude and the fallibility of the human intellect, then contemporary society has increased the risk of error by the emphasis it places upon external rhetorical devices. The polite conversation of the salon is exemplary of the ease with which an inquiring subject can be seduced into error by the power of a seductive rhetoric that masks insubstantial or fallacious truth-claims. “The exterior and the circumstances often elicit greater respect than the interior and the reality. A poor manner spoils everything, even justice and reason. The how is the most important of things. The appearance we give gilds, trims, and sweetens even the most troubling things” (Maxim no. 48). In a society that prizes external ornament, persuasive rhetoric can easily make the false credible; conversely, threadbare rhetoric can easily make the truth appear implausible. The development of knowledge is not a serene adjudication of the conflicting evidence concerning a controverted issue; it is embedded in a network of power where the most attractive, rather than the most truthful, proposition wins adherence.
In this universe of human incertitude and error, there is one exception. While one must suspend judgment as much as possible concerning claims to truth by other human beings, one must surrender one’s judgments to what God himself has revealed for one’s salvation. Only in the realm of salvific truth, revealed by an omniscient God, can the human person discover a truth perfectly safeguarded from error. “As nothing is weaker and less reasonable than to submit one’s judgment to that of someone else, rather than using one’s own, nothing is greater and more intelligent than to blindly submit one’s judgment to God, by believing on His word everything that He says” (Maxim no. 1). This affirmation of the necessity of blind submission to God’s self-revelation bears the imprint of Jansenist fideism. Skeptical of the philosophical arguments for God’s existence proposed by neo-scholastic theologians as preambles to the act of faith, many Jansenist theologians argued that authentic knowledge of God’s existence and attributes can only be found through attentive reception of the scriptural portrait of God revealed by God himself. For Sablé, it is this revealed truth alone that bears the stamp of infallibility and that stands exempt from her skeptical scrutiny of claims to knowledge.
The vagaries of the publication history of Madame de Sablé’s works indicate how easily the philosophical reflection developed by women in the early modern period can disappear. Frequently reprinted in the eighteenth century as part of anthologies, the maxims of Sablé were often ascribed to an anonymous author or to her two prestigious male colleagues, La Rochefoucauld and Pascal. Only in 1870 would Jouaust’s scholarly edition of the entirety of Sablé’s maxims correct the history of misattribution and properly restore the work to Sablé’s authorship. Victor Cousin, the preeminent French philosopher during the July Monarchy, championed a revival of interest in the marquise by the publication of his biography of Sablé (1859). This erudite work, based on archival research, featured the publication of previously unpublished Sablé writings, notably her treatise On Friendship and extracts from her correspondence. Cousin’s work, however, tends to dismiss the value of Sablé’s thought as it celebrates the personality of the paradigmatic salonnière. Cousin declined to publish the entirety of Sablé’s maxims on the grounds of their general mediocrity and their inferiority to the maxims produced by her protégé, La Rochefoucauld. A similar apologetic tone emerges in Jean Lafond’s commentary on the integral edition of Sablé’s maxims he presents in his popular edition of La Rochefoucauld’s Maximes et Réflexions diverses (1976). “If we present the maxims of Madame de Sablé here, it is not to suggest a comparison [with La Rochefoucauld] that would turn too often to the disadvantage of the marquise” (303).
The barbed remarks of Cousin and Lafond indicate a persistent problem in the interpretation of Sablé: the tendency to treat her as a La Rochefoucauld manqué. In this interpretation, Sablé’s piety, sentimental defense of love, and moderation in her critique of masked vice make her a pale version of the more radical critique of virtue and knowledge developed by La Rochefoucauld. This interpretation occults the originality of Sablé’s philosophical argument, however. It is disagreement, not timidity, that leads her to argue that mature friendship can be a locus for the exercise of authentic virtue and that La Rochefoucauld’s dismissal of all public virtues as hidden vices is wrong. Her claim that certain moral and religious knowledge can be obtained from divine self-revelation does not derive from a certain religious conventionality in the face of La Rochefoucauld’s skeptical dismissal of all claims to noetic certitude. Rather, it springs from her conviction, well honed through her Jansenist associations, that only such revelation-based propositions concerning God and the moral order can claim the unreserved assent of the noetic subject.
Only recently has Sablé emerged as a subject of philosophical, rather than literary, interest. Like other moralistes of early French modernity, the study of her works has been confined to literature rather than philosophy departments. But as with her fellow moralistes Montaigne and Pascal, the epigrammatic writings of Sablé treat issues of enduring philosophical interest. Her maxims develop concise arguments on the illusion of virtue, the nature of love, the sources of authentic religious knowledge, the relationship between power and knowledge, and the vices typical of a status-centered society. Her correspondence pursues philosophical questions central to a theology of grace in the company of preeminent philosophers of the period, such as Pascal and Arnauld. In her writings, the salon (the era’s central venue for the philosophical formation of women) becomes the subject of ethical analysis. It is the salon’s rituals of power, codes of politeness, and quest for scientific knowledge that provide the principal data for Madame de Sablé’s critique of the human pretension to virtue and to certitude.
All French to English translations above are by the author.
John J. Conley
Last updated: August 25, 2008 | Originally published: