George Santayana was an influential 20th century American thinker whose philosophy connected a rich diversity of historical perspectives, culminating in a unique and unrivaled form of materialism, one recommending a bold reconciliation of spirit and nature. Santayana was also a poet, and he wrote a work of fiction, The Last Puritan, that was a Book of the Month Club selection in 1936, the same year he adorned the cover of Time magazine. Though he spent his formative intellectual life in America and ultimately is best categorized philosophically in that tradition, Santayana spent the better part of his life and publishing career in Europe. He spent his early childhood in his birth-country of Spain and throughout his expansive travels and residencies never relinquished his native citizenship. Displaying in both composition and criticism a prodigious literary imagination, Santayana’s writings appealed to a wide audience, and he remains to this day one of the most quoted of twentieth century thinkers. Probably the most well-known sentence of Santayana’s is also one of the least accurately quoted: “Those who cannot remember the past are condemned to repeat it” (The Life of Reason: Reason in Common Sense. Scribner’s, 1905: 284). Scholarly interest in Santayana today remains modest but diverse. Santayana was a thinker of rare stature whose work deserves the highest compliment of all: it can and may well still be read millennia from now.
George Santayana was born on December 16, 1863 in Madrid, Spain. He lived his first eight years in Spain, his next forty years in Boston, and his last forty years in Europe. Accordingly, Santayana arranged his life in his autobiography, Persons and Places, in three parts: (1) “Background,” (2) “On Both Sides of the Atlantic,” and (3) “All on One Side.” The Background (1863-1886) encompassed his childhood in Ávila, Spain, through his undergraduate years at Harvard. The second period, during which Santayana traveled between the U.S. and Europe, covered his Harvard years (1886-1912), both as graduate student (Ph.D. 1889) and professor. The third period (1912-1952) was that of the retired professor writing and traveling in Europe, and eventually adopting Rome as his center of activity.
Santayana’s birth name was Jorge Agustín Nicolás Ruiz de Santayana. At the time of his birth Santayana’s father, Agustín Ruiz de Santayana, had only in the last few years met and married Josefina Borrás Sturgis, the recent widow of a Boston merchant named George Sturgis. While Agustín and Josefina united long enough to marry and produce young Jorge (the only child of their union), the two would ultimately part ways. Receiving financial support from her brother-in-law Robert (George Sturgis died leaving her little), Josefina decided to move herself and her surviving Sturgis children to Boston while for eight years young George and his father remained in Ávila. In 1872, father and son made the twelve-day sea voyage to Boston where Agustín briefly attempted to settle in with his wife and her Sturgis children, and, failing to do so, left young George with them to return to Spain in the spring of 1873. This early uprooting and estrangement from his father surely had a deep emotional impact on Santayana, and indeed in his autobiography he characterizes the move as a “moral disinheritance.”
Santayana had a rich early education, spending eight years at the Boston Latin School. He revealingly reflects on those early years (the fall of 1874 through 1882), in his autobiography: “…I know I was solitary and unhappy, out of humor with everything that surrounded me, and attached only to a persistent dream-life, fed on books of fiction, on architecture and on religion.” Besides Latin, students of the Boston Latin School studied Greek, Mathematics, History, French, English Composition, Literature, and Rhetoric. Through this exposure Santayana managed to develop a life-long appreciation for classical and medieval worlds and their cultural contributions, to a great extent preferring them to modern offerings. These appreciations would contribute a breadth of historical perspective to Santayana’s mature philosophical works that is unrivaled by his American contemporaries.
In his early education Santayana nurtured a love of poetry and even entertained seriously the possibility of becoming an architect. Entering Harvard upon graduation from the Latin School in 1882, Santayana respectively took his undergraduate and graduate degrees (B.A., ’86, Ph.D. ‘89), benefiting incalculably from the philosophical mentorship of his teachers, amongst whom were two of the most famous “golden age” Harvard philosophers: William James and Josiah Royce. Upon successful completion of his doctorate, Santayana, by now fully committed to the discipline, began teaching philosophy at Harvard in the fall of 1889. He would remain there until his departure at the zenith of academic success. In 1912 Santayana took advantage of a modest inheritance from the death of his mother to retire from Harvard, and left for Europe indefinitely.
As to his time in America, though he does offer the occasional fond or sympathetic reflection, Santayana largely hated academic life and commercialism and the dead Puritanism that he identified in his novel The Last Puritan. Probably referring obliquely to his own eventual feelings of exile in America, Santayana wrote: “It is natural for a man to like to live at home, and to live long elsewhere without a sense of exile is not good for his moral integrity” (Winds of Doctrine, Charles Scribner’s Sons, 1913, pg. 6).
He left the U.S. to live an intellectually free life in Oxford, Paris, and, after 1925, Rome. Unsuccessful in his efforts to leave Rome before World War II, on October 14, 1941 he entered the Clinica della Piccola Compagna di Maria, or “Convent of the Blue Nuns,” a hospital-clinic where he lived until his death in September of 1952. He is buried in the only Spanish plot in Rome’s Campo Verano Cemetery.
Next to Ralph Waldo Emerson, Santayana is arguably one of the best writers in the Classical American tradition. Most philosophers tend to read Santayana as a literary figure (which he is) rather than a serious philosopher (which he is also), part of which has to do with the fact that his publications strike in both directions simultaneously: an oddity from the perspective of a public that tends to quarantine the two areas of interest.
His philosophical works reflect two distinct periods, the early “humanistic” period in which he composed The Sense of Beauty (1896), Interpretations of Poetry and Religion (1900), and the five-volume The Life of Reason (1905-6); and the later “ontological” period which yielded Scepticism and Animal Faith (1923), and the four-volume ontology titled Realms of Being (between 1927 and 1940).
Santayana sometimes repudiated his earlier work, in part for its having the taint of academic life. He especially spoke down at times about the Life of Reason series for its association with the progressivism of the day, and it was later edited by Santayana and his late-life personal assistant and secretary, Daniel Cory, with the intent of removing some of its more humanistic overtones.
These authorial disparagements notwithstanding, The Life of Reason series holds up as one of the greatest philosophical works of the early half of the twentieth century. His peer and adversarial contemporary John Dewey praised the series in a review of 1907 as “the most adequate contribution America has yet made—always excepting Emerson—to moral philosophy” (John Dewey, in John Dewey: The Middle Works, Volume 4 [1907-1909], edited by Jo Ann Boydston, Southern Illinois University Press, 1977: 241). The series would have a lasting influence on naturalistic philosophy in the twentieth century.
In his budding writing career Santayana also published a volume of poetry (an 1894 collection titled Sonnets and Other Verses). Nevertheless his poetic muse would fade with the passing of years. Despite in his early years attracting a near-cult following of Harvard poets, and later maintaining the same mentorship through their Rome pilgrimages, letters, and solicitations of feedback, Santayana’s literary exertions would be restricted to fiction and philosophy.
Early in his career at Harvard, Santayana would feel the pressure to produce a work of philosophy. The Sense of Beauty (1896)—an exercise in aesthetic formalism—was culled from a series of lectures he gave between 1892 and 1893 as a newly appointed Harvard professor. The book contains the famous definition of beauty as “pleasure regarded as a quality of the thing.” To this day The Sense of Beauty is arguably the most widely read of Santayana’s philosophical corpus. This is most likely due to its restrictive scope in comparison to his other philosophical works, while there has been the tendency for Santayana’s more ambitious philosophy to be neglected. This neglect probably will subside with the ongoing MIT Press Critical Edition publications of The Works of Santayana, edited by William G. Holzberger and Herman J. Saatkamp, Jr.
After The Sense of Beauty, Santayana published Interpretations of Poetry and Religion in 1900, a work which famously provoked William James—Santayana’s then-recent colleague—to characterize his philosophy as a “perfection of rottenness.” The book also provoked a key recognition from the other of Santayana’s early influential mentors, and also dissertation advisor, Josiah Royce. Santayana relates that Royce told him around the time of Interpretations that “the gist of [his] philosophy [is] the separation of essence from existence” (“Apologia Pro Mente Sua” in The Library of Living Philosophers: The Philosophy of George Santayana, edited by Paul Arthur Schilpp, New York: Tudor Publishing, pg. 497). The ontological categories of “essence” and “matter” would become key components of Santayana’s mature philosophy. (See section 3c.)
Besides being a poet, philosopher, and novelist, Santayana was a hugely influential cultural critic. In a trenchant 1911 address before the Philosophical Union in California he coined the term “genteel tradition” and memorably provided the characterization of America as an “old wine in new bottles.” He wrote many similarly speculatively rich essays diagnosing the cultural character of the America of his time, some of which included penetrating philosophical criticisms of his contemporaries and former teachers, James and Royce. These diagnoses were early collected in the volume Character and Opinion in the United States (1920).
None of Santayana’s writings stray entirely from philosophical considerations, including his only fictional novel. Santayana authored a single best-selling work of fiction titled The Last Puritan, published in 1936. He spent several of his post-Harvard years composing the book, and many of the main characters reflect personalities close to the author. The main theme of the novel (co-titled: “Memoir in the Form of a Novel”) is of interest for its enhancing one’s understanding of Santayana’s view towards America. It chronicles the tragic, sacrificial life of Oliver Alden, the title-subject, a romantic and pious youth whose inner religious sensibilities conflict with the pulsating natural life around him. Alden is from one standpoint a sympathetic character, one with whom the author himself admitted affinities. But from another standpoint the protagonist represented the tragic contemporary American as Santayana understood him—partly in reaction to troubled young poets and artists Santayana knew from his Harvard days.
Santayana’s broader cultural criticism can be found in such works as Winds of Doctrine (1913) and the beautiful and unforced Soliloquies in England (1922), remarkably written amidst the uncertain, violent times of World War I. The latter is an exemplary instance—of which two others include Dialogues in Limbo (1926) and Platonism and the Spiritual Life (1927)—where one finds the post-Harvard Santayana following inspirations as they come, allowing both his literary imagination and penetrating philosophical eye to take equal share in the interpretive task.
These shorter works undoubtedly provided opportunities of creative release for Santayana as the ambitious project of conceiving a system of philosophy began to assert itself. In 1923 Scepticism and Animal Faith (hereafter SAF), the introductory text to his four-volume system of philosophy was published. SAF is one of the few Santayana works to have remained in print up to the present. The book introduces the terminology and critical background of his mature ontology, itself unfolded in four volumes over the period of thirteen years.
Despite minor shifts in emphasis and Santayana’s own attitude towards his work, there is no radical break between the early humanistic Santayana, and the mature, ontological one. The same persistent distinction between ideals and natural grounds for those ideals—which he calls in his mature ontology “essence” and “matter”—holds throughout all of Santayana’s works; and the same abiding concern for reconciling moral with natural life remains intact.
As Royce had prophesied, an ontological distinction persisted throughout Santayana’s works: between “essence,” or the infinite realm of character embodiments that any existing thing must take on in order to be experienced by humans, and “existence,” or the groundless causal flux of nature that underlies any form whatsoever.
In the Life of Reason Santayana emphasizes the distinction between “perfections” or “ideals” and their “natural roots” which he sometimes calls a “natural ground” or “basis” for all action, thought and experience: “Every genuine ideal has a natural basis…Ideals are legitimate, and each initially envisages a genuine and innocent good; but they are not realizable together, nor even singly when they have no deep roots in the world.” Such ideals then are not Platonic forms, in that they have “roots” and bear the marks of their natural origins. Plato’s forms, on the contrary, are conceived as entirely foreign to natural origins.
But Santayana’s terminological shift from talking of ideals and natural grounds to talking of essence and matter perhaps did come at a certain cost. Throughout the evolution of his thinking Santayana holds to an increasing, and to many interpreters troubling, epiphenomenal view of consciousness. Briefly, epiphenomenalism is the view that mind is derivative, wholly caused, and has itself no causal power. Such strong epiphenomenalism comes out in the following passage from RB: “…the realm of matter cannot admit mind into its progressive structure and movement; each trope or rhythm must be complete before sensation can arise; so that this sensation is intrinsically a result and not a cause, a comment and not an agent…” If mind and sensation appear on the scene only as after-effects, one has to wonder how human experience can be considered fulfilling—how more specifically it can be anything but an ineffectual, spectator process.
There is however more than this to Santayana’s view of mind and accompanying story of human experience. To see this one needs a further understanding of the definitive concepts of his mature philosophy.
The four realms of being Santayana identifies, in the order in which he published each RB volume, are essence, matter, truth, and spirit. The realms are said by Santayana to be “qualities of reality” (RB 183) (not themselves to be confused as parts of the cosmos), that are worth distinguishing to render human experience more fulfilling, intelligent, and edifying.
Santayana holds that the realms are irreducibly different and are for that reason worth distinguishing. The possibility that there are more realms is not something he dismisses; his only condition for an additional realm is that it be irreducibly distinct from the four he distinguishes.
As indicated, before introducing the realms individually Santayana set up their presentation through a penetrating and synthetic critical introduction, published in 1923 as Scepticism and Animal Faith. Understanding the project of SAF requires acquaintance with the meaning of key original concepts, amongst which are: “intuition,” “intent,” “psyche,” “animal faith,” and “skepticism.”
All belief, Santayana writes, is “a form of some faith in animal, material existence.” What Santayana calls “animal faith,” is the instinctive (if you will) and unavoidable tendency for human actions to betray a deep belief in the existence of matter. On Santayana’s account, one cannot act without believing in matter. According to Santayana, the denial in speech or dialectical skepticism of the existence of matter is a solipsistic, momentary pose. So philosophers like Descartes and Berkeley are transcendental posers, inflexibly denying in theory what they unhesitatingly affirm in practice. Worse yet, however: these Modern’s conflate functional orientations of the mind which Santayana respectively distinguishes as “intuition” and “intent.”
“Intuition” is for Santayana the contemplation or consciousness of an essence (more on these shortly) apart from belief in any particular existence. Santayana contrasts “intent” from intuition in order to capture the process of “taking” essences as existences. When we interact with, manipulate, engage, or otherwise encounter what we experience as physical objects, we are imbuing essences with intent—giving them a material existence they can never literally have. This process of intent is governed by the preferential makeup of what Santayana terms “psyche.”
The psyche is the material set of preferences that define individuality in organisms. The psyche is, very simply, the material manifestation of mind and as such it is imbued with, defined by, and stricken with belief. When one is believing, one is acting on behalf of one’s psyche. When one is intuiting essences without the addition of belief in their existence—be it a revery, daydream, or performative trance as in a locked moment of harmonious activity—one is communing spiritually with the realm of essence.
This raises the issue of skepticism: if we only ever have a symbolic grasp of material reality, and we can at any point imaginatively “escape” such symbolic play, what’s to keep us from relapsing into Cartesian (re)pose? The first ten chapters of SAF are an exercise in engaging Cartesianism, with the goal of pushing skepticism to its “ultimate” limits.
As a skeptic Descartes was half-hearted according to Santayana (as regards naturalism he also accused his contemporary John Dewey of this), in that he thought skepticism ceased with awareness of the self. For Santayana, nothing overcomes skepticism except pure intuition, the irony of which is the fact that pure intuition issues in the “discovery of essence,” which is itself a bankruptcy of knowledge (see “essence” below). So where Descartes had sought the most indubitable knowledge, and proceeded on the principle that such a thing could be achieved, Santayana tries to show in SAF that the principle of indubitable knowledge is itself a paradox; when knowledge is tested by way of a radical skepticism, and certainty is the ultimate goal, the paradox is that certainty is achieved only at the cost of knowledge itself. “Certainty,” for Santayana, is thus a transcendent vision of essence and as such has nothing to do with knowledge, much less with science.
So the goal of SAF is to bankrupt Cartesianism, and in doing so to suggest a new starting point for philosophy. That starting point is animal faith, the tacit acceptance of material reality as the source of understanding, knowledge, and common sense. Hence the title: “Skepticism AND Animal Faith”: we need skepticism to intellectually clear the way for, and at the same time to lead us back to, natural intelligence—to the realms themselves!
Essence: The realm of essence should be understood to have a certain primacy since it is infinite and pertains to all of the forms or definite character embodiments that material objects and events may take on. Essence is what Santayana defines as the most radical sense in which anything is or has a character. Nothing—be it material objects, objects of thought, imaginings, flights of fancy, or objects of logical deduction—is experienced except through the mediation, or more accurately, “im-mediation” of essences. In his inimitable way, Santayana says of essences that they are “the only things people ever see and the last they notice.” Essences are said by Santayana to designate the realm of internal or intrinsic relations, and awareness of essences indicates a departure from what is called “knowledge,” which he defines as “faith mediated by symbols.” Awareness of essence is just that: awareness; it is direct and unmediated and as such entails no faith (belief in realities not given).
Matter: The catch however is that Santayana is a thoroughgoing materialist, in that he holds that no form can appear to human intuition without the previous establishment of material conditions for that form to arise. Matter is the primordial existential flux and is an unintelligible “surd.” This does not mean, however, that matter cannot be “known,” at least provisionally. Like Spinoza’s substance, existence or matter for Santayana has no purpose, but imposes external, natural limits to all activity. Those external limits define human life and mark off the boundaries between human understanding and the unfathomable depths of material existence. Santayana holds that humans know matter only at a remove, that is, (to repeat) symbolically. Matter is in fact referred to by Santayana as a “metaphor” only, producing one of the more provocative aspects of his philosophy: science is no less literary than poetry in representing matter in that it must express its truths at a remove, through the lens of human bias. In this sense Santayana’s materialism is, to use a contemporary term, “non-reductive.” Whatever scientists keep telling us of matter, while it is the hallmark of wisdom to defer everyday understanding to these experts (their findings do after all indicate a provisional advance upon previous understanding and serve contemporary sympathies very well), it is for Santayana only spiritual nearsightedness to deem such knowledge exhaustive of the cosmos.
Truth: As a fourth realm of being, truth wasn’t conceived by Santayana until after the first three (essence, matter and spirit) had been distinguished, and may therefore be justly supposed to have been introduced somewhat ad hoc. Whatever the reason, by 1913 (10 years before the publication of SAF) Santayana had conceived truth to round out his fourfold ontology. Truth is alleged by Santayana to be a subset of the infinite realm of essence. The realm of truth is the total inventory of essences instantiated by matter. The master metaphor for truth is given by Santayana in RB as: “Truth is the furrow which matter must plow upon the face of essence.” All events that take place entail concatenations of essences elected by matter for appearance in the course of human life, and their objective relations—factual arrangement, for example, that the terrorist attacks in America in 2001 took place on September 11th rather than the 12th—introduce the possibility of truth for human understanding.
Though there are similarities, Santayana’s view of truth differs in important respects from that of Classical pragmatists: truth for Santayana is fully objective and not necessarily presupposing of a cognizing agent; it is the necessary condition for the possibility of true opinions (Santayana appeals to the self-conscious act of lying as evidence of this fact); judgments are true if and only if they faithfully reproduce a portion of the descriptive properties of the process of the world coming, becoming, and going away into existence. These features of truth are guaranteed by the eternal status of the terms of its acknowledgement: essences.
Thus the pragmatist account of truth as what “works,” in the sense of what fits the current standard comprehensive description of the world is acceptable to Santayana so long as there is an understanding that the terms that make truth possible, namely, essences, are eternal, everlasting possibilities of experience that are not reducible to that experience. This is where Santayana especially departs from the pragmatist account of truth: it is not reducible to experience.
Spirit: Finally, Santayana distinguishes the realm of spirit, which is neither more nor less mysterious than one’s everyday understanding of consciousness. Santayana defines consciousness as the “total inner difference between being asleep and awake.” John Lachs has characterized Santayana’s spirit as that part of a life constituted by its series of intuitions. The native affinity of mind is, according to Santayana, to essence and not to fact. (This is an important outcome of his engagement with and overcoming of Cartesianism.) As such consciousness may play with appearances apart from the believing intent of the organic manifestation of mind (psyche); to the extent that it does so play, the spiritual life has been lived. Spirit is the ability of mind to turn natural events and experiences into appearances of themselves, and in so doing allow a healthy cosmic repose even as nature moves ceaselessly, beautifully, and sometimes destructively along.
In this way the core contribution of Santayana’s philosophy can be seen to culminate in a reconciliation of spirit and nature, two realities very much at odds in contemporary life. Santayana’s status as something of an “acquired taste” philosopher may plausibly be argued to be a function of his uncommon ability to uphold two sincere sympathies: on the one hand with Platonism and the spiritual life, and on the other with the life of reason which includes an openness to the advantages of three phases of moral life he called in that same-titled volume “pre-rational morality,” “rational ethics,” and “post-rational morality.”
As should not be surprising from what has been presented, Santayana consistently praises select philosophers and philosophies from history for what he considers their “naturalistic piety.” From the Ancient world, Santayana was deeply impressed with Lucretius, and also what he gleaned from Eastern Indian philosophy. Of the Modern philosophers, Santayana reserves his highest praise for Spinoza.
Backed by these historical allies, Santayana provides in a soliloquy a memorable (if partly irreverent) arrangement of world-philosophies:
…the progress of philosophy has not been of such a sort that the latest philosophers are the best: it is quite the other way…the later we come down in the history of philosophy the less important philosophy becomes, and the less true in fundamental matters.
Suppose I arrange the works of the essential philosophers—leaving out secondary and transitional systems—in a bookcase of four shelves; on the top shelf (out of reach since I can’t read the language) I will place the Indians; on the next the Greek naturalists; and to remedy the unfortunate paucity of their remains, I will add here those free inquirers of the renaissance, leading to Spinoza, who after two thousand years picked up the thread of scientific speculation; and besides, all modern science: so that this shelf will run over into a whole library of what is not ordinarily called philosophy. On the third shelf I will put Platonism, including Aristotle, the Fathers, the Scholastics, and all honestly Christian theology; and on the last, modern or subjective philosophy in its entirety. I will leave lying on the table, as of doubtful destination, the works of my contemporaries. There is much life in some of them. I like their water-colour sketches of self-consciousness, their rebellious egotisms, their fervid reforms of phraseology, their peep-holes through which some very small part of things may be seen very clearly: they have lively wits, but they seem to me like children playing blind-man’s-buff; they are keenly excited at not knowing where they are. (“The Progress of Philosophy,” in Soliloquies in England and Later Soliloquies, Charles Scribner’s Sons, 1922: 208-210)
Santayana recommends placing on the bottom, “inferior” shelves all the philosophy that is published, reprinted, and discussed in universities across the Western world today. This recommendation motivated one critic to characterize Santayana as a “defiant eclectic” (Charles Hartshorne, “Santayana’s Defiant Eclecticism” in The Journal of Philosophy, Vol. LXI. No. 1, 1964: 35-44), suggesting that his thinking amounts to a high-minded circumvention of the real problems of philosophy through the sublimation of a few eccentric doctrines. This point is still an issue among Santayana scholars. What is clear is that Santayana combined an indisputably rich reading of the history of philosophy with an unparalleled synoptic critical vision.
Santayana’s philosophy has had a modest, unsettled legacy, one which nevertheless surprises in its continuing ability to attract sensibilities from across academic disciplines. While his thinking never has, and likely never will be, given to indoctrination or discipleship, it is clear that Santayana never conceived of these as important and justifiably suspected that such things were bad rather than good indications that a philosophy is worthy of the world it struggles to understand.
Still, a glowing campfire of devotion to Santayana’s work persists, first through the institutional support of the MIT Press and the staff of the Santayana Edition at Indiana University-Purdue University Indianapolis (IUPUI); and second from the scholarly contributions made to the only Santayana journal, Overheard in Seville: Bulletin of the Santayana Society. The Bulletin is published annually and is edited by Angus Kerr-Lawson. The Santayana Society meets annually in December at the Eastern gathering of the American Philosophical Association and has recently been added to the proceedings of the annual meetings of the Society for the Advancement of American Philosophy. MIT Press is in the process of publishing a critical edition of The Works of George Santayana, several of which are currently released.
The future of Santayana studies, whatever their course, will depend upon genuine interest in a non-reductive philosophical naturalism that expresses deep respect to religious sensibilities and leads the charge for the return to a conception of philosophy as a way of life rather than as a critical profession with little relevance to inner experience.
All works by George Santayana are undergoing republication as critical editions through MIT Press, under the editorship of William G. Holzberger and Herman J. Saatkamp, Jr., and the editorial work of those affiliated with the Santayana Edition at Indiana University-Purdue University Indianapolis.
Matthew Caleb Flamm
U. S. A.
Last updated: July 4, 2006 | Originally published: