Śāntideva (literally “god of peace”) was the name given to an Indian Mahāyāna Buddhist philosopher-monk, known as the author of two texts, the Bodhicaryāvatāra and the Śikṣāsamuccaya. These works both express the ideal of the bodhisattva — the ideal person of Mahāyāna Buddhism. The term Mahāyāna, literally “Great Vehicle,” came into use to mean the idea of attempting to become a bodhisattva (and eventually a buddha) oneself, rather than merely following the teachings set out by Siddhārtha Gautama (considered the original Buddha). This was the earliest usage of the term mahāyāna in Sanskrit, although even by Śāntideva’s time, understandings of what becoming a bodhisattva involved had undergone many changes; the Mahāyāna had come to be understood as a separate school rather than as a vocation (see Nattier 2003; Harrison 1987).
Both of Śāntideva’s texts explore the bodhisattva ideal as an ethical one, in that they prescribe how a person should properly live, and provide reasons for living in that way. Śāntideva’s close attention to ethics makes him relatively unusual among Indian philosophers, for whom metaphysics (or theoretical philosophy more generally) was more typically the primary concern. Śāntideva’s ethical thought is widely known, cited and loved among Tibetan Buddhists, and is increasingly coming to the attention of Western thinkers. Śāntideva’s metaphysics is of interest primarily because of its close connection to his ethics.
The name “Śāntideva” is associated above all with two extant texts: the Bodhicaryāvatāra (hereafter BCA) and the Śikṣāsamuccaya (hereafter ŚS). The Bodhicaryāvatāra (often rendered “Guide to the Bodhisattva’s Way of Life”), in its most widely known form, is a work of just over 900 verses. Tibetan legends suggest that the text was originally recited orally (see de Jong 1975), as do the text’s own literary features. Although it has been translated into Tibetan multiple times and is revered throughout Tibetan Buddhist tradition, it was originally composed and redacted in Sanskrit. Its Sanskrit is relatively close to Pānini’s official standards of grammar, with a Buddhist vocabulary. Its ten chapters lead their reader through the path to becoming a bodhisattva — which is to say a future Buddha, and therefore a being on the way to perfection, according to Mahāyāna tradition.
The Śikṣāsamuccaya (“Training Anthology”) is a longer prose work in nineteen chapters. The ŚS is organized as a commentary on twenty-seven short mnemonic verses known as the Śikṣāsamuccaya Kārikā (hereafter ŚSK). It consists primarily of quotations (of varying length) from sūtras, authoritative texts considered to be the word of the Buddha — generally those sūtras associated with Mahāyāna tradition. Most scholars have taken the ŚS to be composed almost entirely of such quotations. However, Paul Harrison (2007) has recently claimed that a substantial portion of it is original to the redactor.
Like the BCA, the ŚS was originally composed in Sanskrit, as were the sūtras it quotes. However, while Śāntideva’s own portions are in relatively standard Sanskrit, the quotations are mostly in the heavily vernacularized language usually known as Buddhist Hybrid Sanskrit. It is considerably less accessible to a novice reader than the BCA, and its organization can be bewildering. Richard Mahoney (2002) has recently provided a clear account of the text’s structure, which will be discussed later in this article.
Who were these texts written for? One can infer from the texts that they are intended for an audience of men whose sexual desires are directed toward women, as the auditor’s sexual cravings are always discussed in those terms. Therefore, the use of masculine forms to refer to the implied audience is unproblematic. This auditor also understands Sanskrit, and lives in or after the seventh century CE. His knowledge of Sanskrit implies, at the least, that he is well educated, and therefore well versed in the ideas of classical Sanskritic culture. And he is not necessarily on the bodhisattva path when he begins reading or hearing the texts, but is motivated to enter that path by studying them.
The texts’ implied audience includes monks, and may also include householders (nonmonks). While monks are a significant component of the text’s implied audience (Onishi 2003), and are in some respects the ideal audience, they are not necessarily the only such audience. The principles of conduct put forth in the BCA’s fifth chapter resemble those of vinaya monastic codes, and indeed some of them have been taken directly from the prātimokṣa monastic rule books (Crosby and Skilton 1995, 32), but few of them would be impossible or absurd for a householder to follow. In the ŚS, too, Śāntideva certainly considers monasticism better and more praiseworthy than the householder life, but part of his task is to convince householding readers to pursue the monastic life. He claims that “in every birth the great bodhisattva goes forth [as a monk] . . . from the household life” (ŚS 14). But this is a process renewed in every lifetime, beginning with the household life; and Śāntideva does refer on multiple occasions to householding bodhisattvas (for example at ŚS 120 and 267). This text, then, is addressed in part to householders.
Tibetan hagiographic histories (Bu ston, Tāranātha, Ye shes dPal ‘byor and Sum pa mKhan po) provide the most detailed accounts of Śāntideva’s life, although most contemporary historians doubt their veracity. In brief, they tell of a prince from Saurāstra (in contemporary Gujarat) who joined the great monastic university of Nālandā. His fellow monks, unaware of his wisdom, saw only a lazy man unworthy of their company. To prove his presumed lack of knowledge, they asked him to recite a Buddhist sūtra text. Śāntideva, undaunted, asked whether they would like to hear something old or something new. Asked for something new, he proceeded to recite the BCA. When he reached verse IX.34 — “When neither an entity nor a nonentity remain before thought, then thought, with no object, is pacified because it has no other destination” — he rose into the air and his body disappeared. The remainder of the text was recited by a disembodied voice. The written text of the ŚS, the voice told the audience, could be found in Śāntideva’s room, along with a text called the Sūtrasamuccaya (Pezzali 1968, 4-20). There is some debate among scholars as to the nature of the latter work, but all agree that the title does not refer to any additional surviving work of Śāntideva’s, and that the BCA and ŚS constitute his extant corpus (see Lele 2007, 17n8).
Beyond the hagiographies, most of what we know of Śāntideva comes from the ideas found in extant recensions of his texts. This article treats Śāntideva’s works together, as the works of a single author, as Indian and Tibetan Buddhist tradition has always done; similarly, it refers to the ideas found in the canonical Sanskrit recensions of the texts, not to the Tibetan or to the BCA recension found at Dunhuang. Since the article’s approach is to examine the ideas of this author, Śāntideva, it spends relatively little time on the structure of each of his two texts as separate units. For an overview of the relevant textual issues and a defense of this article’s approach to the texts, see Lele 2007, 9-31. More specifically, for a discussion of the Dunhuang recension, see Saito 1993. For discussions of the structure of the BCA, see Crosby and Skilton 1995; Saito 1993. For discussions of the structure of the ŚS, see Clayton 2006; Griffiths 1999, 133-43; Hedinger 1984; Mahoney 2002; Mrozik 2007. On both, see Pezzali 1968.
It is difficult to learn much about the texts’ historical composer, or their redactor, beyond what is found in the texts themselves. As noted, Tibetan historians recount the life story of a Śāntideva identified as the texts’ author, but it is difficult to sort fact from legend with so little corroborating evidence. There seems little reason to doubt that someone by the name of Śāntideva wrote some portion of the two texts, or that he was a monk at Nālandā. (The Tibetan historians agree on this last point, and based on what we know of Indian Buddhist history it seems a likely place for historically significant Buddhist works to have been composed.) Paul Griffiths (1999, 114-24) uses the accounts of Chinese and Tibetan visitors to reconstruct a detailed account of what life and literary culture at Nālandā might have looked like.
Beyond these points, we can say relatively little beyond the approximate date of the texts’ composition. The Tibetan translator Ye shes sde, who rendered the BCA into Tibetan, worked under the king Khri lde srong brtsan (816-838 CE), so it must have been composed before that time (Bendall 1970, v). Since the Chinese pilgrim Yijing (or I-tsing) mentions all the major Indian Mahāyāna thinkers known in India but does not mention Śāntideva, it is likely that these texts were composed, or at least became famous, after Yijing left India in 685 CE (Pezzali 1968, 38). We may therefore assign Śāntideva an approximate date of sometime in the eighth century.
As historical evidence on India is difficult to come by, it is relatively difficult to ascertain Śāntideva’s influence in the later Indian Buddhist philosophical tradition. Nevertheless, a significant number of later Indian texts do refer to the BCA and ŚS (Bendall 1970, viii-x), so Śāntideva’s work must have been relatively important there.
It is far easier to speak of Śāntideva’s influence in Tibet. Tibetan Buddhists revere Śāntideva and his work, especially the BCA. All the major Tibetan texts on the stages of the bodhisattva path, such as those of Tsong kha pa and sGam po pa, quote it at length (Sweet 1977, 4-5); it is a key source for the entire Tibetan literary genre of blo sbyong or lojong (“mental purification”) (Sweet 1996, 245). The present Dalai Lama cites it as the highest inspiration for his ideals and practices (Williams 1995, ix). Tibetan commentators have written many commentaries on the text over the years, several of which are now available in English translation (e.g. Gyatso 1986; Rinpoche 2002; Tobden 2005). While the ŚS was less influential overall, the tradition has not ignored it. In 1998 the present Dalai Lama gave public teachings on the ŚS, referring to it as a “key which can unlock all the teachings of the Buddha” (quoted in Clayton 2006, 2). Śāntideva’s work has played a significant role in other cultures influenced by Tibetan Buddhism, such as Mongolia (see, for example, de Rachewiltz 1996; Kanaoka 1963). A less influential translation of the BCA was also made into Chinese (Bendall 1970, xxix-xxx).
The BCA has also been widely translated, studied, and admired in the West. (See Onishi 2003 for a thesis-length discussion of the text’s Western reception.) Luís Gómez (1999, 262-3) even suggests that it is now the third most frequently translated text in all of Indian Buddhism, after the Dhammapāda and the Heart Sūtra. A recent introductory text (Cooper 1998) also treats the BCA as one of “the classic readings” in ethics, alongside such works as Plato’s Gorgias and Mill’s Utilitarianism. The BCA is an appropriate choice for a reading in Buddhist ethics, for relatively few Buddhist texts make explicit ethical arguments. This situation even leads one scholar (Keown 2005, 50) to proclaim that Buddhism “does not have normative ethics,” though he does not appear to have taken Śāntideva’s work into account in making this claim (see Lele 2007, 48-52).
The central concern of both of Śāntideva’s texts is the bodhisattva, literally “awakening-being.” A bodhisattva is a being aiming to become a buddha (literally “awakened one”); the process of the final transformation into a buddha is called bodhi, “awakening,” sometimes referred to as “enlightenment.” The title Bodhicaryâvatāra, “introduction to conduct for awakening,” is usually taken to be short for Bodhisattvacaryâvatāra — “introduction to the conduct of a bodhisattva,” or “A Guide to the Bodhisattva Way of Life,” as one major translation (Wallace and Wallace 1997) has it. “Introduction to the conduct of a bodhisattva” is an appropriate description of the contents of the text, although “introduction to conduct for awakening” would be equally appropriate. Śāntideva also introduces the Śikṣāsamuccaya by claiming he will explain the sugatâtmajasamvārâvatāra, a similar phrase meaning “introduction to the requirements for the sons of the Sugatas” (ŚS 1). (Throughout Buddhist literature sugata, literally “gone well,” is a common term for buddhas, and Mahāyāna literature regularly refers to bodhisattvas as the buddhas’ sons.) The term “bodhisattva” occurs at least seven times in the nineteen chapters of the ŚS. This section examines the bodhisattva’s progress from being an ordinary person through to being a buddha, as this progress is discussed in Śāntideva’s texts.
To describe those who are neither bodhisattvas nor buddhas, Śāntideva most frequently uses the term “ordinary person,” prithagjana. He refers at one point to “all buddhas, bodhisattvas, solitary buddhas, noble searchers and ordinary people” (ŚS 9) — suggesting that ordinary people are the residual category of all those who do not fall into the previous categories. It is standard in Mahāyāna texts to refer to three “vehicles” (yāna) or paths, with the vehicles of the searcher (śrāvaka) and solitary buddha (pratyekabuddha) being distinguished from the Great Vehicle (mahāyāna) of the bodhisattva. It is quite rare, however, for Śāntideva to refer to searchers and solitary buddhas, and even buddhas appear relatively infrequently, so in practice the most important distinction in his texts is between bodhisattvas and ordinary people.
Śāntideva’s view of ordinary people is not flattering. The term “ordinary person” frequently occurs in his work alongside the term “fool” (bāla) — sometimes with the latter as a modifier (“foolish ordinary person,” bālaprithagjana, as at ŚS 61) and sometimes with the two terms used synonymously and interchangeably, as at ŚS 194. Ordinary people’s foolishness traps them in suffering; the way for them to escape from suffering is to enter the bodhisattva path and become a bodhisattva.
To become a bodhisattva, one must possess the awakening mind (bodhicitta). This mental transformation brings one out of the status of ordinary person and points one toward awakening. Śāntideva makes an important distinction between two kinds of the awakening mind: the mind resolved on awakening (bodhipraṇidhicitta) and the mind proceeding to awakening (bodhiprasthānacitta). The first, he tells us, can be reached quickly; it exists when the thought “I must become a buddha” arises as a vow (ŚS 8). He is not as explicit about the nature of the second, but in describing the first he notes that “the awakening mind is productive even without conduct” (ŚS 9), suggesting that conduct (caryā, bodhicaryā) may be what makes the difference between the mind resolved on awakening and the mind proceeding to awakening. (Brassard 2000 is a book-length study of the awakening mind and the BCA.)
It would appear, however, that possession of the mind resolved on awakening is sufficient to make its possessor into a bodhisattva. The BCA, recall, suggests that it is intended to be ritually recited. Its reader develops the awakening mind while reciting the third chapter sincerely — saying “Therefore I will produce the awakening mind for the welfare of the world” (BCA III.23). Two verses later, the reciter, apparently not having done anything else in the intervening time, declares: “Today I have been born into the family of the buddhas; now I am a child of the buddhas,” which is to say a bodhisattva(BCA III.25).
This is not, of course, the end of the story. Such a beginning bodhisattva has just started on the path; he has a long task ahead of him. Śāntideva does not spell out the different levels of attainment that a bodhisattva may reach, but he suggests that he agrees with the account of ten stages (bhūmi) of a bodhisattva’s achievement, as set out in the Daśabhūmika Sūtra and followed in Candrakīrti’s Madhyamakâvatāra (see Sprung 1979 for a partial translation of, and commentary on, this latter text). The ŚS quotes the Daśabhūmika six times. In this context, Śāntideva distinguishes between “one who has entered a stage” (bhūmipraviṣṭa) and a beginning (ādikarmika) bodhisattva (ŚS 11), suggesting that beginning bodhisattvas have not even entered the first of the ten stages.
Notice, however, that the BCA’s reciter does not become a bodhisattva, even a beginning one, until taking the vow in the third chapter. So Śāntideva’s audience, it would seem, is not limited to bodhisattvas — a point strengthened by the profuse praises of the awakening mind in the opening chapters of both texts. The reader who starts the text might not have generated the awakening mind, hence not have started trying to become a bodhisattva, and needs to be convinced of the importance of doing so.
The eighteenth chapter of the ŚS gives some account of the end of the path. It gives a fantastical description of the buddhas — their great beauty, virtue and power (ŚS 318-22). Shortly afterwards, it also describes the qualities of bodhisattvas in similar terms and at greater length. It is difficult to imagine how a reader who had just become a bodhisattva, taking the vow, could see himself as described by these qualities — spontaneously emitting perfumes and garlands and pearls from his body, for example (ŚS 327) — so this is likely the culmination of a long period of effort, in the last stages of which one becomes a fully realized bodhisattva. The distinctions between buddhas and fully realized bodhisattvas are not clearly spelled out; one suspects that being one of these advanced bodhisattvas is almost as good as being an actual buddha.
To interpret Śāntideva’s ethics in the BCA and ŚS, it is important to turn to the concept of excellence in means (upāyakauśalya). This common Mahāyāna concept is best known as a way of explaining the existence of other Buddhist traditions, as in texts like the Lotus Sūtra: the Buddha preached mainstream Buddhism as a clever way to reach people who were not ready to receive the superior teaching of the Mahāyāna. (See Pye 1978 for a book-length discussion.)
The term has a number of different senses in Buddhist tradition (see Harvey 2000, 134-40). Some Mahāyāna texts treat excellence in means as the seventh of ten perfections or virtues (pāramitā); Śāntideva does not do this, as he adheres to the conception that there are only six perfections (on which see below). For him, there are two senses in which the idea is important. The first is hermeneutical: different teachings are intended for people at different levels of ability, with the idea of ultimate truth at the very highest level (see BCA IX.2-8). For this reason the BCA is usually understood as a progressive text, leading its audience through progressively deeper levels of practice and understanding (e.g. see Crosby and Skilton 1995, 83-6). Śāntideva does not specifically use the term “excellence in means” to refer to this idea, although it is a common name for the idea in other Mahāyāna texts (Harvey 2000, 134). The second sense of the term is ethical; the idea most frequently comes up when he quotes the Upāyakauśalya Sūtra, a text which claims that bodhisattvas may break standard precepts or rules out of compassion. (The sūtra exists in Chinese and has been translated into English twice: Chang 1991, 427-68, and Tatz 1994.)
This second sense of excellence in means takes on considerable importance in contemporary discussions of Śāntideva’s ethics (e.g. Clayton 2006, 102-9) because it is under this rubric that Śāntideva comes closest to addressing the “hard cases” so beloved of contemporary moral philosophy, such as situations when one seems called on to kill in order to prevent a greater evil. While discussing excellence in means, he explains that behaviors normally forbidden, including sexual activity, can be permitted out of compassion. So too, it is to explain the importance of excellence in means that Śāntideva notes that one is permitted to kill someone about to commit a grave wrong. The idea is important to this article for similar reasons, in that it seems to be a key principle involved in what we might call Śāntideva’s casuistry — his examination of particular cases where different pieces of advice seem to collide.
For Śāntideva, a key component of excellence in means is that it is an excellence — a skill and a virtue which allows one to respond appropriately to difficult situations, if not a virtue on the official list of six perfections. There is no one formula or principle for action that Śāntideva sets out in advance (along the lines of “act to bring about the greatest happiness for the greatest number” or “act only according to that maxim you can also will to be a universal law”). As we will shortly see, there are definite elements of consequentialist reasoning in Śāntideva, but more often the bodhisattva is called on to exercise judgment, once his character is already well developed: When Śāntideva says that “even the forbidden is permitted,” it is specifically “for a compassionate one who has sight of the purpose” (BCA V.84); that is, it depends on the agent’s ability to exercise discretion in the name of compassion.
This level of discretion is evinced in the numerous places in Śāntideva’s work where difficult cases are considered. When he approves of the killing of someone about to commit a grave wrong, he says only that there is “permission” (anujñāna), not that it must be done. Similarly, in the case of alcoholics, alcohol may be given; Śāntideva uses the gerundive form deya (ŚS 271), and the gerundive in -ya does not have the imperative force of the gerundive in -tavya.
Śāntideva explicitly refers to consequences in the case of giving a weapon: one may do so after the “consideration of good or bad consequences” (ŚS 271). This is still a consideration or reflection rather than a maximizing or weighing; “consideration,” vicāra, is literally “moving around (in the mind).” A weighing of some sort comes across in introducing the possibility that one might have sex out of compassion: “even then, if one should see a greater benefit (artha) to beings, one may discard the training” (ŚS 167). Some sort of consequentialist maximizing appears to be at work here. Clayton (2006, 107) suggests that such concern for consequences means that these “examples of upāya become problematic from the perspective of a virtue ethic.” However, for Śāntideva, any true “benefit” to other beings will ultimately be an increase in their virtue. Goodman (2008) argues strongly for a consequentialist interpretation of Śāntideva’s ethics, but on the understanding that it is a “perfectionist consequentialism,” in which the consequences to be maximized consist of virtue in oneself and others.
The terms “good karma” and “bad karma,” respectively, translate the Sanskrit terms puṇya and pāpa. These terms appear very frequently in Śāntideva’s work — often as justifications for acting and feeling in a certain way. They refer to a kind of ethical causality: the process by which ethically good and bad actions (respectively) have positive and negative results. These results most characteristically, but not exclusively, include better and worse rebirths. The Sanskrit terms parallel the English usage of “good and bad karma,” thought of as the way in which one’s good or bad actions come back to affect one positively or negatively in the future. This usage corresponds exactly to the meaning of the Buddhist terms puṇya and pāpa, even though those terms do not themselves involve the Sanskrit word karma or karman (which simply means “action”). There is, at any rate, no disputing the close connection between Sanskrit karma, on the one hand, and puṇya and pāpa on the other; the latter are typically referred to in Sanskrit as karmaphala, the fruits of action.
The concepts of good and bad karma are central to Śāntideva’s thought. The ŚS is typically thought to be structured around the idea, presented inŚSK 4, that one should “protect, purify and enhance” one’s person, one’s possessions and one’s good karma, though one should also be prepared to give all of these things away (Bendall 1970, xi). ŚS 356 connects each of these verbs to good and bad karma: to “protect” something is to prevent new karmically bad mental states (dharmas) related to it; to “purify” it is to reduce the existing karmically bad states related to it; and to “enhance” it is to increase the karmically good states related to it. (Mahoney 2002, 32-9 identifies the significance of these verbs with respect to the traditional Buddhist samyakprahānas or “right strivings”.) In a certain sense, one might see the ŚS as being all about good and bad karma — a sense strengthened by the long discussions of bad karma in ŚS III, IV and VIII, and of the good karma deriving from worship in ŚS XVII. In the BCA, too, the final chapter — the highest and most important, if one adheres strictly to a progressive understanding of the text — deals with the redirection (pariṇāmanā) of good karma. Dayal (1970, 189-90) goes so far as to say that Śāntideva substituted karmic redirection for metaphysical insight as the ultimate goal of the bodhisattva path. Clayton (2006, 83) and Lele (2007, 96-7) argue that Dayal’s claim is overstated, but neither dispute that good and bad karma are vitally important to Śāntideva’s work. Clayton (2006, 67) identifies three terms closely related to good karma (kuśala, śīla and puṇya) as the most central ethical concepts in the ŚS, and even as “probably the most important ethical concepts in Indian Buddhism” more generally.
The redirection of good karma (often called “transference of merit”) is a central part of Śāntideva’s understanding of karma’s workings. He urges his readers to redirect any good karma that they acquire, so that it does not merely result in a worldly form of well-being, such as a more prosperous rebirth for oneself. This redirection can sometimes be to ensure that the good karma brings one closer to awakening instead of worldly rebirths (bodhipariṇāmanā, ŚS 158); see Kajiyama 1989 for a discussion of this first form, which is often neglected in studies of karmic redirection. More frequently, though, it means the giving up of one’s good karma to others (puṇyotsarga). This is a common idea in Buddhist texts. Buddhist stories often emphasize the supernatural nature of karmic redirection. Especially, they commonly claim or imply that ghosts (pretas or petas) are incapable of receiving physical gifts. If one wishes to give them something, it must be one’s good karma(Kajiyama 1989, 7-8).
In contemporary philosophical terms, Śāntideva’s idea of karma suggests, though not conclusively, an internal connection between virtue or ethical excellence and well-being. That is, he often uses these terms in a way that suggests that virtue is well-being in many significant senses. He does this by using puṇya in ways that make it equivalent both to virtue or excellence and to well-being or flourishing. Śāntideva uses the term for good karma (puṇya) interchangeably with the terms for good conduct (śīla) and excellence (kuśala) (see Lele 2007, 79-82)(Clayton 2006, 73). Even more frequently, however, he equates it with well-being or welfare, śubha, as Clayton (2006, 48-51) notes. This equivalence suggests a sense in which, on Śāntideva’s understanding, good karma not only produces well-being, but is well-being — constitutive of a good life, at least at the level of conventional truth. There does remain some ambiguity, however, in the sense that Śāntideva’s work also suggests that well-being is the product of the result or “ripening” (vipāka) of good karma.
This ambiguity may be compared to that in Greek conceptions of eudaimonia, which also means human welfare or flourishing, but includes a strong element of excellence (aretē) as well. To the extent that good karma is equated with excellence, Śāntideva’s thought resembles that of the Stoics, who thought that excellence alone constituted well-being. To the extent that good karma is equated with the results of excellent action, however, it looks more like Aristotle’s view, where “external goods,” outside the control of the agent’s excellence or lack thereof, are intrinsic components of well-being. (See Greek Philosophy and Stoicism.) However, Śāntideva does not ever suggest, as Aristotle does, that everyone aims at well-being but not everyone knows what it is (NE 1095a).
However we interpret the relation between action and result, it would seem that for Śāntideva good karma, as a complex of virtue and well-being, effectively constitutes its own intrinsic reason for action, as eudaimonia does. That a given action or mental state is karmically good, and that it is good per se, seem to be one and the same; Śāntideva does not make claims of the form “one should refrain from an action or mental state in spite of the good karma it generates,” or “one should have an action or mental state even though it is karmically bad.” Amod Lele argues that “there are a number of cases where it would seem like Śāntideva is saying it is not good to have more good karma, but in nearly all such cases, he actually ends up saying that the apparent loss of good karma turns out to bring more good karma” (Lele 2007, 85-7, emphasis in original).
Śāntideva typically describes the bodhisattva in terms of his six “perfections” (pāramitās); e.g., ŚS 97, 187. The perfections are beneficial and valuable traits of character, similar to Aristotelian virtues or excellences. This article renders Śāntideva’s term pāramitā as the literal “perfection” rather than as “virtue” because Śāntideva does discuss other virtues — beneficial traits of character — which are not themselves considered pāramitās, such as nonattachment and esteem.
The six perfections are nearly always arranged in ascending order: giving or generosity (dāna), good conduct (śīla), patient endurance (kṣānti), heroic strength (vīrya), meditation (dhyāna) and metaphysical insight (prajñā). An observer might be tempted to apply Aristotle’s classification of the virtues here and identify the first four as “moral” virtues, the sixth (and possibly the fifth) as “intellectual.” However, one should bear in mind the significance of Aristotle’s distinction: intellectual virtues are primarily attained through teaching, moral virtues through habituation (NE 1103a). Śāntideva does not distinguish the perfections in this regard; as we will see in the section on metaphysical insight below, in many ways it too is acquired through habituation.
The perfections are sufficiently important to Śāntideva’s ethical thought that both of his texts are to some extent structured around them. The final four perfections are explicitly identified, in turn, as the topics of the BCA’s chapters VI through IX. Patient endurance and heroic strength are also identified as the topics of ŚS chapters IX and X. While the first two perfections — giving or generosity (dāna) and good conduct (śīla) — do not receive their own chapter headings, they do have an important place in Śāntideva’s ethical worldview, as we will see.
Śāntideva uses the term dāna to refer both to the act of giving, and to the perfection which might more idiomatically be rendered into English as generosity (dānapāramitā). He does not usually distinguish between the two. This article follows his usage and uses “giving” and “generosity” as synonyms.
Giving has relatively little role in the BCA except for its role in the redirection of good karma, mentioned above. In the ŚS, however, it takes pride of place. The first chapter of the ŚS closes by claiming that “giving alone is the bodhisattva’s awakening” (ŚS 34). Richard Mahoney (2002), undertaking a detailed study of the ŚS’s structure, has demonstrated that the entire text is effectively organized around the idea of protecting, purifying and enhancing one’s person, possessions and good karma — culminating in giving each of these three things away.
Why is giving so important to Śāntideva? For him, giving serves at least three important and distinct purposes: first, the development of nonattachment; second, the “upward” expression of esteem (śraddhā); and third, “downward” compassionate benefit to others. Each of these three, for him, is an essential component of the bodhisattva path, and giving allows one to realize each component, though in different ways.
The first reason Śāntideva offers for giving is that one should not be attached to things in the first place; one should be ready to give them away. Śāntideva sometimes uses terms, utsarga and tyāga, which have both the sense of “giving” and of “renunciation.” By giving something to another person, one both demonstrates one’s own lack of attachment to it and minimizes the risk that it will cause future attachment. As a result, one generates a great deal of good karma. Here giving is primarily “giving up”; “giving to” is a secondary function. Śāntideva expresses this rationale for giving most forcefully in a long passage excerpted here:
What is given must no longer be guarded; what is at home must be guarded. What is given is [the cause] for the reduction of craving (triṣṇā); what is at home is the increase of craving. What is given is nonattachment (aparigraha); what is at home is with attachment (saparigraha). What is given is safe; what is at home is dangerous. What is given is [the cause] for supporting the path of awakening; what is at home is [the cause] for supporting Māra [the demonic tempter]. What is given is imperishable; what is at home is perishable. From what is given [comes] happiness; having obtained what is at home, [there is] suffering. (ŚS 19)
This passage indicates a common theme in Śāntideva’s work, one more radical than some other Buddhist takes on attachment and possession. It is not merely that a bodhisattva should avoid attachment to possessions, but that the possessions are themselves potentially harmful, because having them creates a danger of increasing one’s attachment to them. Thus Śāntideva claims elsewhere that a bodhisattva “should have fear of material gain (lābha) and of honour,” (ŚSK 16) and that “great gain is among the obstacles to the Mahāyāna” (ŚS 145).
The second reason for giving is to express one’s esteem or trust (śraddhā) in beings who have achieved a higher level on the bodhisattva path. The term śraddhā has a number of different and related senses, usually blending together: esteem, trust, confidence, devotion, faith. Maria Hibbets’s (2000) rendering “esteem” may come closest overall to the sense in which Śāntideva uses the term, though it loses the important connotation of trust. Śraddhā, Śāntideva says, is the prasāda (peaceful pleasure) of an unsoiled mind, rooted in respect (gaurava, literally “weightiness,” like the Latin gravitas), without arrogance (ŚS 5). Those without esteem oppose or ridicule buddhas (ŚS 174). One with esteem will listen whenever the Buddha’s word is spoken (ŚS 15); esteem is that by which one approaches the noble ones (Buddhas) and does not do what should not be done (ŚS 316).
When a householder makes a gift to a monk, especially a gift of food, it is called a śraddhādeya, a gift by esteem (ŚS 137-8). Similarly, when the aspiring bodhisattva makes offerings to advanced bodhisattvas and buddhas as part of the seven-part Anuttarapūjā ritual worship in BCA II.10-19, the act expresses esteem. Śāntideva does not use the word śraddhā in this passage, but the feelings it evokes match his descriptions of esteem elsewhere: a pleasurable trust in more advanced beings, recognizing their status as more advanced, that leads to better actions. Just before describing the fabulous offerings he gives, Śāntideva’s narrator describes the esteem he places in the buddhas and bodhisattvas and the good action that will result from doing so:
by becoming your possession, I am in a state of fearlessness; I make the well-being of all beings. I overcome previous bad karma and will make no further bad karma. (BCA II.9)
This esteem has deeply important benefits. It is a pleasure taken in good actions; it is “a maker of gladness about renunciation, a maker of excitement about the Jinas’ (Buddhas’) dharma” (ŚS 3). This combination of trust and pleasure leads one on to good action; as Śāntideva says, those who always have esteem toward a respectable Buddha will abandon neither good conduct nor training (ŚS 3). So the practice of esteem helps increase one’s good karma (ŚS 317). Moreover, to encourage the growth of esteem in a giver, when an aspiring bodhisattva receives a gift, he encourages the giver and makes him feel excited about giving it (ŚS 150).
When one gives for either of the above reasons (expressing nonattachment or expressing esteem), one effectively does so for one’s own spiritual benefit. But Śāntideva also says that one gives to all beings (sarvasatvebhyas, ŚSK 4), for their enjoyment (ŚSK 5), adding that one also preserves the gift for the sake of their enjoyment (satvôpabhogārtham, ŚSK 6). Here he is advocating a different kind of giving, motivated by compassion and aimed at benefitting the recipient. The distinction between the second two types of giving corresponds to Maria Heim’s (Heim 2004, 74-5) distinction between “upward” and “downward” giving, out of esteem and out of compassion.
The reasons Śāntideva offers for downward giving are not as straightforward as they may first appear. For Śāntideva, the recipient of a gift benefits less from possessing the gift object, and more from receiving it in a gift encounter. When a bodhisattva gives a gift, he attracts the recipient to the bodhisattva path, so that the recipient is more likely to become a virtuous bodhisattva. The gift object itself provides little benefit, and could even be harmful (2007, 136-75).
As well as giving possessions and more conventional goods, one also gives good karma to others through its redirection (parināmanā), as noted above. Since Śāntideva tends to see good karma as intrinsically good, in this case the recipient is more likely to benefit from the gift itself. Even so, good karma involves a potential danger, since if it is not redirected it can lead merely to dangerous wealth rather than to awakening.
Of all the perfections, Śāntideva tells us the least about the second one, śīla. This Sanskrit and Pali term has a general sense of “good conduct” or “good habits,” but its particular meaning is less clear. Unlike the final four perfections, it is not identified specifically as the single topic of a chapter in the BCA, and the chapters identified with it in the ŚS (II and V) make little reference to it. Unlike giving, it is not discussed at systematic length in either text. Śāntideva sometimes uses the term in a broad sense that would seem to encompass all of the perfections, to the point of using it interchangeably with puṇya, good karma, or śubha, well-being (Clayton 2006, 73). ŚS chapter V, entitled Śīlapāramitāyām Anarthavarjanam — abandoning of the worthless with respect to the perfection of good conduct — seems like a miscellany of topics, describing a wide variety of actions that Śāntideva endorses. A reader may then be tempted to take up the common usage in which this good conduct refers to “morality,” “virtue” or “ethics” in a general sense (see Clayton 2006, 72-3) — perhaps even a sense that includes the other perfections.
Yet Śāntideva does give some further specification of a way in which he understands “good conduct,” conceptually distinct from the other perfections, even though he does not stick consistently to this usage. His one reference to the perfection of good conduct in the BCA proclaims: “when the mind of cessation (viraticitta) is obtained, the perfection of good conduct is understood [to exist]” (BCAP 53). The ŚS specifies the goal of good conduct in a similar vein, but is more specific about what constitutes good conduct: “whichever practices are causes of meditative concentration (samādhi), those are included in good conduct” (ŚS 121). It seems that good conduct, when understood as a single perfection, consists primarily of practices that aid one to concentrate one’s mind and still its uncontrolled activity.
This suggestion is borne out by the content of the fifth BCA chapter, which, following up the claim about the mind of cessation, details exactly these sorts of practices. (Since this chapter comes immediately before the chapter on patient endurance — the third perfection — it would be a logical place for Śāntideva to discuss good conduct, the second perfection.) The chapter begins by warning the reader of the dangers of an unrestrained mind, comparing it to a mad, rutting elephant, and then specifies a number of practices that Śāntideva claims will help the mind remain under control. We may imagine, then, that this chapter gives us some idea of what Śāntideva means by the perfection of good conduct.
The practices bear some resemblance to Buddhist monastic rules (vinaya), although they could all be followed by lay householders and the text does not restrict them to monks. Śāntideva urges his readers to walk with a downcast gaze, as if continually meditating, but notes that they may look outward to rest their eyes or to greet someone. One should look ahead (or behind) before moving there, he says, and think about one’s actions before undertaking them; one should continually observe the positioning of one’s body. Each of these actions, Śāntideva specifies, allows one to restrain the mind (BCA V.35-40). Similarly, one should avoid idle chatter, or purposeless nervous tics (BCA V.45-6). In general, as Susanne Mrozik notes, “Close careful attention to one’s bodily movements and gestures generates mindfulness and awareness. Disciplining the body is thus a means of disciplining one’s thoughts and feelings” (Mrozik 1998, 63).
Śāntideva notes that the relationship between good conduct and meditative concentration is two-way: “One aiming at meditative concentration should have good conduct, for mindfulness and introspection; so too, one aiming at good conduct should make effort at meditative concentration.” He claims that the “complete perfection of mental action” will comes from the two “mutually enhancing causes” that are good conduct and meditative concentration (ŚS 121).
The second half of the fifth BCA chapter involves details about bodily comportment which aim at pleasing others, rather than at focusing the mind; similar instructions are found in the sixth chapter of the ŚS. It is possible, though not clear, that Śāntideva also intends these to be included under good conduct. Śāntideva here enjoins etiquette of various kinds (do not spit in public, do not make noises while eating) and a pleasant tone of speaking (BCA V.71-96, ŚS 124-7). Mrozik (2007, 75-6) notes that such actions are intended to generate prasāda, a kind of peaceful pleasure, in those who observe the bodhisattva. Lele (2007, 151-9) suggests further that the goal of generating this prasāda is to attract them to the bodhisattva path, making them more likely to enter that path and increase their well-being.
Śāntideva divides patient endurance (kṣānti) into three major varieties: first, enduring suffering (duṣkhâdhivāsanakṣānti); second, dharmic patience, the patient endurance that comes from reflecting on the Buddha’s teaching, the dharma (dharmanidhyānakṣānti); and third, patience toward others’ wrongdoing (parâpakāramarṣanakṣānti, ŚS 179). The first, which Śāntideva opposes to frustration (daurmanasya), is closer to the English word “endurance”; the third, which Śāntideva opposes to anger (dveṣa), is closer to the English word “patience.” For this reason it is helpful to use a two-word term like “patient endurance” to encapsulate the idea of kṣānti as a whole. Śāntideva does not link these phenomena under the rubric of patient endurance merely for the sake of convenience or etymology; rather, patient endurance has common elements that pervade them all. In all three cases, one remains calm and even happy in the face of various undesired events — pains, frustrations, wrongs — that one might face.
Dharmic patience, the second variety — as Śāntideva describes it in BCA VI.22-32 — is juxtaposed against anger, and involves being patient with others’ bad actions. For this reason, it seems largely like a subtype of the third type, patience toward wrongdoing, which involves reflecting on the fact that their actions all have causes. Śāntideva likely treats the two as distinct in order to emphasize the particular importance of metaphysical reasons for patient endurance. In terms of the actions and mental dispositions that they entail, they do not appear to be different from each other. So we may here subsume this second variety under the third, except as otherwise specified.
There are at least two ways in which enduring suffering and patience toward wrongdoing are closely related in Śāntideva’s work. First, there is a logical or analytical relationship. When one is wronged by others, it is likely to be an undesired event, and therefore experienced as suffering. So, effectively, the events that evoke patience toward wrongdoing are a subset of those that evoke the endurance of suffering. The appropriate reactions are intertwined as well. We see this when Śāntideva discusses being the victim of theft. While he addresses theft in the context of anger, and more generally of patience toward wrongdoing, the reason he gives to remain patient is that possessions are dangerous to have anyway (BCA VI.100) — a central part of Śāntideva’s justifications for nonattachment, which itself is very closely tied to enduring suffering.
Second, there is a causal relationship. Enduring suffering, as Śāntideva discusses it, requires that one fight frustration; patience toward wrongdoing requires that one fight anger. And both of Śāntideva’s texts (ŚS 179 and BCA VI.7-8) note that anger feeds on frustration; so enduring suffering makes it easier to have patience toward wrongdoing.
Śāntideva’s case for enduring suffering is relatively straightforward: one will feel less suffering and be happier. Early in his discussion of frustration (daurmanasya), Śāntideva makes the pragmatic point that it accomplishes little. So it is not only an unpleasant mental state, but an unnecessary one: “If indeed there is a remedy, then what’s the point of frustration? And if there is no remedy, then what’s the point of frustration?” (BCA VI.10).
Enduring suffering can lead to happiness, for Śāntideva, in a particularly extreme meditative state (samādhi). He refers to this state as the sarvadharmasukhakrānta, “making happiness toward all phenomena.” The passage describing this meditative state is one of the most provocative in the entire ŚS. Śāntideva says that “for a bodhisattva who has obtained this meditative state, with respect to all sense objects, pain is felt as happiness indeed, not as suffering or as indifference” (ŚS 181). He proceeds to describe a panoply of graphic tortures in a startlingly upbeat manner. For example:
[The bodhisattva who has attained this meditative state], while being fried in oil, or while pounded like pounded sugarcane, or while crushed like a reed, or while being burned in the way that oil or ghee or yogurt are burned — has a happy thought arisen. (ŚS 181)
While a reader might cringe at the literal masochism in this passage, it is also not hard to see the power of its appeal: It strongly suggests that a bodhisattva can be happy anywhere, any time, in any condition. And there is a particular practice that the bodhisattva pursues to reach this state. Whenever he is subjected to such an unpleasant fate, he makes a mental determination or vow (pranidhāna) that everyone, from those who honor him to those who torture him, should reach the great awakening (ŚS 182). In the BCA he suggests starting with small pains to learn to endure bigger ones: “because of the practice of mild distress, even great distress is tolerable” (BCA VI.14). Prajñākaramati draws a direct connection between the two, quoting the ŚS passage in his commentary on the BCA verse.
Śāntideva’s arguments for patience toward wrongdoing consist of arguments against anger, against which this patience is juxtaposed. He lays out these arguments primarily in the sixth chapter of the BCA; for a detailed commentary on this chapter, see Thurman 2004. His arguments here derive from premises both naturalistic and supernaturalistic: “One who destroys anger is happy in this world and the next” (BCA VI.6).
Śāntideva’s naturalistic arguments against anger rest first on psychological grounds: “The mind does not get peace, nor enjoy pleasure and happiness, nor find sleep or satisfaction, when the dart of anger rests in the heart” (BCA VI.3). This set of psychological claims has a strong intuitive plausibility, in our context as well as his; it is probably not difficult for anyone to remember times that anger has negatively affected her peace of mind or pleasure or sleep.
Beyond this, Śāntideva seeks to minimize the significance of others’ wrongdoing (apakāra). He is especially concerned to neutralize insults and the destruction of praise. He asks: “The gang of contempt, harsh speech and infamy does not bind my body. Why, O mind, do you get enraged by it?” (BCA VI.53)
Śāntideva also offers severe warnings concerning the karmic consequences of anger. There is no bad karma equal to anger, he says, so patient endurance is the most effective means to reduce bad karma (BCA VI.2). He warns that anger leads to suffering in the hell realms far greater than the suffering that originally provoked the anger:
If suffering merely here and now cannot be endured, why is anger, the cause of distress in hell, not restrained? In the same way, for the sake of anger I have been placed in hells thousands of times; I have done this neither for my own sake nor for anyone else’s. (BCA VI.73-4)
There is only one kind of anger that Śāntideva seems to approve of, effectively an exception that proves the rule. He approves of anger when it is directed at anger itself: “Let anger toward anger be my choice” (BCA VI.41). More generally, he suggests elsewhere that anger at “my enemies, craving, anger and so on” (BCA IV.28) might be valuable: “Lodged in my own mind, these well-stood ones still harm me. In this very case I do not get angry. Damn, what unsuitable patience (sahiṣṇutā)!” (BCA IV.29).
Śāntideva also makes the case for dharmic patience (dharmanidhyānakṣānti) in BCA VI.22-32; this, as mentioned earlier, is patience toward wrongdoing which is informed by metaphysical insight. Śāntideva’s point here is that the emotion of anger comes out of an incorrect belief about the world — namely that other agents can appropriately be blamed for their actions. “I have no anger at my bile and so on, though they make great suffering. Why is there anger at sentient beings? They too are angry due to a cause” (BCA VI.22). Anger, whether my own or another’s, has its causes. It is not chosen; it is merely another product of the universe’s dependent arising (BCA VI.23-26). Moreover, there is no self which is capable of being an agent of anger (BCA VI.27-30). And “therefore, whether one has seen an enemy or a friend doing something wrong, having considered that the act has causes, one should become happy” (BCA VI.33). Mark Siderits (2005) refers to this argument for dharmic patience as “paleo-compatibilist,” and suggests that it can help resolve contemporary debates on free will and determinism.
These arguments against anger are phrased in terms that could convince someone not already on the path. Other arguments are directed specifically at bodhisattvas. As has been mentioned before, it is crucial for the bodhisattva to win beings over; and anger interferes with this activity, where desire (rāga) might be able on some occasions to help with it. This is why anger, in Śāntideva’s eyes, is far worse than desire, though desire and anger are both afflictions (kleṣas) that cloud the mind and lead one on to suffering (ŚS 164).
He claims further that “bodhisattvas who are not excellent in means (upāyakuśala) fear downfalls connected with desire (rāga); bodhisattvas who are excellent in means fear downfalls connected with anger, not downfalls connected with desire” (ŚS 164-5). Excellence in means (upāyakauśalya), the ability to teach others in the appropriate way to bring them onto the path, is deeply hindered by anger. Unlike desire, anger has no saving graces. Anger both creates suffering for oneself and interferes with one’s ability to benefit others; this is why nothing is as karmically bad as anger, or as karmically good as patient endurance.
Śāntideva devotes relatively little attention to the fourth perfection, heroic strength (vīrya). Each of his texts has a short chapter (BCA VII and ŚS X) devoted to it; parallel discussions occur in the fourth chapter of the BCA. He defines heroic strength as “excellent effort” (kuśalotsaha, BCA VII.2), effort that is both skillful and virtuous — a tireless striving on the bodhisattva path. In BCA VII, he contrasts heroic strength with laziness (ālasya, BCA VII.3). The primary point of BCA VII is to insist on the urgency of the bodhisattva’s task. It is rare to be born as a human, and a short human life leaves one with little time for adequate spiritual development, so it is crucial to devote oneself wholeheartedly to the task.
ŚS X, the shortest chapter in the text — a mere four pages — explains the importance of listening to sacred texts (śruta). The topic is surprising, since it seems tangentially related, at best, to the more straightforward heroic strength addressed in BCA VII. The connection seems to be that, to listen to sacred texts properly, one must do so tirelessly. If one does not do so, Śāntideva claims, even a sacred text can lead to “destruction” (vināśa), probably because one reads and applies the text too selectively (ŚS 189).
The fifth perfection, discussed in BCA VIII and ŚS XI-XIII, is meditation (dhyāna). Meditation for Śāntideva is very much an intellectual and even philosophical exercise, not merely a stilling of the mind; some of Śāntideva’s most famous arguments appear in a context of discussions of meditation. Śāntideva emphasizes that a calming and stilling of the mind is essential to meditation, and enjoins his reader to flee society and find a solitary spot in the wilderness in order to achieve the proper degree of undistracted calm (BCA VIII.1-40, ŚS 193-201). But becoming calm and solitary, in both texts, is only the first step to grasping arguments and transformative techniques with an explicit cognitive content.
In the BCA, the first meditation that Śāntideva describes sharpens his emphasis on solitude: one considers the foulness of the human body. Specifically, his male audience is urged to reflect on the foulness of a potential female lover. He notes that the beloved will invariably become a corpse, highlights the repulsiveness of corpses, and asks the reader rhetorically why the living beloved seems any less repulsive (VIII.41-7). He then calls attention to the repulsiveness of the body’s waste products, natural smells, and fluids (VIII.48-71). Next he notes the great effort one must take in finding and keeping a lover, and the ultimate vanity of such efforts (VIII.72-83).
This meditation takes on a strongly misogynist tone, describing as it does the repulsiveness of female bodies. A contemporary reader should keep in mind its intent as a critique of lust, the passion which so easily distracts the mind from the bodhisattva’s path. While the argument is phrased in terms of the foulness of a woman’s body, its logic would apply equally well to the foulness of a man’s body, if imagined by a heterosexual female or homosexual male meditator. (Śāntideva never inverts the argument this way himself. As Wilson 1996 notes, historically Buddhists have never turned the arguments about female foulness around to have it apply to men, even when speaking to a female audience. The point is noted here to stress the relevance of these meditations for a contemporary philosophical audience, rightly skeptical of misogynistic claims.) The ideal to achieve in this lifetime, for Śāntideva, is that of a male or female monk who forswears lust and sexuality, and he calls attention to the body’s repulsive aspects in order to convince his readers of this ideal’s value.
The two meditations which follow in BCA VIII, on the relationship between oneself and another, are Śāntideva’s most famous. The first of these is known as the equalization of self and other (parātmasamatā). In this meditation Śāntideva argues for an ethical conclusion from a metaphysical premise: because the self is empty and unreal, it makes little sense to protect only oneself from suffering and not others.
The arguments are framed against a hypothetical objector (pūrvapakṣin) who wishes to prevent only his own suffering, but not that of others. Suffering here has a strong normative force; that suffering is bad and worthy of prevention is taken as self-evident, and Śāntideva assumes that his readers will share that assumption. When an imagined objector asks why suffering should be prevented at all, he responds, “No one disputes that!” (BCA VIII.103) If we substitute “the absence of suffering” for “pleasure,” Śāntideva’s claim here seems to work like Alasdair MacIntyre’s interpretation of Mill’s claim that we know pleasure is desirable because men desire it:
He treats the thesis that all men desire pleasure as a factual assertion which guarantees the success of an ad hominem apeal to anyone who denies his conclusion. If anyone denies that pleasure is desirable, then we can ask him, But don’t you desire it? and we know in advance that he must answer yes, and consequently must admit that pleasure is desirable. (MacIntyre 1966, 239)
To deny that suffering should be prevented at all, in other words, is to argue in bad faith: anyone who makes such a claim does not really believe it. It is not hard to see the intuitive force of Śāntideva’s claim about suffering; while one might come up with exceptions, in general most human beings in most contexts have viewed suffering as something bad and undesirable.
The selfish objector is right, then, to believe that suffering should be prevented. Where he goes awry is in focusing only on his own suffering; this focus turns out to be absurd. There is no self that endures from moment to moment, so one’s own future self is as different from one’s present self as other beings are: “If [someone else] is not protected because his suffering cannot hurt me — the sufferings of a future body are not mine. Why is that hurt protected against?” (BCA VIII.97) Śāntideva’s arguments here have been compared to those of Derek Parfit (1984), who also attacks the metaphysical premise of selfhood as a premise for an altruistic ethics.
Paul Williams (1998a, 30) notes that most commentators, including Prajñākaramati, have read this verse so that the “future body” (āgāmikāya) means only the bodies one will inhabit in future rebirths, not the future state of one’s body in the present life. A literal reading of this verse and the next would suggest that they are right; the next verse adds that “one is dead, a very different other one is born” (BCA VIII.98). So Williams thinks that “from a textual point of view” this verse must be correct. However, later Tibetan commentators, especially rGyal tshab rje, interpret the verse so that it could refer to any present suffering one might try to prevent (Williams 1998a, 32-6). The “death” and “birth” would likely then refer to the body’s non-enduring nature — dying as the present moment passes away and being born anew in the following moment — rather than to literal death and rebirth. Logically this seems a more satisfying reading. The argument seems entirely superfluous if it refers only to future births; based on everything else that Śāntideva says, one concerned with better future births should, above all, prevent the suffering of others.
Śāntideva makes an additional argument beyond the point about future selves. Even the present self should be broken up into its parts. When the opponent objects that one who suffers should only prevent the suffering that belongs to him, Śāntideva retorts: “The foot’s suffering is not the hand’s. Why does [the hand] protect [the foot]?” (BCA VIII.99)
Williams (1998b) has attempted to refute Śāntideva’s arguments against egoism, claiming that the concept of suffering or pain makes little sense without a subject or self to feel the suffering. Williams’s refutation has been controversial, provoking Barbra Clayton (Clayton 2001), John Pettit (1999) and Mark Siderits (Siderits 2000) all to defend Śāntideva’s claims.
Why do these arguments appear in the chapter on meditation, when the primary focus of that chapter seems to concern the kind of metaphysical insight that is the topic of the following chapter? Two reasons suggest themselves. First, the arguments prepare the audience for the more imaginatively focused practice of the exchange and self and other. Second, as Crosby and Skilton suggest(1995, 84-5), these meditations derive from Cittamātra (Yogācāra) metaphysical views on the ultimate equivalence of self and other. Śāntideva considers these Cittamātra views to be only a step on the road to the highest Madhyamaka view (see BCA IX). These arguments, then, are really true only at the level of conventional truth, not at the level of wordless ultimate reality, the object of real metaphysical insight.
The last meditation in the chapter is called the exchange of self and other (parātmaparivartana). In it, Śāntideva attempts to put the equalization of self and other into practice, even taking it a step further to dissolve all the meditator’s vestiges of egoism. Here he urges his readers to create “a sense of self in inferiors and others, and a sense of other in oneself,” (VIII.140) to literally form a concept of “I” (ahamkāra) with respect to others, just as one would do with respect to the “drops of semen and blood” (VIII.158) which created the entity that one would normally consider a self. The intervening verses manifest this idea in practice. Here Śāntideva switches pronouns and grammatical persons so that the third person refers to the meditator and the first person to “others.” The new “I” that is the others can then feel envy and contempt toward the “he” that was oneself.
One now imagines how “he” — that is, oneself — seems happy, wealthy and praised, while “I” — others — “am” miserable, poor and despised; “I” should envy “him” (BCA VIII.141-2). Having imagined oneself from the viewpoint of an envious inferior, one then imagines the inverse viewpoint of a contemptuous superior:
We joyous ones see him finally mistreated, and the mocking laughter of all the people here and there. That wretch even had a rivalry with me! . . . Even if he were to have wealth, we should take it forcibly, having given him a mere pittance, if he does any work for us. And he should be caused to fall from happiness. (BCA VIII.150-4)
This sadomasochistic advice and the play of pronouns work together to end feelings of egoism or attachment to self. Meditating in this way, one comes to live entirely for others.
The above meditations from the BCA, while Śāntideva’s most famous, are not the only meditations that he prescribes. In the ŚS, after briefly advising solitude and the control of thoughts, Śāntideva presents in turn three meditations intended to counter the three mental “poisons” which, in Buddhist thought, are responsible for suffering: desire (rāga), anger (dveṣa) and delusion (moha).
Against desire, Śāntideva describes a meditation on the foulness of the body, as in the BCA (ŚS 209-12). To counteract anger, Śāntideva prescribes the practice of friendliness or love (maitrī, ŚS 212-19). This practice takes a number of forms, but the most notable is the redirection (parināmanā) of good karma toward others’ benefit. (This will be discussed below under “good and bad karma.”) Such acts are discussed at a number of places in Śāntideva’s texts; at ŚS 213-16 he specifically refers to the practice of friendliness, which is intended to counteract anger. The way that one redirects good karma, in practice, is through an expressly stated wish: for example, “Whoever is suffering distress of body or mind in any of the ten directions — may they obtain oceans of happiness and joy through my good karma” (BCA X.2). This rationale for karmic redirection could apply even to those skeptical whether a supernatural process of karmic causality will actually work: by regularly wishing that one’s own good deeds will benefit others’ well-being, one can at least diminish the anger that one feels toward them.
Finally, to counteract delusion, one meditates on dependent origination (pratītyasamutpāda), the Buddhist theory that all things come to exist in dependence upon other causes (ŚS 219-28). This meditation leads into Śāntideva’s discussion of the final perfection, metaphysical insight.
The sixth and final perfection in Śāntideva’s thought is prajñā, a complex term which this article renders as “metaphysical insight.” The term “insight” emphasizes the depth and transformative nature of this knowledge — as we will see, Śāntideva makes strong claims about the effects that prajñā has on its possessor, so that it is classified as a perfection alongside patient endurance and restrained good conduct. The term “metaphysical” emphasizes the specific content of this knowledge: claims about the nature of reality. This is a relatively loose and nontechnical sense of the term “metaphysics” that one may find in introductory textbooks on philosophy — for example, “Metaphysics is the attempt to say what reality is” (Solomon 2006, 113). This section begins with a discussion of the ideas and arguments that Śāntideva includes as the content of metaphysical insight, and then proceeds to discuss their significance for ethics and the conduct of life.
Śāntideva’s views on metaphysics follow those of the Madhyamaka school of thought, associated with Nāgārjuna. (See Nagarjuna and Madhyamaka Buddhism for more detail.) For Madhyamaka, all things, especially the self, are empty (śūnya) and dependently originated (pratītyasamutpanna) — they have no essential or abiding existence. Tibetan tradition has typically associated Śāntideva with the more radical Prāsangika Mādhyamika school, as his metaphysical arguments follow their approach of reductio ad absurdum (prasanga) argument rather than the independent syllogisms (svatantra) of the Svātantrika school. On the other hand, Akira Saito (1996, 261) has argued that “we cannot be too careful” in using the term Prāsangika with reference to Śāntideva. (See McClintock and Dreyfus 2002 for a discussion of the distinction between the Prāsangika and Svātantrika schools.)
Śāntideva’s metaphysics is widely studied and commented on, both in Tibetan tradition and in the West. (For Tibetan commentaries see Dalai Lama XIV 1988; Palden and Seunam 1993. For Western commentaries see Oldmeadow 1994; Sweet 1977.) Nevertheless, the content of Śāntideva’s metaphysics does not seem particularly original; as Michael Sweet’s book-length study of Śāntideva’s metaphysics notes,
we do not find that his philosophical concerns or patterns of argumentation differ in any significant manner from those of Nāgārjuna, and especially from those of Candrakīrti, the great systematizer of the Prāsangika-Mādhyamika who preceded Śāntideva by at least a century. (Sweet 1977, 14)
Where Śāntideva’s approach innovates is in the way that he draws ethical conclusions directly from his metaphysical premises. Many Buddhist texts draw soteriological conclusions of some sort from metaphysical premises — the nature of the universe is such that everyday life is filled with suffering but one can be liberated from it. Moreover, texts often draw ethical conclusions from these soteriological ideas. So in earlier texts there is an indirect connection from metaphysics to ethics by way of soteriology. Śāntideva, on the other hand, argues directly from metaphysics to advice about conduct in life, in a way that is relatively unusual in South Asian Buddhist literature. One exception is Candrakīrti himself, who derives ethical conclusions from metaphysics in his Catuhṣataka commentary (see Lang 2003), though his approach to doing so is significantly different from Śāntideva’s.
Śāntideva’s prasanga arguments avoid foundational claims, in the stricter sense of attempts to definitively establish a position from which other claims can be deduced. Any such position would itself be considered empty and therefore in some sense flawed. Indeed, an earlier Madhyamaka text, the Vigrahavyāvartani of Nāgārjuna, famously refuted its opponents by proclaiming: “If I had any position, then I would have a flaw [in my argument]. But I have no position; therefore I have no flaw at all” (VV 29). Rather, the approach is intended to be purely dialectical and critical, examining alternative positions and knocking them down, as Śāntideva does in BCA IX. Because Śāntideva is deconstructing concepts and deriving ethical significance from this deconstruction, William Edelglass (2007) compares his philosophy to that of Emmanuel Lévinas.
Claims to have no position may seem absurd at first glance, especially when associated with a thinker like Śāntideva who seems to make many positive claims about how one should live. Śāntideva’s response relies on the central Madhyamaka distinction between conventional (samvriti) and ultimate (paramārtha) truth (e.g. BCA IX.2). The ultimate truth is inexpressible (anabhilāpya), untaught (adeṣita) and unmanifest (aprakāśita, ŚS 256); it is nonconceptual, and therefore nonrational. But because we are caught up in illusion, seeing substance, we still need to make provisional statements at a conventional level to make ourselves and others aware of this illusion and free ourselves from it. Since the ultimate truth is inexpressible, all of Śāntideva’s actual claims need to be understood at the conventional level.
The above is what Śāntideva appears to say in his own words, at any rate. It is worth noting here that the Tibetan dGe lugs (Geluk) school argues that such claims cannot be taken literally and that in fact the ultimate truth is accessible to the intellect, although other commentators from the Sa skya (Sakya) and rNying ma (Nyingma) schools accept a more literal interpretation like the one I have just provided (Sweet 1977, 20).
The distinction between ultimate and conventional truth lends support to a number of Śāntideva’s practical arguments. Especially, it supports his self-interested case for altruism on the grounds of the bodhisattva’s happiness: “All who are suffering in the world [are suffering] because of desire for their own happiness. All who are happy in the world [are happy] because of desire for others’ happiness” (BCA VIII.129). Śāntideva does not explain how this psychological claim is supposed to work. Lele (2007, 65-6) ties the claim to Śāntideva’s theory of nonattachment (aparigraha); concern for oneself and one’s own particular interests leads to painful feelings of grief, loss, and fear when, as inevitably happens, those interests are harmed. But however such arguments are supposed to work, they would seem to be undercut by another claim of Śāntideva’s: namely, that bodhisattvas still suffer in a sense, because of their compassion for others. He claims: “Just as one whose body is on fire has no joy at all, even through all pleasures, exactly so there is no way to joy with respect to the distress of beings, for those made of compassion” (BCA VI.123; see also ŚS 156, 166).
The distinction between conventional and ultimate, however, helps one resolve this apparent problem — for the claim that bodhisattvas suffer is made merely at the conventional level of truth. Śāntideva argues that suffering itself is unreal (BCA IX.88-91); and only one who realizes the ultimate truth, it seems, will be able to really recognize this unreality. This recognition is the way in which it is possible for suffering to end, as the Third Noble Truth of Buddhism promises. It is also probably part of the reason that Śāntideva proclaims that happy people are happy because they desire others’ happiness — a bodhisattva, who has lost the illusion of self, can also lose the illusion of suffering and thereby escape it.
If suffering is unreal, however, one may wonder why it should be prevented. A similar worry applies to good and bad karma. Śāntideva claims, after all, that good and bad karma themselves arise out of illusion (BCA IX.11); like everything else we can speak of, they are ultimately empty. Clayton (2006, 97-8) argues that this point implies that ethical action, good karma, or eliminating suffering are unnecessary or insignificant. She quotes Richard Hayes (1994, 38) to the effect that maintaining a sense of the importance of ethics in such a philosophy is merely “philosophical rigour and integrity being compromised by the perceived need to preserve a social institution.” She finds herself “not quite cynical enough” to doubt Śāntideva’s sincerity in accordance with Hayes’s quote, but provides no alternative explanation for why Śāntideva might have still believed in ethical action. Lele (2007, 89-90) argues to the contrary that Śāntideva maintains his philosophical integrity through the conventional-ultimate distinction. Ultimately good and bad karma are unreal, but they are very real at the conventional level. Most people remain trapped in the conventional level, where suffering occurs, and so they experience the suffering as real. For them, it is this conventional level of truth that matters.
Metaphysical insight has three major ethical and soteriological implications for Śāntideva, some of which we have already seen. First, knowing the nonexistence of self will lead one to benefit others. Second, one who knows dependent origination can become more patient with others’ wrongdoing, because he will know to avoid blaming them. Finally, “one who knows emptiness is not emotionally attached to worldly phenomena, because he is independent [of them]” (ŚS 264); recognizing the emptiness of things allows one to attach less significance to them.
These implications, for Śāntideva, are not merely a matter of logical implication. There is also a practical, cause-and-effect relationship between one’s realization of the metaphysical claims and one’s actions and mental states. For this reason Luis Gómez (1994, 121) notes that the closing verses of BCA IX “leave no room for doubt that we are dealing with a technology of the self” which is also a philosophical discourse. The passage quoted above does not merely state that one who knows emptiness also knows that he should not be emotionally attached to worldly phenomena; it states further that he himself is not in fact so attached (na samhriyate). Elsewhere in the text Śāntideva makes other, similar, causal claims that metaphysical insight will cause one to feel and act differently. For example, after having made a series of logical arguments for the equivalence of self and other, he immediately comes to add: “Those whose mental dispositions are developed in this way (evam), for whom the suffering of others is equal to their loves, go down into the Avīci hell like geese [into] a lotus pond” (BCA VIII.107, emphasis added). The “in this way” (Sanskrit evam) indicates that the logical arguments themselves are a way to develop mental dispositions; hearing these arguments is the thing that develops one’s mind to treat others’ suffering equally to one’s own. Metaphysical insight is not merely an idea added to a stock of knowledge, with which one can do as one pleases; it has direct consequences for one’s emotional states.
Such a view seems perplexing to contemporary Western ears, including some informed by Buddhism. Understanding ideas often seems not to have this liberating effect. David Burton puts the problem well, in terms of his personal experience:
I do not seem to be ignorant about the impermanence of entities. I appear to understand that entities have no fixed essence and that they often change in disagreeable ways. I seem to understand that what I possess will fall out of my possession. I apparently accept that all entities must pass away. And I seem to acknowledge that my craving causes suffering. Yet I am certainly not free from craving and attachment. . . . How, then, might one preserve the common Buddhist claim that knowledge of the three characteristics of existence [i.e. nonself, impermanence and suffering] results in liberation in the face of this objection? (Burton 2004, 31)
Burton explores several potential hypotheses to resolve his question. He labels the hypothesis which seems to come closest to Śāntideva’s view as “insufficient attentiveness and reflection.” That is, that for those who have not experienced the beneficial ethical, emotional or soteriological consequences that are presumed to accrue from knowledge of Buddhist ideas, their belief in such ideas “is something they have thought about from time to time perhaps, but they do not bring it to mind often enough” (Burton 2004, 48-9).
Śāntideva suggests such a hypothesis in two ways. First, he frequently mentions the shifting and changing nature of the mind; for example, he notes that the mind is “like a river flow, unstable, broken up and dissolved when produced,” and “like lightning, unsteadily cut off in a moment” (ŚS 234). Second, within the chapter of the BCA on metaphysical insight, he speaks of “cultivating,” or meditating on, arguments: “this reasoning (vicāra) is meditated on as an antidote to that [fixation on imagination]” (BCA IX.92). This point is reinforced elsewhere in the text; as we have seen, his most famous metaphysical argument, on the equivalence of self and other (BCA VIII.90-119), occurs in the context of a particular meditation, within the BCA’s chapter on meditation (dhyāna). It is not enough, for Śāntideva, to find an argument persuasive and then move on to other things; it must be fixed in one’s mind.
BCA — Śāntideva, Bodhicaryāvatāra. Edition: Bodhicaryāvatāra of Śāntideva with the commentary Pañjikā of Prajñākaramati; ed. P.L. Vaidya (1960), Buddhist Sanskrit Texts XII, Darbhanga, India: Mithila Institute. References given are to chapter and verse numbers.
BCAP — Prajñākaramati, Bodhicaryāvatārapañjikā. Edition: Bodhicaryāvatāra of Śāntideva with the commentary Pañjikā of Prajñākaramati; ed. P.L. Vaidya (1960), Buddhist Sanskrit Texts XII, Darbhanga, India: Mithila Institute. Page references given are to the Poussin edition (listed with “P” in the Vaidya edition’s margins).
NE — Aristotle, Nicomachean Ethics. Edition: J. Bywater, available for download and online search at www.perseus.tufts.edu as of 14 Aug 2007.
ŚS — Śāntideva, Śikṣāsamuccaya. Edition: Çikshāsamuccaya: a compendium of Buddhistic teachings, compiled by Çāntideva chiefly from earlier Mahāyāna sūtras; ed. Cecil Bendall (1970), Bibliotheca Buddhica I, Osnabruck, Germany: Biblio Verlag.
ŚSK — Śāntideva, Śikṣāsamuccaya Kārikā, in the Bendall edition of the ŚS above.
VV — Nāgārjuna, Vigrahavyāvartani. Edition: Vigrahavyāvartani of Nāgārjuna: Sanskrit Text, eds. Christian Lindtner and Richard Mahoney (2003), available for download at http://indica-et-buddhica.org as of 14 Aug 2007.
Last updated: August 4, 2009 | Originally published: