Arthur Schopenhauer has been dubbed the artist’s philosopher on account of the inspiration his aesthetics has provided to artists of all stripes. He is also known as the philosopher of pessimism, as he articulated a worldview that challenges the value of existence. His elegant and muscular prose earn him a reputation as one the greatest German stylists. Although he never achieved the fame of such post-Kantian philosophers as Johann Gottlieb Fichte and G.W.F. Hegel in his lifetime, his thought informed the work of such luminaries as Sigmund Freud, Ludwig Wittgenstein and, most famously, Friedrich Nietzsche. He is also known as the first German philosopher to incorporate Eastern thought into his writings.
Schopenhauer’s thought is iconoclastic for a number of reasons. Although he considered himself Kant’s only true philosophical heir, he argued that the world was essentially irrational. Writing in the era of German Romanticism, he developed an aesthetics that was classicist in its emphasis on the eternal. When German philosophers were entrenched in the universities and immersed in the theological concerns of the time, Schopenhauer was an atheist who stayed outside the academic profession.
Schopenhauer’s lack of recognition during most of his lifetime may have been due to the iconoclasm of his thought, but it was probably also partly due to his irascible and stubborn temperament. The diatribes against Hegel and Fichte peppered throughout his works provide evidence of his state of mind. Regardless of the reason Schopenhauer’s philosophy was overlooked for so long, he fully deserves the prestige he enjoyed altogether too late in his life.
Arthur Schopenhauer was born on February 22, 1788 in Danzig (now Gdansk, Poland) to a prosperous merchant, Heinrich Floris Schopenhauer, and his much younger wife, Johanna. The family moved to Hamburg when Schopenhauer was five, because his father, a proponent of enlightenment and republican ideals, found Danzig unsuitable after the Prussian annexation. His father wanted Arthur to become a cosmopolitan merchant like himself and hence traveled with Arthur extensively in his youth. His father also arranged for Arthur to live with a French family for two years when he was nine, which allowed Arthur to become fluent in French. From an early age, Arthur wanted to pursue the life of a scholar. Rather than force him into his own career, Heinrich offered a proposition to Arthur: the boy could either accompany his parents on a tour of Europe, after which time he would apprentice with a merchant, or he could attend a gymnasium in preparation for attending university. Arthur chose the former option, and his witnessing firsthand on this trip the profound suffering of the poor helped shape his pessimistic philosophical worldview.
After returning from his travels, Arthur began apprenticing with a merchant in preparation for his career. When Arthur was 17 years old, his father died, most likely as a result of suicide. Upon his death, Arthur, his sister Adele, and his mother were each left a sizable inheritance. Two years following his father’s death, with the encouragement of his mother, Schopenhauer freed himself of his obligation to honor the wishes of his father, and he began attending a gymnasium in Gotha. He was an extraordinary pupil: he mastered Greek and Latin while there, but was dismissed from the school for lampooning a teacher.
In the meantime his mother, who was by all accounts not happy in the marriage, used her newfound freedom to move to Weimar and become engaged in the social and intellectual life of the city. She met with great success there, both as a writer and as a hostess, and her salon became the center of the intellectual life of the city with such luminaries as Johann Wolfgang von Goethe, the Schlegel brothers (Karl Wilhelm Friedrich and August Wilhelm), and Christoph Martin Wieland regularly in attendance. Johanna’s success had a bearing on Arthur’s future, for she introduced him to Goethe, which eventually led to their collaboration on a theory of colors. At one of his mother’s gatherings, Schopenhauer also met the Orientalist scholar Friedrich Majer, who stimulated in Arthur a lifelong interest in Eastern thought. At the same time, Johanna and Arthur never got along well: she found him morose and overly critical and he regarded her as a superficial social climber. The tensions between them reached its peak when Arthur was 30 years old, at which time she requested that he never contact her again.
Before his break with his mother, Arthur matriculated to the University of Göttingen in 1809, where he enrolled in the study of medicine. In his third semester at Göttingen, Arthur decided to dedicate himself to the study of philosophy, for in his words: “Life is an unpleasant business… I have resolved to spend mine reflecting on it.” Schopenhauer studied philosophy under the tutelage of Gottlieb Ernst Schultz, whose major work was a critical commentary of Kant’s system of transcendental idealism. Schultz insisted that Schopenhauer begin his study of philosophy by reading the works of Immanuel Kant and Plato, the two thinkers who became the most influential philosophers in the development of his own mature thought. Schopenhauer also began a study of the works of Friedrich Wilhelm Joseph von Schelling, of whose thought he became deeply critical.
Schopenhauer transferred to Berlin University in 1811 for the purpose of attending the lectures of Johann Gottlieb Fichte, who at the time was considered the most exciting and important German philosopher of his day. Schopenhauer also attended Friedrich Schleiermacher’s lectures, for Schleiermacher was regarded as a highly competent translator and commentator of Plato. Schopenhauer became disillusioned with both thinkers, and with university intellectual life in general, which he regarded as unnecessarily abstruse, removed from genuine philosophical concerns, and compromised by theological agendas.
Napoleon’s Grande Armee arrived in Berlin in 1813, and soon after Schopenhauer moved to Rudolstat, a small town near Weimar, in order to escape the political turmoil. There Schopenhauer wrote his doctoral dissertation, The Fourfold Root of the Principle of Sufficient Reason, in which he provided a systematic investigation of the principle of sufficient reason. He regarded his project as a response to Kant who, in delineating the categories, neglected to attend to the forms that ground them. The following year Schopenhauer settled in Dresden, hoping that the quiet bucolic surroundings and rich intellectual resources found there would foster the development of his philosophical system. Schopenhauer also began an intense study of Baruch Spinoza, whose notion of natura naturans, a notion that characterized nature as self-activity, became key to the formulation of his account of the will in his mature system.
During his time in Dresden, he wrote On Vision and Colors, the product of his collaboration with Goethe. In this work, he used Goethe’s theory as a starting point in order to provide a theory superior to that of his mentor. Schopenhauer’s relationship with Goethe became strained after Goethe became aware of the publication. During his time in Dresden, Schopenhauer dedicated himself to completing his philosophical system, a system that combined Kant’s transcendental idealism with Schopenhauer’s original insight that the will is the thing-in-itself. He published his major work that expounded this system, The World as Will and Representation, in December of 1818 (with a publication date of 1819). To Schopenhauer’s chagrin, the book made no impression on the public.
In 1820, Schopenhauer was awarded permission to lecture at the University of Berlin. He deliberately, and impudently, scheduled his lectures during the same hour as those of G.W.F. Hegel, who was the most distinguished member of the faculty. Only a handful of students attended Schopenhauer’s lectures while over 200 students attended the lectures of Hegel. Although he remained on the list of lecturers for many years in Berlin, no one showed any further interest in attending his lectures, which only fueled his contempt for academic philosophy.
The following decade was perhaps Schopenhauer’s darkest and least productive. Not only did he suffer from the lack of recognition that his groundbreaking philosophy received, but he also suffered from a variety illnesses. He attempted to make a career as a translator from French and English prose, but these attempts also met with little interest from the outside world. During this time Schopenhauer also lost a lawsuit to the seamstress Caroline Luise Marguet that began in 1821 and was settled five years later. Marguet accused Schopenhauer of beating and kicking her when she refused to leave the antechamber to his apartment. As a result of the suit, Schopenhauer had to pay her 60 thalers annually for the rest of her life.
In 1831, Schopenhauer fled Berlin because of a cholera epidemic (an epidemic that later took the life of Hegel) and settled in Frankfurt am Main, where he remained for the rest of his life. In Frankfurt, he again became productive, publishing a number of works that expounded various points in his philosophical system. He published On the Will in Nature in 1836, which explained how new developments in the physical sciences served as confirmation of his theory of the will. In 1839, he received public recognition for the first time, a prize awarded by the Norwegian Academy, on his essay, On the Freedom of the Human Will. In 1840 he submitted an essay entitled On the Basis of Morality to the Danish Academy, but was awarded no prize even though his essay was the only submission. In 1841, he published both essays under the title, The Fundamental Problems of Morality, and included an introduction that was little more than a scathing indictment of Danish Academy for failing to recognize the value of his insights.
Schopenhauer was able to publish an enlarged second edition to his major work in 1843, which more than doubled the size of the original edition. The new expanded edition earned Schopenhauer no more acclaim than the original work. He published a work of popular philosophical essays and aphorisms aimed at the general public in 1851 under the title, Parerga and Paralipomena (Secondary Works and Belated Observations). This work, the most unlikely of his books, earned him his fame, and from the most unlikely of places: a review written by the English scholar John Oxenford, entitled “Iconoclasm in German Philosophy,” which was translated into German. The review excited an interest in German readers, and Schopenhauer became famous virtually overnight. Schopenhauer spent the rest of his life reveling in his hard won and belated fame, and died in 1860.
Schopenhauer’s philosophy stands apart from other German idealist philosophers in many respects. Perhaps most surprising for the first time reader of Schopenhauer familiar with the writings of other German idealists would be the clarity and elegance of his prose. Schopenhauer was an avid reader of the great stylists in England and France, and he tried to emulate their style in his own writings. Schopenhauer often charged more abstruse writers such as Fichte and Hegel with deliberate obfuscation, describing the latter as a scribbler of nonsense in his second edition of The Fourfold Root of the Principle of Sufficient Reason.
Schopenhauer’s philosophy also stands in contrast with his contemporaries insofar as his system remains virtually unchanged from its first articulation in the first edition of The World as Will and Representation. Even his dissertation, which he wrote before he recognized the role of the will in metaphysics, was incorporated into his mature system. For this reason, his thought has been arranged thematically rather than chronologically below.
The starting point for Schopenhauer’s metaphysics is Immanuel Kant’s system of transcendental idealism as explained in The Critique of Pure Reason. Although Schopenhauer is quite critical of much of the content of Kant’s Transcendental Analytic, he endorses Kant’s approach to metaphysics in Kant’s limiting the sphere of metaphysics to articulating the conditions of experience rather than transcending the bounds of experience. In addition, he accepts the results of the Transcendental Aesthetic, which demonstrate the truth of transcendental idealism. Like Kant, Schopenhauer argues that the phenomenal world is a representation, i.e., an object for the subject conditioned by the forms of our cognition. At the same time, Schopenhauer simplifies the activity of the Kantian cognitive apparatus by holding that all cognitive activity occurs according to the principle of sufficient reason, that is, that nothing is without a reason for being.
In Schopenhauer’s dissertation, which was published under the title The Fourfold Root of Sufficient Reason, he argues that all of our representations are connected according to one of the four manifestations of the principle of sufficient reason, each of which concerns a different class of objects. The principle of sufficient reason of becoming, which regards empirical objects, provides an explanation in terms of causal necessity: any material state presupposes a prior state from which it regularly follows. The principle of sufficient reason of knowing, which regards concepts or judgments, provides an explanation in terms of logical necessity: if a judgment is to be true, it must have a sufficient ground. Regarding the third branch of the principle, that of space and time, the ground for being is mathematical: space and time are so constituted that all their parts mutually determine one another. Finally, for the principle regarding willing, we require as a ground a motive, which is an inner cause for that which it was done. Every action presupposes a motive from which it follows by necessity.
Schopenhauer argues that prior philosophers, including Kant, have failed to recognize that the first manifestation and second manifestations are distinct, and subsequently tend to conflate logical grounds and causes. Moreover, philosophers have not heretofore recognized the principle’s operation in the realms of mathematics and human action. Thus Schopenhauer was confident that his dissertation not only would provide an invaluable corrective to prior accounts of the principle of sufficient reason, but would also allow every brand of explanation to acquire greater certainty and precision.
It should be noted that while Schopenhauer’s account of the principle of sufficient reason owes much to Kant’s account of the faculties, his account is significantly at odds with Kant’s in several ways. For Kant, the understanding always operates by means of concepts and judgments, and the faculties of understanding and reason are distinctly human (at least regarding those animate creatures with which we are familiar). Schopenhauer, however, asserts that the understanding is not conceptual and is a faculty that both animals and humans possess. In addition, Schopenhauer’s account of the fourth root of the principle of sufficient reason is at odds with Kant’s account of human freedom, for Schopenhauer argues that actions follow necessarily from their motives.
Schopenhauer incorporates his account of the principle of sufficient reason into the metaphysical system of his chief work, The World as Will and Representation. As we have seen, Schopenhauer, like Kant, holds that representations are always constituted by the forms of our cognition. However, Schopenhauer points out that there is an inner nature to phenomena that eludes the principle of sufficient reason. For example, etiology (the science of physical causes) describes the manner in which causality operates according to the principle of sufficient reason, but it cannot explain the natural forces that underlie and determine physical causality. All such forces remain, to use Schopenhauer’s term, “occult qualities.”
At the same time, there is one aspect of the world that is not given to us merely as representation, and that is our own bodies. We are aware of our bodies as objects in space and time, as a representation among other representations, but we also experience our bodies in quite a different way, as the felt experiences of our own intentional bodily motions (that is, kinesthesis). This felt awareness is distinct from the body’s spatio-temporal representation. Since we have insight into what we ourselves are aside from representation, we can extend this insight to every other representation as well. Thus, Schopenhauer concludes, the innermost nature [Innerste], the underlying force, of every representation and also of the world as a whole is the will, and every representation is an objectification of the will. In short, the will is the thing in itself. Thus Schopenhauer can assert that he has completed Kant’s project because he has successfully identified the thing in itself.
Although every representation is an expression of will, Schopenhauer denies that every item in the world acts intentionally or has consciousness of its own movements. The will is a blind, unconscious force that is present in all of nature. Only in its highest objectifications, that is, only in animals, does this blind force become conscious of its own activity. Although the conscious purposive striving that the term ‘will’ implies is not a fundamental feature of the will, conscious purposive striving is the manner in which we experience it and Schopenhauer chooses the term with this fact in mind.
Hence, the title of Schopenhauer’s major work, The World as Will and Representation, aptly summarizes his metaphysical system. The world is the world of representation, as a spatio-temporal universal of individuated objects, a world constituted by our own cognitive apparatus. At the same time, the inner being of this world, what is outside of our cognitive apparatus or what Kant calls the thing-in-itself, is the will; the original force manifested in every representation.
Schopenhauer argues that space and time, which are the principles of individuation, are foreign to the thing-in-itself, for they are the modes of our cognition. For us, the will expresses itself in a variety of individuated beings, but the will in itself is an undivided unity. It is the same force at work in our own willing, in the movements of animals, of plants and of inorganic bodies.
Yet, if the world is composed of undifferentiated willing, why does this force manifest itself in such a vast variety of ways? Schopenhauer’s reply is that the will is objectified in a hierarchy of beings. At its lowest grade, we see the will objectified in natural forces, and at its highest grade the will is objectified in the species of human being. The phenomena of higher grades of the will are produced by conflicts occurring between different phenomena of the lower grades of the will, and in the phenomenon of the higher Idea, the lower grades are subsumed. For instance, the laws of chemistry and gravity continue to operate in animals, although such lower grades cannot explain fully their movements. Although Schopenhauer explains the grades of the will in terms of development, he insists that the gradations did not develop over time, for such an understanding would assume that time exists independently of our cognitive faculties. Thus in all natural beings we see the will expressing itself in its various objectifications. Schopenhauer identifies these objectifications with the Platonic Ideas for a number of reasons. They are outside of space and time, related to individual beings as their prototypes, and ontologically prior to the individual beings that correspond to them.
Although the laws of nature presuppose the Ideas, we cannot intuit the Ideas simply by observing the activities of nature, and this is due to the relation of the will to our representations. The will is the thing in itself, but our experience of the will, our representations, are constituted by our form of cognition, the principle of sufficient reason. The principle of sufficient reason produces the world of representation as a nexus of spatio-temporal, causally related entities. Therefore, Schopenhauer’s metaphysical system seems to preclude our having access to the Ideas as they are in themselves, or in a way that transcends this spatio-temporal causally related framework.
However, Schopenhauer asserts that there is a kind of knowing that is free from the principle of sufficient reason. To have knowledge that is not conditioned by our forms of cognition would be an impossibility for Kant. Schopenhauer makes such knowledge possible by distinguishing the conditions of knowing, namely, the principle of sufficient reason, from the condition for objectivity in general. To be an object for a subject is a condition of objects that is more basic than the principle of sufficient reason for Schopenhauer. Since the principle of sufficient reason allows us to experience objects as particulars existing in space and time with a causal relation to other things, to have an experience of an object solely insofar as it presents itself to a subject, apart from the principle of sufficient reason, is to experience an object that is neither spatio-temporal nor in a causal relation to other objects. Such objects are the Ideas, and the kind of cognition involved in perceiving them is aesthetic contemplation, for perception of the Ideas is the experience of the beautiful.
Schopenhauer argues that the ability to transcend the everyday point of view and regard objects of nature aesthetically is not available to most human beings. Rather, the ability to regard nature aesthetically is the hallmark of the genius, and Schopenhauer describes the content of art through an examination of genius. The genius, claims Schopenhauer, is one who has been given by nature a superfluity of intellect over will. For Schopenhauer, the intellect is designed to serve the will. Since in living organisms, the will manifests itself as the drive for self-preservation, the intellect serves individual organisms by regulating their relations with the external world in order to secure their self-preservation. Because the intellect is designed to be entirely in service of the will, it slumbers, to use Schopenhauer’s colorful metaphor, unless the will awakens it and sets it in motion. Therefore ordinary knowledge always concerns the relations, laid down by the principle of sufficient reason, of objects in terms of the demands of the will.
Although the intellect exists only to serve the will, in certain humans the intellect accorded by nature is so disproportionately large, it far exceeds the amount needed to serve the will. In such individuals, the intellect can break free of the will and act independently. A person with such an intellect is a genius (only men can have such a capability according to Schopenhauer), and this will-free activity is aesthetic contemplation or creation. The genius is thus distinguished by his ability to engage in will-less contemplation of the Ideas for a sustained period of time, which allows him to repeat what he has apprehended by creating a work of art. In producing a work of art, the genius makes the beautiful accessible for the non-genius as well. Whereas non-geniuses cannot intuit the Ideas in nature, they can intuit them in a work of art, for the artist replicates nature in the artwork in such a manner that the viewer is capable of viewing it disinterestedly, that is, freed from her own willing, as an Idea.
Schopenhauer states that aesthetic contemplation is characterized by objectivity. The intellect in its normal functioning is in the service of the will. As such, our normal perception is always tainted by our subjective strivings. The aesthetic point of view, since it is freed from such strivings, is more objective than any other ways of regarding an object. Art does not transport the viewer to an imaginary or even ideal realm. Rather it affords the opportunity to view life without the distorting influence of his own will.
Any account of human agency in Schopenhauer must be given in terms of his account of the will. For Schopenhauer, all acts of will are bodily movements, and thus are not the internal cause of bodily movements. What distinguishes an act of will from other events, which are also expressions of the will, is that it meets two criteria: it is a bodily movement caused by a motive, and it is accompanied by a direct awareness of this movement. Schopenhauer provides both a psychological and physiological account of motives. In his psychological account, motives are causes that occur in the medium of cognition, or internal causes. Motives are mental events that arise in response to an awareness of some motivating object. Schopenhauer argues that these mental events can never be desires or emotions: desires and emotions are expressions of the will and thus are not included under the class of representations. Rather, a motive is the awareness of some object of representation. These representations can be abstract; thinking the concept of an object, or intuitive; perceiving an object. Thus Schopenhauer provides a causal picture of action, and it is one in which mental events cause physical events.
In Schopenhauer’s physiological account of motives, motives are brain processes that cause certain neural activities and these translate into bodily motion. The psychological and physical accounts are consistent insofar as Schopenhauer has a dual-aspect view of the mental and physical. The mental and the physical are not two causally linked realms, but two aspects of the same nature, where one cannot be reduced to or explained by the other. It is important to underscore the fact that in the physiological account, the will is not a function of the brain. Rather it is present as irritability in the muscular fibers of the whole body.
According to Schopenhauer, the will, as muscular irritability, is a continual striving for activity in general. Because this striving has no direction, it aims at all directions at once and thus produces no physical movement. However, when the nervous system provides the direction for this movement (that is, when motives act on the will), the movement is given direction and bodily movement occurs. The nerves do not move the muscles, rather they provide the occasion for the muscles’ movements.
The causal mechanism in acts of will is necessary and lawful, as are all causal relations in Schopenhauer’s view. Acts of will follow from motives with the same necessity that the motion of a billiard ball follows from its being struck. Yet this account leads to a problem concerning the unpredictability of acts: if the causal process is law governed, and if acts of will are causally determined, Schopenhauer must account for the fact that human actions are unpredictable. This unpredictability of human action, he argues, is due to the impossibility of knowing comprehensively the character of an individual. Each character is unique, and thus it is impossible to predict fully how a motive or set of motives will effect bodily motion. In addition, we usually do not know what a person’s beliefs are concerning the motive, and these beliefs influence how she will respond to it. However, if we had a full account of a person’s character as well as her beliefs, we could with scientific accuracy predict what bodily motion would result from a particular motive.
Schopenhauer distinguishes between causation that occurs through stimuli, which is mechanistic, and that which occurs through motives. Each kind of causality occurs with necessity and lawfulness. The difference between these different classifications of causes regards the commensurability and proximity of cause and the effect, not their degree of lawfulness. In mechanical causation, the cause is contiguous and commensurate to the effect, both cause and effect are easily perceived, and therefore their causal lawfulness is clear. For instance, a billiard ball must be struck in order to move, and the force in which one ball hits will be equal to the force in which the other ball moves. In stimuli, causes are proximate: there is no separation between receiving the impression and being determined by it. At the same time, cause and effect are not always commensurate: for instance, when a plant reaches up to the sun, the sun as cause makes no motion to produce the effect of the plant’s movement. In motive causality, the cause is neither proximate nor commensurate: the memory of Helen can cause whole armies to run to battle, for instance. Consequently the lawfulness in motive causality is difficult, if not impossible, to perceive.
Because human action is causally determined, Schopenhauer denies that humans can freely choose how they respond to motives. In any course of events, one and only one course of action is available to the agent, and the agent performs that action with necessity. Schopenhauer must, then, account for the fact that agents experience their own actions as contingent. Moreover, he must account for the active nature of agency, the fact that agents experience their actions as things they do and not things that happen to them.
Schopenhauer gives an explanation of the active nature of agency, but not in terms of the causal efficacy of agents. Instead, the key to accounting for human agency lies in the distinction between one’s intelligible and empirical character. Our intelligible character is our character outside of space and time, and is the original force of the will. We cannot have access to our intelligible character, as it exists outside our forms of knowing. Like all forces in nature, it is original, inalterable and inexplicable. Our empirical character is our character insofar as it manifests itself in individual acts of will: it is, in short, the phenomenon of the intelligible character. The empirical character is an object of experience and thus tied to the forms of experience, namely space, time and causality.
However, the intelligible character is not determined by these forms, and thus is free. Schopenhauer calls this freedom transcendental, as it is outside the realm of experience. Although we can have no experience of our intelligible character, we do have some awareness of the fact that our actions issue from it and thus are very much our own. This awareness accounts for our experiencing our deeds as both original and spontaneous. Thus our deeds are both events linked with other events in a lawfully determined causal chain and acts that issue directly from our own characters. Our actions can embody both these otherwise contradictory characterizations because these characterizations refer to the deeds from two different aspects of our characters, the empirical and the intelligible.
Our characters also explain why we attribute moral responsibility to agents even though acts are causally necessitated. Characters determine the consequences that motives effect on our bodies. Yet, states Schopenhauer, our characters are entirely our own: our characters are fundamentally what we are. This is why we assign praise or blame not to acts but to the agents who commit them. And this is why we hold ourselves responsible: not because we could have acted differently given who we are, but that we could have been different from who we are. Although there is not freedom in our action, there is freedom in our essence, our intelligible character, insofar as our essence lies outside the forms of our cognition, that is to say, space, time and causality.
Like Kant, Schopenhauer reconciles freedom and necessity in human action through the distinction between the phenomenal and noumenal realms. However, he was sharply critical of Kant’s deontological framework. Schopenhauer charged Kant with committing a petitio principii, for he assumed at the outset of his ethics that purely moral laws and then constructed an ethics to account for such laws. Schopenhauer argues, however, that Kant provides no proof for the existence of such laws. Indeed, Schopenhauer avers that no such laws, which have their basis in theological assumptions, exist. Likewise, Schopenhauer attacks Kant’s account of morality as characterized by an unconditioned ought. The notion of ‘ought’ only carries motivational force when accompanied by the threat of sanctions. Because no ought can be unconditioned insofar as its motivational force stems from its implicit threat of punishment, all imperatives are in fact, according to Schopenhauer, hypothetical.
Nor does Schopenhauer accept Kant’s claim that morality derives from reason: like David Hume, Schopenhauer regards reason as instrumental. The origins of morality are not found in reason, but rather in the feeling of compassion that allows one to transcend the standpoint of egoism. The dictum of morality is “Harm no one and help others as much as you can.” Most persons operate exclusively from egoistic motives, for, as Schopenhauer explains, our knowledge of our own weal and woe is direct, while our knowledge of the weal and woe of others is always only representation and thus does not affect us.
Although most persons are motivated primarily by egoistic concerns, certain rare persons can act from compassion, and it is compassion that forms the basis of Schopenhauer’s ethics. Compassion is prompted by the awareness of the suffering of another person, and Schopenhauer characterizes it as a kind of felt knowledge. Compassion is born of the awareness that individuation is merely phenomenal. Consequently the ethical point of view expresses a deeper knowledge than what is found in the ordinary manner of viewing the world. Indeed, the feeling of compassion is nothing other than the felt knowledge that the suffering of another has a reality equal to one’s own suffering insofar as the world in itself is an undifferentiated unity. Schopenhauer asserts that this knowledge cannot be taught or even communicated, but can only be brought about by experience.
Since compassion is the basis of Schopenhauer’s ethics, the ethical significance of conduct is found in the motive alone, an aspect of his ethics that finds affinity with Kant. Thus Schopenhauer distinguishes the just person from the good person not by the nature of their actions, but by their level of compassion: the just person sees through the principle of individuation enough to avoid causing harm to another, whereas the good person sees through it even further, to the point that the suffering he sees in others touches him almost as closely as does his own. Such a person not only avoids harming others, but actively tries to alleviate the suffering of others. At its highest point, someone may recognize the suffering of others with such clarity that he is willing to sacrifice his own well-being for the sake of others, if by doing so the suffering he will alleviate outweighs the suffering he must endure. This, says Schopenhauer, is the highest point in ethical conduct.
Schopenhauer’s pessimism is the most well known feature of his philosophy, and he is often referred to as the philosopher of pessimism. Schopenhauer’s pessimistic vision follows from his account of the inner nature of the world as aimless blind striving.
Because the will has no goal or purpose, the will’s satisfaction is impossible. The will objectifies itself in a hierarchy of gradations from inorganic to organic life, and every grade of objectification of the will, from gravity to animal motion, is marked by insatiable striving. In addition, every force of nature and every organic form of nature participates in a struggle to seize matter from other forces or organisms. Thus existence is marked by conflict, struggle and dissatisfaction.
The attainment of a goal or desire, Schopenhauer continues, results in satisfaction, whereas the frustration of such attainment results in suffering. Since existence is marked by want or deficiency, and since satisfaction of this want is unsustainable, existence is characterized by suffering. This conclusion holds for all of nature, including inanimate natures, insofar as they are at essence will. However, suffering is more conspicuous in the life of human beings because of their intellectual capacities. Rather than serving as a relief from suffering, the intellect of human beings brings home their suffering with greater clarity and consciousness. Even with the use of reason, human beings can in no way alter the degree of misery we experience; indeed, reason only magnifies the degree to which we suffer. Thus all the ordinary pursuits of mankind are not only fruitless but also illusory insofar as they are oriented toward satisfying an insatiable, blind will.
Since the essence of existence is insatiable striving, and insatiable striving is suffering, Schopenhauer concludes that nonexistence is preferable to existence. However, suicide is not the answer. One cannot resolve the problem of existence through suicide, for since all existence is suffering, death does not end one’s suffering but only terminates the form that one’s suffering takes. The proper response to recognizing that all existence is suffering is to turn away from or renounce one’s own desiring. In this respect, Schopenhauer’s thought finds confirmation in the Eastern texts he read and admired: the goal of human life is to turn away from desire. Salvation can only be found in resignation.
U. S. A.
Last updated: May 11, 2011 | Originally published: