Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Alfred Schutz (1899—1959)

Alfred Schutz philosophized about social science in a broad signification of the word. He was deeply respectful of actual scientific practice, and produced a classification of the sciences; explicated methodological postulates for empirical science in general and the social sciences specifically; and clarified basic concepts for interpretative sociology in particular. His work shows how philosophy of the cultural sciences can be done phenomenologically.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Works
  2. Phenomenological Philosophy of the Social Sciences
  3. References and Further Reading

1. Life and Works

Alfred Schutz was born in Vienna in 1899. Like Ludwig Wittgenstein and Karl Popper, and Edmund Husserl, Sigmund Freud, and Franz Brentano before them, he came from the last phase of the Austro-Hungarian Empire. He was an only child in an upper-middle-class Austrian Jewish family and had a strong mother. In his youth he attended a classical Gymnasium in Vienna and developed a lifelong interest in music. After his serving in World War I, he received his doctorate in the philosophy of law at Vienna under Hans Kelsen in three years; studied marginal-utility economics; and became interested in the interpretative (verstehende) sociology of Max Weber. His initial attempt to ground the social sciences in the philosophy of Henri Bergson not proving satisfactory, he was led late in the 1920s by his friend Felix Kaufmann to study Edmund Husserl’s Vorlesungen zur Phänomenologie des inneren Zeitbewusstsein (1928) and Formale und transzendentale Logik (1929) and, on that basis, committed himself to phenomenology for the rest of his life.

Schutz completed Der sinnhafte Aufbau der sozialen Welt in 1932. On the recommendation of Tomoo Otaka as well as Kaufmann, he sent a copy to Husserl, who invited him to Freiburg and soon asked him to become his assistant. It was necessary, however, for Schutz to continue his career as a banking executive in order to support his family. Husserl called him an executive by day and a phenomenologist by night. He visited Husserl often until the latter’s death in 1938 and continued to write essays, especially in the philosophy of economics. After the Nazi Anschluss, he helped many others flee the Nazis; he himself moved first to Paris and then to New York, where he continued to work in a private banking firm. Soon he also began teaching sociology and eventually philosophy in the evenings at the Graduate Faculty of Political and Social Science of the New School for Social Research. His correspondence with Aron Gurwitsch well documents his thinking from 1939 until 1959, when he died. Schutz published dozens of essays in the United States and began working toward a second book during his last decade. Before his death, however, he was only able to outline an arrangement of passages from various essays, eventually fleshed out by Thomas Luckmann in two volumes. But Schutz had also managed to plan several volumes of Collected Papers that his widow and two other students quickly edited after his death. Moreover, translations of the Aufbau into English as well as it and volumes of papers into a number of Western and Asian languages began in the 1960s. His quite extensive, international, and multidisciplinary influence is still growing within and beyond philosophy. His oeuvre also continues to reward close study. Volume IV of his papers has recently been published, Volume V is planned, a Werkausgabe has begun to appear in German, and there are Schutz archives at Yale University, Konstanz University in Germany, and Waseda University in Japan. Several international conferences were held in the centennial year of 1999, and there is even a video of his life and work.

2. Phenomenological Philosophy of the Social Sciences

If phenomenology is comprehended in the strict signification now sometimes qualified as Husserlian, there can be no doubt that Alfred Schutz is the preeminent phenomenological philosopher of the social sciences. But such a characterization needs to be comprehended carefully. “Philosophy” in this connection as well as “social science” have somewhat distinctive significations for him.

In his 1932 book Schutz lists not only economics, jurisprudence, sociology, and political science, but also biography and the histories of art, economics, music, philosophy, and politics (and implicitly archaeology) as “Sozialwissenschaften.” This may reflect Austrian views early in the last century, but in his American period he similarly lists cultural anthropology, economics, history, law, linguistics, sociology, and the sciences of mythology and religion. This list can seem odd today because the historical sciences and jurisprudence are not usually considered social sciences, at least in the United States. A broader title seems necessary. In the Austrian writings, “Geisteswissenschaften” is used as an alternative for what can be called “the social sciences in the broad signification,” and this has been rendered as “human sciences” in recent translations. Another expression, “Kulturwissenschaften,” is, however, rather prominent in the original German of “Phenomenology and the Social Sciences” of 1940, the manifesto written at the time of his transition to his new country; it even occurs in the original title. “Cultural science” might be preferred as an alternative to “social science” in the broad signification. Moreover, “Wissenschaft,” usually translated as “science,” is not confined in German thought to explanatory disciplines based on experimentation and sensuous perception. One gets the most from studying Schutz if one bears in mind that his philosophy of the cultural sciences is concerned with all of the above listed disciplines. In Austria Schutz used forms of “Wissenschaftstheorie,” including “Theorie der Sozialwissenschaften,” to characterize his work; in the United States he initially used “methodology and epistemology” to render “Wissenschaftslehre,” but later preferred “theory of the social sciences.” The expression “philosophy of the social sciences” does not occur in his oeuvre, perhaps because it had not yet been coined in his time. In Schutz’s theory of science or “science theory,” as it might also be called (although this is not his expression), the concern is emphatically with the basic concepts and postulates of scientific thinking per se. What is particularly interesting about Schutz’s position, is, however, his recognition that the cultural or social scientists regularly reflect on those same themes, i.e., that they too engage in science theory. This makes discussions of basic concepts and methodology between scientists and philosophers possible. Schutz was especially impressed by Max Weber’s science theory, he found some science-theoretical reflections in Hans Kelsen’s pure theory of law, and he unsuccessfully sought a discussion of science-theoretical issues with the sociologist Talcott Parsons. He did succeed in having such discussions with some “Austrian school” economists, including Fritz Machlup, Friedrich A. Hayek, and Ludwig von Mises. He recognized, however, that science-theoretical reflections by scientists tend to be limited by the needs of the particular disciplines and hence seldom reach a fully philosophical level. Schutz’s project as a philosopher was then to reflect on the practices of the cultural sciences, asking intelligent questions and learning from the scientists themselves, and then interpreting for them what they do, thereby possibly eliminating some difficulties in the foundations of the edifice of science that they seldom inspect. Schutz’s approach can be called a “gentle prescriptivism,” which may be why his thought has been very well received in a score of non-philosophical disciplines concerned with aspects of the sociocultural world. “Theory of science” can be an inclusionary title, while “philosophy” in this age of hyperspecialization is often exclusionary, with the consequence that efforts by cultural scientists to reflect on their own disciplines are not taken seriously by philosophers. Schutz’s Aufbau is a masterpiece in Wissenschaftslehre regarding interpretative sociology and begins with an examination of the sociologist Max Weber’s science-theoretical reflections on that science. Probably because he taught only sociology in the early years, had prominent students in that discipline (e.g., Thomas Luckmann), and had a will to communicate with scientists, Schutz is sometimes characterized as a “phenomenological sociologist.” But he also taught philosophy, including students such as Maurice Natanson, and nearly all of his publications are clearly philosophical scholarship or investigations. When his New School colleague Leo Strauss once praised him as “a philosophically sophisticated sociologist,” Schutz responded that he preferred to be considered “a sociologically sophisticated philosopher.” Finally, it is crucial to recognize that Schutz’s philosophy of the social sciences is phenomenological. This signifies that he reflectively analyzes how sociocultural objects are constructed with meaning in everyday life, largely with concepts found in ordinary language and thereby open to interpretation. More will be said about this presently, but it deserves mention at this point that he characterized his approach in terms of what Husserl called “constitutive phenomenology of the natural attitude.” Schutz appears to have considered this sufficient for his science-theoretical purposes, even though he also understood transcendental phenomenology clearly. His objections to positivism aside, there are three main themes to Schutz’s philosophy of the social sciences: defining their region, clarifying their categories, and articulating their postulates. In the first place, there is the problem of the delimitations of the realm of the social sciences in both the broad and the narrow significations. Schutz held that all science is theoretical and requires entry into the preconstituted subuniverse of a discipline. “On Multiple Realities” (1945)—perhaps his most famous essay—is devoted to contrasting the theoretical and practical attitudes, phantasy and dream being considered along the way. In other texts he offers a taxonomy of the positive sciences. Except to agree with Husserl on the unification of all sciences by formal logic, Schutz has little to say about the formal sciences. This and his opposition to positivism may have led some to believe that he opposed mathematization in the cultural sciences, but he clearly accepted it in economics, arguably the most mathematized social science, and could easily have accepted it elsewhere as well. On the assumption of an implicit distinction between sciences of content and sciences of form, the “contentual sciences,” as they might be called, are, for Schutz, of two kinds, the naturalistic and the cultural. Against much philosophy of science, especially in the Anglo-American world, Schutz agreed with Dilthey and Husserl before him, and later with others such as Gurwitsch, on the priority of the cultural over the naturalistic sciences. This is because when first theorized about, the world is concretely cultural, i.e., it is always already interpreted on the common-sense level of everyday life and ordinary language. While one can then immediately engage in cultural science, a further type abstraction is needed in order to distinguish nature from the rest of the cultural world and engage in naturalistic science. The abstraction from the common-sense interpretation by which the subject matter of the naturalistic sciences is constituted can become deeply habitual and traditional in philosophers as well as scientists. But because of this abstraction, the nature obtained hardly “comes naturally” to us, and the sciences in which aspects of it are thematized can be called “naturalistic,” although Schutz did not use this expression. (It may also now be clearer why “cultural science” can be preferred for the sciences that thematize aspects of the original and concrete cultural world.) And Schutz believed, by the way, that there was more to be learned about human knowledge from the cultural than from the naturalistic sciences—behaviorists, for example, being unable to account for how they themselves ca even practice science. As might have been suspected when the broad signification of social or, better, cultural science was introduced above, some specification of this kind of science is called for. Unfortunately, Schutz does not discuss psychology as a cultural science, but he does distinguish the social sciences in what can be called the narrow signification from the historical sciences. His position is that the world of others has three basic regions, that of “contemporaries,” who are alive at the same time with a given member or group, the scientist included, that of “predecessors,” who are dead; and that of “successors,” who are yet to be born. Predecessors can influence contemporaries by writing wills, for example, and successors can similarly be influenced by contemporaries (and predecessors). Successors cannot be understood, however, since there is nothing yet to understand, and predecessors can be understood through texts, traces, and oral tradition. Only for contemporaries is mutual influencing and understanding possible. “Consociates” make up a subset of contemporaries who can reciprocally as well as unilaterally understand and influence one another within a shared place as well as in the shared time of all contemporaries. The social sciences in the narrow signification are then about contemporaries and the historical sciences are about predecessors. But the rise of “contemporary history” has made this division problematical. Since Schutz accepted the universes of the sciences as they are defined by the scientific communities concerned, it is likely that he would have accepted that contemporary history is history, although it is not clear how he might have corrected his original position on the difference of the historical from the social sciences in the narrow signification. Perhaps the historical sciences are different because they extend their explanations beyond the realm of contemporaries into that of predecessors, while social sciences confine their explanations to the realm of contemporaries, but Schutz does not state or imply this. The second theme of Schutz’s theory of the cultural sciences is the clarification of the categories or “basic concepts” of the sciences. To show what this is about, it is most efficient merely to quote the list on the first page of Schutz’s Aufbau of the basic concepts of interpretative sociolology that he then attempts to clarify in his book: “the interpretation of one’s own and others’ experiences, meaning-establishment and meaning-interpretation, symbol and symptom, motive and project, meaning-adequacy and causal adequacy, and, above all, the nature of ideal-typical concept formation.” Investigation beyond Schutz’s work should pursue similar concepts in other disciplines, beginning from the science-theoretical reflections of the scientists themselves while always being prepared to go further. The third theme of Schutz’s philosophy or theory of the social or cultural sciences is methodology in a narrow signification. It is about rules of procedure, which are articulated with “postulates.” These are to be obtained by reflective observation and analysis of actual scientific practice, then reported back to the scientists whose practice they explicate. A complete interpretation of Schutz’s thought in this respect has yet to be published. Besides those postulates included in the several lists, the moves, for example, of abstracting nature from the rest of the sociocultural world in the naturalistic sciences and of using individual action as a starting point in the cultural sciences are explicitly said to be postulates, while the requirement of adopting a theoretical attitude is only implicitly a postulate for all science. Schutz recognized that there were many more postulates yet to be explicated from scientific practice. But five can be mentioned here, three for the empirical sciences in general and two for specifically social or cultural science. In all empirical sciences, naturalistic as well as cultural, (1) all terms are to be as clear and distinct as possible; (2) propositions are to be consistent and compatible within and between particular disciplines; and (3) all scientific thought is to be derived directly or indirectly from tested observation. (In the naturalistic sciences this observation is sensuous, but in the cultural sciences it is chiefly interpretation of statements by informants.) In the cultural sciences specifically, (4) there is the postulate of subjective meaning or interpretation, which Schutz has from Max Weber. By this postulate, models of aspects of the sociocultural world, which are scientific constructs about common-sense constructs, must ultimately refer to the subjective meaning of the actor on the social scene. The actor alone knows her purpose, where her action begins and ends, what its stages are, and afterward how well she has succeeded. When a surgeon decides not to operate, that too is an action. The partner in an interaction is next most cognizant of but still not privy to what can also be called the “insider interpretation” of the action by the actor. Then come the other “outsider interpretation,” so to speak, those of the observer in everyday life, followed by that of the cultural scientist, and finally that of the science theorist, who is thus at four removes from the originally meaningful action. (5) By the postulate of adequacy, the account produced by the cultural scientist must be understandable by the actor or group reflected on. This recourse to the informant(s) after the fact of scientific interpretation is similar to Schutz’s philosophical recourse to the science-theoretical analyses produced by the cultural scientists themselves, just as the attitude of the scientist is similar to that of the observer in everyday life. There are subsidiary components to Schutz’s theory of the cultural sciences, such as the recognition of schools of thought within disciplines, but the foregoing should suffice to prepare the reader to study his oeuvre. But something can also be said about areas in which his thinking has been and/or needs to be extended. In the first place, while there is considerable focus on the particular sciences of economics and sociology, the scope of Schutz’s science theory is clearly much broader. If this is recognized, then it is also clear that philosophers inspired by his work could engage in discussions with scientists of other disciplines (e.g., archaeologists), seeking to define the discipline, to clarify its basic concepts, and to explicate postulates for them. In the second place, while Schutz is emphatic that the constructs produced in the cultural sciences are constructs of a second level that are about the constructs of the first level, which is that of common sense and ordinary language, he did not ask what the constructs of the primary level are themselves about. This is undoubtedly because in everyday life a conceptualization of objects automatically occurs that is perhaps most obvious in how names come to mind (or awkwardly fail to do so) when one encounters objects. In addition, the words “meaning” and “significance” can shed more shadow than light. If one abstracts from such conceptualization, however, one can observe that cultural objects already have values and uses that are not conceptual meanings bestowed on sheerly physical things, but original determinations of the objects that such conceptual meanings are bestowed upon and that ordinary language refers to. Consequently, two abstractions are actually needed to reach the nature thematized in the naturalistic sciences. This is not to reject Schutz’s interpretationism, but it is to assert that cultural objects, situations, and worlds are cultural by virtue of values and uses that are not reducible to conceptual meaning-bestowal and categorial formation. In the third place, Schutz’s great emphasis is on theoretical science, but there are also the so-called “applied sciences,” such as nursing and psychiatry, which are deserving of great attention from philosophers, and one can explore how Schutz’s science theory can be extended to include such disciplines. These practical disciplines are perhaps better characterized as “science-based” rather than “applied” because rarely is only one science applied in them; instead, the practitioners select what suits their purposes from various theoretical disciplines and unhesitatingly engage in theoretical research themselves where it is needed. Finally, a comparative study of Schutz’s theory of the cultural sciences, which does emphasize the social sciences in the narrow signification, with the theory of the interpretation and critique of texts and traces—i.e., hermeneutics, which can be said to emphasize the historical sciences—should shed light on both and perhaps lead toward a more balanced and complete theory of the cultural sciences in general. Overall, Alfred Schutz’s work is a model for the philosophical analysis of science that begins from reflective observation on scientific practices as relating to the objects of their provinces and, correlatively, on such objects as theorized about and observed in those practices.

3. References and Further Reading

  • Alfred Schutz Aron Gurwitsch Briefwechsel 1939-1959. Ed. Richard Grathoff. Munich: Wilhelm Fink, 1985. English translation: Philosophers in Exile: The Correspondence of Alfred Schutz and Aron Gurwitsch, 1939-1959. Trans. J. Claude Evans. Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 1989.
  • “Choice and the Social Sciences.” Ed. Lester E. Embree. In Life-World and Consciousness: Essays for Aron Gurwitsch. Ed. Lester E. Embree, Evanston, IL: Northwestern University Press, 1972, 565-90.
  • “Husserl and His Influence on Me.” Ed. Lester Embree. The Annals of Phenomenological Sociology 2 (1977), 40-44.
  • Collected Papers, Vol. I, The Problem of Social Reality. Ed. Maurice Natanson. The Hague: Martinus Nijhoff, 1962.
  • Collected Papers, Vol. II, Studies in Social Theory, Ed. Arvid Brodersen, The Hague: Martinus Nijhoff, 1964.
  • Collected Papers, Vol. III, Studies in Phenomenological Philosophy. Ed. Ilse Schutz. The Hague: Martinus Nijhoff, 1966.
  • Collected Papers, Vol. IV. Ed. Helmut Wagner, George Psathas, and Fred Kersten, Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic Publishers, 1996.
  • “Positivistic Philosophy and the Actual Approach of Interpretative Social Science: An Ineditum of Alfred Schutz from Spring 1953.” Ed. Lester Embree. Husserl Studies 14 (1997), 123-49.
  • Reflections on the Problem of Relevance. Ed. Richard M. Zaner. New Haven: Yale University Press, 1970.
  • Der sinnhafte Aufbau der sozialen Welt [1932]. Frankfurt am Main: Suhrkamp Taschenbuch, 1974. English translation: Phenomenology of the Social World. Trans. George Walsh and Frederick Lehnert. Evanston, IL: Northwestern University Press, 1967.
  • The Theory of Social Action. Ed. Richard Grathoff. Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 1978.
  • Alfred Schutz and Thomas Luckmann, Die Strukturen der Lebenswelt, 2 vols. Neuwied: Luchterhand, 1975; Frankfurt am Main: Suhrkamp, 1953. English translation: The Structures of the Lifeworld, Vol. I. Trans. Richard M. Zaner and H. Tristram Engelhardt, Jr.; Vol. II. Trans. Richard M. Zaner and David J. Parent. Evanston, Ill: Northwestern University Press, 1973, 1989.

Author Information

Lester Embree
Florida Atlantic University

Last updated: October 13, 2004 | Originally published: