Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy

John Duns Scotus (1266–1308)

duns-ScotusJohn Duns Scotus, along with Bonaventure, Aquinas, and Ockham, is one of the four great philosophers of High Scholasticism. His work is encyclopedic in scope, yet so detailed and nuanced that he earned the epithet “Subtle Doctor,” and no less a thinker than Ockham would praise his judgment as excelling all others in its subtlety. In opposition to the prevailing thought in metaphysics that the term “being” is analogical, Scotus argues that it must be a univocal term, a view others had feared would bring an end to metaphysics and natural theology. Scotus’s novel account of universals and individuation gained a wide following and inspired brilliant counterarguments by Ockham and Thomist opponents. Despite its flaws, his argument for God’s existence, perhaps the most complicated of any ever written, is a philosophical tour de force. Scotus’s distinction between intuitive and abstractive cognition structured much of the discussion of cognition for the rest of the scholastic period. In opposition to such thinkers as Aquinas and Godfrey of Fontaines, Scotus defends a moderate voluntarism in his account of free will, a view that would be influential into the modern period.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Works
    1. Life
    2. Works
  2. The Subject of Metaphysics
  3. Distinctions
  4. Universals
  5. Individuation
  6. The Argument for God’s Existence
  7. Univocity, Metaphysics, and Natural Theology
    1. Background
    2. Problems Arising from Analogy and Equivocity
    3. Arguments for Univocity
  8. Cognition
    1. Intuitive and Abstractive Cognition
    2. Divine Illumination and Skepticism
  9. Natural Law
  10. Action Theory and Will
  11. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Texts in Latin
    2. Primary Texts in English Translation
    3. Secondary Literature

1. Life and Works

a. Life

No one knows precisely when John Duns was born, but we are fairly certain he came from the eponymous town of Duns near the Scottish border with England. He, like many other of his compatriots, was called “Scotus,” or “the Scot,” from the country of his birth. He was ordained a priest on 17 March 1291. Because his bishop had just ordained another group at the end of 1290, we can place Scotus’s birth in the first quarter of 1266, if he was ordained as early as canon law permitted. When he was a boy he joined the Franciscans, who sent him to study at Oxford, probably in 1288. He was still at Oxford in 1300, for he took part in a disputation there at some point in 1300 or 1301, once he had finished lecturing on the Sentences. Moreover, when the English provincial presented 22 names to Bishop Dalderby on 26 July 1300 for licenses to hear confessions at Oxford, Scotus’s was among them. He probably completed his Oxford studies in 1301. He was not, however, incepted as a master at Oxford, for his provincial sent him to the more prestigious University of Paris, where he would lecture on the Sentences a second time.

The longstanding rift between Pope Boniface VIII and King Philip the Fair of France would soon shake the University of Paris and interrupt Scotus’s studies. In June of 1301, Philip’s emissaries examined each Franciscan at the Parisian convent, separating the royalists from the papists. Supporters of the Pope, a slight majority that included Scotus, were given three days to leave France. Scotus returned to Paris by the fall of 1304, after Boniface had died and the new Pope, Benedict XI, had made his peace with Philip. We are not sure where Scotus spent his exile, but it seems probable that he returned to work at Oxford. Scotus also lectured at Cambridge some time after he completed his studies at Oxford, but scholars are uncertain about exactly when.

Scotus completed his Parisian studies and was incepted as a master, probably in early 1305. As regent master, he held a set of quodlibetal questions (his only set) within two years of his inception. His order transferred him to the Franciscan house of studies at Cologne, where we know he served as lector in 1307. He died the next year; the date traditionally given is 8 November. Pope John Paul II proclaimed his beatification in 1993.

b. Works

Scholars have made considerable progress in determining which of the works attributed to Scotus are genuine. Moreover, many key texts now exist in critical editions: the philosophical works in the St. Bonaventure edition, and the theological works in the Vatican edition. However, others have not yet been edited critically. The Wadding Opera omnia is not a critical edition, and the reliability of the texts varies considerably. Despite its title, Wadding’s Opera omnia does not contain quite all of Scotus’s works. Most importantly, what Wadding includes as the Paris Reportatio on Book 1 of the Sentences is actually Book 1 of the Additiones magnae, William of Alnwick’s compilation of Scotus’s thought based largely but not exclusively on his Parisian teaching. The Parisian Reportatio exists in several versions, but most of it only in manuscript. Scholars are still uncertain about the exact chronology of the works.

Early in his career, Scotus wrote a number of logical works: questions on Porphyry’s Isagoge and on Aristotle’s Categories, On Interpretation, and Sophistical Refutations. His Oxford lectures on the Sentences are recorded in his Lectura, and his disputations at Oxford are recorded in the first set of his Collations. Scotus probably began his Questions on the Metaphysics in the early stages of his career as well, but recent scholarship suggests that Scotus composed parts of this work, in particular on Books VII-IX, after he left England for Paris, and perhaps late in his career. Scotus also wrote an Expositio on Aristotle’s Metaphysics and a set of questions on Aristotle’s On the Soul, but more study is needed to determine their relationship with the rest of Scotus’s corpus.

While still at Oxford, Scotus began reworking the Lectura into his Ordinatio, a fuller, more sophisticated commentary on the Sentences. At some point, probably after writing Book 1 d.5, Scotus departed for Paris, where he continued his work on the Ordinatio, incorporating into later sections material from his Parisian lectures on the Sentences. These Parisian lectures exist only in various versions of student reports, and so are called the Reportatio Parisiensis. Scotus’s early disputations at Paris are recorded in the second set of his Collations. After his inception as master, he held one set of Quodlibetal Questions. Scotus’s Logica, which Wadding’s edition mistakenly includes as Question 1 of Quaestiones miscellaneae de formalitatibus (although Scotus wrote no such work), is a brief but important investigation of what follows from the claim that a and b are not formally identical, and supplements discussions of the formal distinction in the Reportatio and the Ordinatio. Scotus composed his famous treatise De primo principio late in his career. While it cannibalizes large chunks of the Ordinatio, it is nevertheless Scotus’s most mature treatment of the central claims of natural theology. Scholars are still uncertain whether one further work, the Theoremata, is genuine.

Scotus died just a few years after his inception, leaving behind a mass of works he had intended to complete or polish for publication. Nevertheless, he soon exercised as great an influence as any other thinker from the High Scholastic Period, including Bonaventure and Aquinas. Despite fierce opposition from many quarters, and in particular from Scotus’s admiring confrere William Ockham, the Scotist school flourished well into the seventeenth century, where his influence can be seen in such writers as Descartes and Bramhall. Interest in Scotus’s philosophy dwindled in the eighteenth century, and when nineteenth century philosophers and theologians again grew interested in scholastic thought, they generally turned to Aquinas and his followers, not to Scotus. However, the Franciscans continuously attested to Scotus’s importance, and in the twentieth century their efforts sparked a revival of interest in Scotus, which has engendered many studies of high quality as well as a critical edition of Scotus’s writing, eleven volumes of which are now in print. It remains to be seen whether Scotus’s thought will have as great an impact on contemporary philosophy as Aquinas’s or Anselm’s.

2. The Subject of Metaphysics

The medieval debate over the subject matter of metaphysics stems from various proposals in Aristotle’s Metaphysics. These include being qua being (Met. 4.1), God (Met. 6.1), and substance (Met. 7.1). The Islamic philosophers Avicenna and Averroes, powerful influences on Christian scholastic philosophy, are divided on the issue. Avicenna rejects the contention that God is the subject of metaphysics on the grounds that no science can establish the existence of its own subject, while metaphysics can demonstrate God’s existence. He argues instead that the subject of metaphysics is being qua being. We have a common notion of being applicable to God, substances, and accidents, and this notion makes possible a science of being qua being that includes God and separated substances as well as material substances and accidents. In his rejoinder to Avicenna, Averroes holds that the view that metaphysics studies being qua being amounts to the view that metaphysics studies substance and, in particular, separated substances and God. Because it is physics, and not the nobler discipline of metaphysics that establishes God’s existence, there is no bar to holding that God is the subject of metaphysics. Scotus maintains with Avicenna that metaphysics studies being qua being. Of course, among beings, God is preeminent: He is the only perfect being, the being on which all others depend. These facts explain why God occupies the most important place in metaphysics. However, what makes God a proper subject for metaphysics is not that he is God, but that he is a being. Metaphysics also includes the study of the transcendentals, which “transcend” the Aristotelian scheme of the categories. The transcendentals include being, the proper attributes of being (“one,” “true,” and “good” are transcendental terms, because they are coextensive with “being,” each signifying one of being’s proper attributes), and what is signified by disjunctions that are coextensive with “being,” such as “finite or infinite” and “necessary or contingent.” However, anything capable of real existence also falls under the heading of “being qua being” and so may be studied in metaphysics.

3. Distinctions

On Scotus’s view, in order to have an accurate grasp of the structure of created reality and the nature of God, and in order to answer such questions as what individuates substances or how a God with multiple attributes can still be simple, we must first have a clear understanding of the various sorts of identity and distinction that hold among items. What follows is a brief taxonomy of four key sorts of identity and distinction, with particular emphasis on formal identity and distinction, earmarks of Scotistic philosophy. For simplicity’s sake, I will speak below only of distinction and not identity.

1. A real distinction holds between two individuals, x and y, if and only if it is logically possible either for x to exist without y or for y to exist without x. For example, Ricky the cat and Beulah the cow are really distinct, as are your hand and your foot, and a substance and its accident such as Socrates and his paleness. In these examples, either x or y in each pair can exist without the other. Even the paleness can exist without Socrates, although only by divine power. However, God and any creature are really distinct, and while God can exist without any creature, no creature can exist without God. Hence for real distinction it is not necessary that both items in the pair be able to exist without the other.

2. A conceptual distinction results from intellectual activity and does not mark any distinction in the thing itself. Rather, our intellects create distinct conceptions of what is really the same. For instance, to adapt Frege’s famous example, our concept of the Morning Star is distinct from our concept of the Evening Star, and yet the Morning Star and Evening Star are really one and the same thing: the planet Venus.

3. Scotus recognizes the need for a distinction that lies between the real and the conceptual distinction, a distinction that has a foundation in reality and so is mind-independent and yet does not imply real separability. For example, the will and the intellect are really the same, for each is really identical with and inseparable from the soul. However, the will is a free power and the intellect is not, and this is not simply a matter of the way we conceive them. Some sort of less than real but more than conceptual distinction is needed to capture this fact. Scotus calls this sort of distinction the formal distinction. What are distinguished in this case are not things (res) but what Scotus calls “formalities” or “realities” or “entities” in one and the same thing. According to Scotus, x and y are formally distinct if and only if (a) x and y are really the same and (b) x has a different ratio (account or character) than y, and (c) neither ratio overlaps the other. So, although the will and the intellect are really identical, their accounts differ and are mutually non-inclusive, and so they are formally distinct. Likewise, there is a formal distinction between the common nature and the individuator, between a genus and specific difference, between the divine attributes, and between each Person of the Trinity and the Divine Essence.

Scholars are widely agreed that in his early work, at least in the Lectura, when Scotus speaks of distinct formalities in a single thing, he means to identify items that are ontologically robust enough to serve as property bearers. Hence, Scotus can explain a single thing’s having even contradictory properties F and not-F without running afoul of the Principle of Non-Contradiction by contending that the bearer of F is a distinct formality from the bearer of not-F, although the two formalities are really identical. For instance, human nature is common both in itself and in reality, while the individuator that contracts that common nature into Socrates is individual of itself, even though in Socrates the common nature and the individuator are really the same.

In some of his Parisian works, such as the Reportatio (notably 1 d.33) and Logica, Scotus appears to grow more ontologically parsimonious, holding that formal non-identity or distinction within a single thing does not imply absolutely distinct formalities in that thing. Gelber [1974] and Adams [1976] suggest that Scotus changes his mind in response to criticisms his teaching on the formal distinction may have sustained at Paris. Scotus’s mediaeval critics, writing after his death, warned that his account would ruin the doctrine of divine simplicity if indeed it posited a plurality of formalities in God. However, it is hard to tell whether Scotus did in fact change his mind. Both the Reportatio and the Logica maintain that if x and y are formally distinct, that implies that they are not absolutely but only qualifiedly distinct, for they have only a diminished sort of distinction. It is hard to tell from what Scotus writes, however, whether this diminished distinction is sufficient for allowing qualifiedly distinct formalities to bear properties. There is also some evidence that Scotus raises the same ontological cautions about formalities in his Oxford writings (see the admittedly ambiguous Ordinatio 1 d.2 p.2 q.1-4 nn.404-8), independently of any Parisian criticism targeted at his work.

4. Scotus recognizes yet another sort of extramental distinction, one that applies to such items as the color red, which can be deeper or paler, courage, which can be stronger or weaker, and being, which can be finite or infinite. These items vary in the degree, quantity, or intensity of their perfection, that is, in their intrinsic mode. Scotus calls the distinction between such an item and its intrinsic mode a modal distinction, explaining its difference from the formal distinction by contrasting intrinsic modes with differentiae. Each differentia contracting the genus virtue (for instance) into its various species has a different formal character from its genus. However, variations in the depth of one’s courage do not create new species any more than do variations in the intensity of red, in the strength of one’s desire, or in degree of being. Pale red and deep red share the same formal character, as do slight and powerful desires for the same object; they differ only in the degree or intensity with which they exhibit this character. The modal distinction, then, is an even lesser one than the formal distinction.

4. Universals

Medieval philosophers rely heavily on ontological classificatory systems—in particular, systems inspired by Aristotle’s Categories—to show key relations among created beings and to afford us scientific knowledge of them. The individuals Socrates and Plato belong to the species human being, which in turn belongs to the genus animal. Donkeys likewise belong to the genus animal, but the difference rational divides humans from other animals. The genus animal, along with other genera such as plant, belongs to the category of substance. That much is uncontroversial. What mediaeval philosophers debate, however, is the ontological status of these genera and species. Do they exist in extramental reality, or are they merely concepts? If they do have extramental existence, what sort of existence is it? Are genera and species constituents of individuals, or are they separated from individuals? It is with these questions in mind that Scotus articulates his account of common natures. In short, he will argue that common natures such as humanity and animality really exist (although they have a “lesser” existence than individuals), that they are common both in themselves and in reality, and that they combine with individuators, which “contract” them.

The chief obstacle to accepting Scotus’s account of common natures is that his view requires us to accept that there are realites—genera and species—that have a less than numerical unity. Accordingly, Scotus offers a battery of arguments for the conclusion that not all real unity is numerical unity. In one of the stronger arguments, Scotus contends that if all real unity were numerical unity, then all real diversity would likewise be numerical diversity. However, any two numerically diverse things are, as such, equally diverse. In that case, Socrates would be just as diverse from Plato as he is from a line. Our intellects could not, then, abstract anything common from Socrates and Plato. In that case, when we apply the universal concept human being to the two of them, we would apply a mere fiction of our intellects. These absurd consequences show that numerical diversity is not the only sort, and since numerical diversity is the greatest diversity, there must be a real but less than numerical diversity and a real but less than numerical unity corresponding to it. Another argument holds that even if there were no intellects to cognize it, fire would still generate fire. The generating fire and the generated fire would have real unity of form, the sort of unity that would make this a case of univocal causation. The two instances of fire, then, have a mind-independent common nature with a less than numerical unity.

Although common natures are not in themselves individuals, since their proper unity is less than numerical, they are not in themselves universals, either. Following Aristotle, Scotus holds that what is universal is what is one in many and said of many. As Scotus understands this account, a universal F must have the indifference to be predicable in a first mode predication statement of individual Fs in such a way that the universal and each particular are identical. As Cross points out [2002], the sort of identity at work here is representational: The universal F represents each individual F equally well. Scotus contends that no common nature can be universal in this way. True, a common nature has a certain sort of indifference: It is not incompatible with any common nature that it be contracted by some individuator other than the one that does in fact contract it. However, with the exception of the Divine Essence, which is predicable of each Divine Person, only a concept has the indifference to be predicable in the way a universal is predicable.

Although Scotus originates this distinction between universals and common natures, he finds his inspiration for it in Avicenna’s famous assertion that “horseness is just horseness.” As Scotus understands this claim, common natures are indifferent to individuality or universality. Although they cannot actually exist except as individuated or as universal, they are not individuated or universal of themselves. For this reason Scotus characterizes universality and individuality as accidental to the common nature and, therefore, as needing a cause. It is the intellect that causes the common nature to be universal by conceptualizing it under the mode of universality, that is, in such a way that numerically one concept is predicable of a plurality of individuals.

This account of really existing common natures that bear a certain priority over individuals might suggest that Scotus is reworking a Platonic theory of Forms. However, Scotus distances his own account from Plato’s. For one thing, Plato holds that the Forms are the highest realities, while the particular things that participate them are lesser realities. Although Scotus admits that common natures really exist—they have their own being (esse)—because they have a less than numerical unity, they have a correspondingly diminished being. Individuals, in contrast, have numerical unity, and so their being is not diminished: The individual Socrates has more being than the common nature humanity instantiated in him. Furthermore, Plato maintains that the Forms exist independently of the individuals that participate them and of the minds that think them. On Scotus’s view, common natures exist only as constituents of individuals in extramental reality or as concepts in the mind. It is true that among the constituents of an individual, the common nature has a certain natural priority over the individuator: The nature is common not only of itself, but even in reality. Even when it forms a composition with an individuator, there is nothing incompatible about its forming a composition with a different individuator. However, this natural priority does not imply that the common nature can exist independently of its individuator, and so Scotus is correct to distinguish his account from Plato’s. Although Scotus’s important disciple Francis of Meyronnes took pains to liken Scotus’s views to Plato’s, he did so largely by interpreting Plato as a Scotist, not by interpreting Scotus as a Platonist.

5. Individuation

Humanity is a common nature instantiated in both Socrates and Plato. Socrates and Plato, in contrast, are not instantiated in anything further. Scotus calls them “individuals” and “singulars” because they cannot be divided or instantiated the way humanity is. To put the matter another way, Socrates and Plato cannot be divided into subjective parts. What explains their individuality, however, is a matter of vibrant controversy among scholastic philosophers, and Scotus comes to his own influential answer to the question by investigating the merits and flaws of his predecessors’ answers.

Many of these predecessors, such as Aquinas, explain the individuation of material and immaterial substances differently. Accordingly, Scotus begins with a critical refutation of their views on the individuation of material substances and follows this with an account of individuation, applicable to both material and immaterial creatures, that avoids the criticisms plaguing these other views. His first move is to argue that material substance is not individual on the basis of its nature. As we’ve seen (see Section 4), such natures as humanity and assinity are common and have a less than numerical unity, so there must be something besides the nature that explains the individuality of Socrates or Brownie the donkey.

That explanation, according to Henry of Ghent, Scotus’s favorite foil, is a double negation. The first negation is vertical, so to speak. If the item has no subjective parts, that is, if there is nothing further into which it can be divided in the ways that animal and human being are divisible in this Porphyrian tree


then the condition of vertical negation is satisfied. The second negation is horizontal: The item is non-identical with anything “beside” it in the same species. Because Plato and Socrates satisfy both of these conditions, they are individuals.

Scotus objects that Henry’s account is, at best, incomplete. It is true that negations can be explanatory in some cases. Pierre’s absence from the café explains why I do not see him when I arrive there, for instance. However, in the case at issue, resolving the problem requires accounting for a thing’s formal incompatibility with instantiation (having subjective parts), and only a positive feature can explain a formal incompatibility. Moreover, appealing to a double negation only moves the question at issue one stage back. If a material individual cannot be further instantiated because of the double negation, we will still not have a full answer until we discover what explains why it has this double negation, and an answer to that question must appeal to something positive.

The most common scholastic views, espoused by such influential thinkers as Thomas Aquinas, Giles of Rome, and Godfrey of Fontaines, do explain the individuation of substances by appeal to something positive, such as actual existence, quantity, or matter. Scotus heaps arguments against each of these views, but here I will recount one argument aimed equally against all three of these candidates.

Because substance is naturally prior to accident, what explains a thing’s being in any hierarchical substantial ordering must itself be in the category of substance. For instance, Plato is an individual in the species human, in the genus animal. No accident can explain any of these features. The addition of accidents to the species human, for instance, would not produce any individual human, but just an accidental union of the substance human being and those accidents. Scotus lodges largely the same criticism against the view that actual existence individuates, since actual existence too is extrinsic to any creature’s nature and, therefore, accidental to it. Finally, although matter counts as substance and not accident, Scotus’ predecessors argued that it is not matter per se, but matter marked by quantity that individuates, and so Scotus understands the theory that matter individuates as likewise holding that an accident, at least partly, explains the individuation of substance.

The critical discussion of his predecessors leads Scotus to conclude that what explains a substance’s individuation must be something positive and intrinsic to what it individuates. Moreover, it cannot be something common, since what is common can exist in something other than what it in fact exists in, while what explains individuation cannot. Finally, it must fall into the category of substance, since when the individuator is added, the substance is complete. It is the final element in a substance’s metaphysical make-up. Scotus often draws a useful analogy between the individuator and the specific difference. The specific difference rational cannot be divided, and so when it combines with the genus animal to constitute the species human being, the species is indivisible into further species. Likewise, Socrates’s individuator combines with the common nature human to constitute the individual Socrates, who cannot be instantiated. The individuator adds nothing further to his essence, which his common nature fully contains: While it makes him Socrates, it does not make him human. Although Scotus’s account of this individuator appears to remain constant in his many writings, what he calls it varies across works and even within single works. He frequently speaks of it as “the individual entity,” but also as “the individual form” and as “the haecceity.” Perhaps because of its use by C.S. Pierce, this last term has become dominant in contemporary discussions of Scotus on individuation.

6. The Argument for God’s Existence

Although God is not the object of metaphysics, he is nevertheless its goal: Proving the existence and nature of God is what metaphysics aims at. Scotus offers several versions of his proof of God’s existence, all sufficiently similar in language, structure, and strategy to be discussed together. The summary below will not do justice to this argument, perhaps the most complex in all scholastic philosophy. In what follows, the argument’s structure is broadly sketched and some details are furnished of its most important and distinctive subordinate arguments.

Scotus’s argument unfolds in four stages:

A. There is (1) a first efficient cause, (2) a preeminent being, (3) a first final cause.

B. Only one nature is first in these three ways.

C. A nature that is first in any of these ways is infinite.

D. There is only one infinite being.

Scotus’s argument begins in a distinctive way. At stage A, he incorporates various strategies his predecessors used for proving God’s existence into a stage of his single proof: (1) There is a first efficient cause that produced all else but is itself unproduced; (2) there is a preeminent being, one whose nature surpasses all others; and (3) there is a first final cause or ultimate end. At stage B, Scotus argues that a being that has any one of these three primacies will have the other two as well. At stage C, he proves that a being with any of these primacies is intensively infinite. Finally, at D he concludes that there cannot be more than one being with this triple primacy. Since Christianity identifies God as the creator of all but himself, as the being whose causal powers sustain the universe, as the preeminent nature who is infinitely good, wise, and powerful, and as the ultimate end of all things, Scotus identifies the unique being whose existence he takes himself to have proved as the Christian God.

Much of the argument’s interest lies in the subordinate arguments for A1, partly because they serve as the foundation for the rest of the proof, and partly because of their intrinsic philosophical interest. Relying on the common scholastic assumptions that (a) no being can produce itself, (b) there cannot be a circle of productive causes, and (c) every production has some cause, Scotus argues as follows:

Argument I: The Non-Modal Argument for a First Efficient Cause

1. Some being x is produced.

2. x is produced by some other being y.

3. Either y is an unproduced, first producer or is a posterior producer.

4. A series of produced producers cannot proceed interminably.

5. Therefore,
the series stops at an unproduced producer, a first efficient cause that produces independently.

Thus far, Scotus’s argument is typical of those found in scholastic philosophy. However, as he recognizes, philosophers such as Aristotle think that infinite causal series are possible, and so premise (4) appears to beg the question. Scotus’s defense of this vulnerable premise brings a clarity and articulateness to the discussion of infinite causal regression that his predecessors never could muster. Scotus concedes that there can indeed be an infinite accidentally ordered series of produced producers, but there cannot be an infinite essentially ordered series of produced producers, and this latter is all he needs to establish to reach his conclusion. In an accidentally ordered series of causes, in which A causes B and B causes C, B depends on A to bring it into existence, but it does not depend on A in order to be the cause of C. For instance, even if Ricky the cat depended on Furry to sire him, Ricky may now sire kittens himself without any causal contribution from Furry. When philosophers admitted the possibility of infinite causal regresses, it is only accidentally ordered series they had in mind. On the other hand, in an essentially ordered series of causes, B depends on A in order to be the cause of C. For instance, on the mediaeval science that Scotus accepts, a human being depends on the sun’s causal activity to generate another human.

From this key difference between accidentally and essentially ordered causal series, two further differences follow. In an accidentally ordered series, A need not act (or even exist) simultaneously with B in order for B to cause C. Furry may be long dead, and yet his son Ricky can sire kittens. In an essentially ordered series, however, A must exist and act at the very time B produces C. Secondly, in an accidentally ordered series, the causes may be of the same nature (ratio) and order (ordo), while in an essentially ordered series the causes belong to a different nature and order. After all, cause A does not simply bring B into existence, as Furry does Ricky; nor does it make a partial causal contribution, the way Brownie the donkey does when he is hitched to a wagon together with Eeyore. Cause A’s current causal contribution is what explains the fact that B is capable of causing C. However, being of a different nature and order does not imply that A is a higher sort of being than B. Because he is alive, Ricky the cat is a higher nature than the inanimate sun, even if the sun, as a more universal cause, belongs to a different order.

Scotus offers several arguments for the conclusion that there must be a first efficient cause of an essentially ordered series, all of them problematic. In one, he argues as follows:

Argument II

1. If there were an infinite series of essentially ordered causes, the totality of things effected would depend on some prior cause.

2. Nothing can be an essentially ordered cause of itself.

3. If this prior cause were part of the totality of things effected, it would be an essentially ordered cause of itself.

4. Even if there were an infinite series of essentially ordered causes, the totality of things effected would be effected by a cause outside the totality.

This argument does not purport to establish that an infinite series of essentially ordered causes is impossible, but rather that even if there were such a series, there must be a first efficient cause of that series that lies outside the series. However, without further assumptions, the argument does not quite reach its goal: It concludes not that there is a first efficient cause, but only that there is an efficient cause prior to this totality.

Scotus’s most original argument is the following:

Argument III

1. Being possessed of efficient causal power does not necessarily imply imperfection.

2. It is possible that something possesses efficient causal power without imperfection.

3. If nothing possesses efficient causal power without dependence on something prior, then nothing has efficient causal power without imperfection.

4. It is possible that some nature possesses independent efficient causal power.

5. A nature that possesses independent efficient causal power is absolutely first.

6. It is possible that there be an absolutely first efficient causal power.

Like goodness and wisdom, efficient causal power is a pure perfection, and so it is possible for something to have efficient causal power without imperfection. Because dependence is an imperfection, it is possible for something to have independent causal power. This being would not be a link in an essentially ordered series of causes, but would stand at the head of the series as absolutely first. At this stage, however, Scotus has established only the possibility of an absolutely first efficient causal power. That is because he will use this conclusion as the key premise in another version of his argument for God’s existence, in which he will try to demonstrate that an absolutely first efficient causal power actually exists.

Argument IV: The Modal Version

In another objection to what he has written so far, Scotus notes that his argument for a first efficient cause, even if sound, does not count as a genuine demonstration because its premises are merely contingent, even if they are evident. If an argument is to lead us to scientia, the highest form of knowledge, it must be demonstrative: It must contain necessary premises leading to a necessary conclusion. In reply, Scotus offers a reformulated modal argument constructed with necessarily true premises. Scotus reworks his entire non-modal argument for a first efficient cause, but he also notes that we may begin with the conclusion of Argument III:

6. It is possible that there be an absolutely first efficient causal power.

7. If a being A cannot exist from another, then if it is possible that A exist, A exists independently.

8. An absolutely first efficient cause cannot exist from another.

9. An absolutely first efficient cause exists independently.

If an absolutely first efficient cause did not in fact exist, there would be no real possibility of its existing. After all, since it is absolutely first, it is impossible for it to depend on any other cause. Because there is a real possibility of its existing, it follows that it exists of itself.

7. Univocity, Metaphysics, and Natural Theology

a. Background

Once he opts for the view that being qua being is the subject of metaphysics, Scotus argues further that the concept of being must apply univocally to anything studied by metaphysics. If the concept of being applied only equivocally to a group of objects, it would not have the unity necessary to serve as the subject of a single science. It does not help to follow the lead of Aquinas or Henry of Ghent and argue that the concept of being applies to the objects of metaphysics analogously, because in Scotus’s view, analogy is just a form of equivocity. If the concept of being applies to metaphysics’ diverse objects by analogy, in that case too metaphysics cannot be a unified science.

Scotus offers two conditions for a concept’s being univocal: (1) affirming and denying it of one and the same subject is sufficient for a contradiction, and (2) it can serve as the middle term of a syllogism. For example, we can say without contradiction that Karen’s sitting on the jury was voluntary (because she willed to go to court rather than to be fined) and that her sitting on the jury was not voluntary (because she felt pressured into service). In this case, we do not reach a contradiction because the concept voluntary is equivocal. Likewise, the syllogism

No inanimate objects are unfriendly.
Some photocopiers are unfriendly.
Therefore, Some photocopiers are animate.

reaches an absurd conclusion because the term “unfriendly” is used equivocally: While it is used literally in the first premise, it is used in a figure of speech in the second.

b. Problems Arising from Analogy and Equivocity

Scotus finds that unless the concept of being is univocal, both philosophy and natural theology come to ruin, a startling claim in light of the fact that the prevailing mediaeval view up to that time was that philosophy and theology would come to ruin if the concept of being was univocal. Mediaeval philosophers before Scotus commonly thought that the concept of being must be not univocal or equivocal, but analogical: While it is not a pure accident that it applies to such diverse items as donkeys (substances) and dispositions (stubbornness), as well as to both creatures and God, it nevertheless does not apply to these diverse items in the same way. If it did, then being would be a genus, and the various Aristotelian categories would not be fundamentally diverse, but just different species of a single genus. Aristotelian ontology, the foundation of mediaeval philosophy since Alcuin, would have to be scrapped and a new ontology developed to replace it.

The consequences for natural theology would be even direr. Without a univocal concept of being, it would be impossible to construct an a posteriori argument for God’s existence, one that took as its premises facts about the existence of finite creatures. Moreover, unless other concepts besides that of being are univocally applicable to God and creatures, then the sort of philosophical theology exemplified by Anselm and the scholastic thinkers who followed him, meant not just to establish God’s existence but to elucidate his nature, would be impossible. Their universal practice is to discover God’s nature—what God is like in himself—by determining which perfections are pure perfections, perfections that imply no limitation whatsoever. An absolutely perfect God must have all pure perfections and only pure perfections, and so any attribute implying limitation does not characterize God as he is in himself. To determine which are the pure perfections, philosophical theologians use some version of this principle, which has its roots in Anselm (Monologion 15): F is a pure perfection if and only if it is in every respect better to be F than what is incompatible with F. Accordingly, because goodness, wisdom, and power satisfy this criterion for pure perfection, while corporeality and mobility do not, God is good, wise, and powerful, but not corporeal and mobile. However, no one can use the Anselmian criterion to determine what God is like without using concepts that apply univocally to God and creatures.

Scotus explains why this is so in the course of the Ordinatio’s fourth argument for univocity. Either the account of a pure perfection is (a) proper to creatures and inapplicable to God, (b) proper to God and inapplicable to creatures, or (c) univocally applicable to God and creatures. On the first option, whatever pure perfections one discovers by the Anselmian criterion are applicable only to creatures and not to God, a view Scotus finds absurd, presumably because God would not then be the most perfect of all beings possible. The second option, however, entirely rules out using the Anselmian criterion to discover the divine nature. If pure perfections are proper to God, then we must determine which attributes are pure perfections by seeing whether or not God has them. In contrast, to use the Anselmian criterion, one first determines whether or not an attribute is a pure perfection and only then concludes whether it is applicable to God. Options (a) and (b) bring natural theology to a halt because they preclude the use of the Anselmian criterion to discover God’s nature, but no such problems arise if our concepts of pure perfections apply univocally to God and creatures.

In the generation before Scotus, Henry of Ghent, moved by many of the same considerations, had articulated his own unique solution to these problems, a solution that would form the starting point for Scotus’s discussion. On Henry’s view, the intellect can abstract from a cognition of this being, formulating two distinct, simple concepts of being: a concept of being as undetermined but naturally determinable to some sort, which applies to all creatures, and a concept of being that is undetermined and indeterminable—it is by nature unlimited—which applies uniquely to God. There cannot, however, be a single, simple concept of being applicable to all things. That is because every concept has its foundation in some reality, but because he is transcendent, God has no reality in common with creatures. Nevertheless, because these two distinct concepts are both concepts of undetermined being, our intellect cannot easily distinguish them and so conflates them into one confused concept. While this is, strictly speaking, an error, it is a fruitful error, allowing us to reason from knowledge of creatures to quidditative knowledge of God, even though God is transcendent.

We can see in Henry’s account an attempt to secure the advantages of maintaining that the concept of being is univocal without giving up the traditional view that the concept is analogical. Scotus is sympathetic to Henry’s goal. After all, if Henry were successful, then Scotus’s worries about the unity of metaphysics and the possibility of natural theology would disappear. Nevertheless, Scotus finds Henry’s view problematic because, if we accept it, we can reasonably call into question the univocal unity of any concept. If the intellect naturally conflates very close concepts, then how can we be sure that there is a unique concept human being that applies to both Socrates and Plato? There could well be two distinct concepts that we naturally conflate because of their great resemblance.

c. Arguments for Univocity

In reply, Scotus offers a barrage of arguments for univocity and disarms the objection that his view would require the dismantling of Aristotelian ontology. The first of his arguments in the Ordinatio is perhaps his most influential for establishing the univocity of being. Suppose a person P is certain of one concept, but doubtful about others. Because a single concept cannot be both certain and dubious, the concept P is certain of must be different from the ones P is doubtful of. However, P can be certain that God is a being, but in doubt about whether God is a finite or infinite being, a created or uncreated being. Therefore, this concept of being that P is certain of is different from all the other concepts (finite, infinite, created, and uncreated being), but included in them and therefore univocal (Ord. 1 d.3 p.1 q.1-2 n.27). Our concepts of radically diverse beings, such as God and creatures, substances and accidents, still must contain as a component a univocal concept of being. However, this does not imply that these beings are simply species of a single common genus. Instead, finite and infinite are intrinsic modes of being (see Section 3 above), not differences dividing it, and so it does not follow that there is any nature common to God and creature. Nor is finite being in turn a genus and the categories its species. Each category is fundamentally diverse, with substance prior to all non-substance categories (Ord 1 d.3 p.1 q.3 n.164). Despite this diversity, our concept of each category includes a univocal concept of being as a component.

Scotus can use this same argument to show the univocity of other concepts besides being, such as goodness, wisdom, and power, which are likewise attributed to God. The universal practice of natural theology, that is, metaphysical inquiry about God, confirms the argument’s conclusion by showing that natural theologians are committed to univocity. First, they apply the Anselmian criterion to discover which notions are applicable to God, a criterion whose use, as we have seen, already presupposes univocity. Once they have formed a list (for example, goodness, wisdom, power, happiness), they remove the imperfection connected with these notions in the case of creatures. Finally, they ascribe to these notions the highest degree of perfection and attribute them to God. What is important, however, is that throughout this process the formal notions remain the same whether applied to creatures or to God.

Scotus’s arguments for univocity do not rule out the possibility of analogical predication. In addition to a univocal concept of wisdom applicable to both God and intellectual creatures, there is a concept of wisdom proper to intellectual creatures, which specifies wisdom as finite and qualitative, and a concept of wisdom proper to God, which specifies wisdom as formally infinite. The two concepts are constructed of a plurality of components, some of which diverge, but each contains this identical component: the simple, univocal concept of wisdom. The same will be true of all analogical concepts: They will diverge in some of their components, but at their root will lie a simple, univocal component that they share. We can see how the concepts diverge only after we have noted what they have in common. Hence, although analogy is possible, it is possible only because of univocity.

We might worry that Scotus’s teaching on univocity threatens the traditional religious doctrine of divine transcendence, a doctrine Scotus himself endorses. According to that doctrine, God is wholly different from creatures, having no reality in common with them. However, Scotus’s teaching on univocity seems to imply that God and creatures have absolute perfections in common, since such predicates as “good,” “wise,” and “being” are attributable to God and creatures in the same way and the same sense. Scotus replies to the objection about divine transcendence by reminding us that his remarks on univocity constitute not a metaphysical doctrine, but a logical one. The metaphysical divide between God and creatures is a radical one, for God and creatures have no reality in common. God’s absolute perfections, such as his being, wisdom, and goodness, which are infinite, are utterly diverse from ours, which are finite. However, by removing from our concepts of absolute perfections those features that make them proper to God or proper to creatures, such as the modes finite or infinite, we can form “incomplete” concepts of absolute perfections univocally applicable to both God and creatures. The formation of such concepts, therefore, does not impugn divine transcendence.

8. Cognition

a. Intuitive and Abstractive Cognition

Scotus distinguishes two sorts of cognition. Cognition of a thing insofar as it actually exists and is present is intuitive cognition, while cognition of a thing that abstracts from actual existence is abstractive cognition. Some sensory cognitions are abstractive, as when one daydreams about pears ripe for the picking. This cognition conveys no information about the way any actual pears are. Other sensory cognitions are intuitive, as when one sees, smells, or touches a pear ripe on the tree. This cognition does convey information about these actually existing pears. More interesting, however, is Scotus’s application of this distinction to intellectual acts. We clearly have intellectual abstractive cognition. When the sensory powers furnish it with phantasms, the intellect can understand the natures of things, and that sort of understanding in turn makes scientific knowledge possible. However, one can have abstractive cognitions, even scientific knowledge of, saber-toothed cats and dodo birds without the slightest idea that they do not actually exist.

Do human beings also have intellectual intuitive cognitions? Sometimes Scotus seems hesitant to admit that we do; after all, in this life, at any rate, human beings cognize things intellectually through phantasms. However, in many passages he argues that we regularly cognize things intuitively. After all, if we did not have an intuitive cognition of things as actually existing, how could we reason about the particular objects around us? Moreover, since my intellectual acts are not directly accessible to my senses, the only way I could know them without reasoning inductively from their effects is by intuitive cognition. Finally, appealing to the principle that whatever a lower power can do, a higher power can also do, Scotus concludes that, because sensory powers are capable of both intuitive and abstractive cognition, so is the intellect. Scholars disagree about whether Scotus’s apparently conflicting claims about intuitive cognition can be reconciled, with Day [1947] arguing for consistency, Wolter [1990a] contending that Scotus changes his views over time, and Pasnau [2003] opting for inconsistency. Despite the problems about what Scotus in fact thinks, the distinction between intuitive and abstractive cognition itself exercised an enormous influence, most notably on Ockham, but on nearly all subsequent scholastic discussions of cognition, especially those devoted to certainty and skepticism.

b. Divine Illumination and Skepticism

At the end of the thirteenth century, the theory of divine illumination still had its defenders, although fewer and fewer. The theory had been widely accepted, thanks to Augustine’s many and powerful arguments in its favor. Even early in his career, Augustine had argued that purely natural processes cannot result in knowledge. A teacher’s discourse can lead us to true beliefs, but knowledge requires something further: One must “see” that what the teacher says is true, a sort of justification available only through God’s special illumination of the mind. Augustine’s arguments exerted their influence for more than eight centuries, despite opposition from such formidable opponents as Aquinas, who contends at the very least that no special divine illumination is necessary for knowledge. The illumination theory’s last able defender is Henry of Ghent, whose influential writings kept the theory alive until Scotus wielded his pen against it.

Henry argues that our cognition of things would fall short of certainty without God’s special illumination, for two reasons. First, when we cognize things intellectually by purely natural processes, our cognition stems from an exemplar that is itself changeable. With a changeable basis, our cognition must likewise be changeable and so not certain. Second, the other basis of our cognition, the human soul, is likewise changeable and therefore fallible. We can attain certain knowledge, therefore, only if we have access to the unchangeable, uncreated exemplar, which only God can grant by a special illumination.

Scotus offers some brief but influential objections to Henry’s version of the theory. Henry maintains that what is in the soul as a subject is mutable, even its own act of intellection; but if that is the case, then an illuminated intellection is itself mutable. In that case, even divine illumination fails to preserve the soul from error. Moreover, Henry contends that created as well as uncreated exemplars play a role in producing certain knowledge. However, because the created exemplar is incompatible with certainty, adding an uncreated exemplar does not achieve certainty any more than adding necessary premises to contingent ones in an argument results in a necessary conclusion.

These negative arguments take aim at Henry’s version of the theory of illumination in particular, not against any and every version of the theory. However, Scotus did considerable damage to any future attempts to formulate a divine illumination theory by undercutting its motivation. On his view, we do not need a theory of illumination to show that certain knowledge is possible. The human intellect, by purely natural processes, can attain it, and in four sorts of cases:

1. We can have certain knowledge of principles because they are self-evident through their terms. As long as one grasps the meaning of the terms, one immediately sees that the principle is true. For instance, anyone who understands the term “whole” and “part” has a certain and immediate grasp of the principle that the whole is greater than the part.

2. Experience can also result in certain knowledge, such as our knowledge that magnets attract iron. This sort of knowledge is partly grounded in the first sort, because it depends on our certain knowledge of the principle “Whatever results for the most part from an unfree cause is that cause’s natural effect,” which is self-evident through its terms. On the basis of this principle and experience, we can gain certain knowledge through induction.

3. We can have certain knowledge of our acts and mental states, such as whether we are understanding or willing. We can even be certain that we are seeing, Scotus contends. If I see a flash of light, but there is no light in the room, the species causing my visual act must still exist in my eye, and so I am genuinely seeing something, although not something outside my own body. The level of certainty we gain from knowledge in this case is no less than that we gain from grasping principles evident through their terms.

4. We can also have certain sensory knowledge, thanks to the same self-evident principle that grounds the certainty of induction. If the same object, always or for the most part, causes multiple senses to judge that it has property F, then we can be certain that the object really has property F. Even if the senses conflict, as when vision tells us that the distant Goliath is smaller than the nearby David, but hearing tells us that Goliath’s stentorian voice comes from a giant, we can still attain certain knowledge by appealing to self-evident principles to correct the erroneous judgment.

9. Natural Law

Scholastic philosophical theologians are taxed not just with solving philosophical problems and creating philosophical systems, but with doing so in ways consistent with Biblical religion. Now, Genesis reports that the holy patriarch Abraham set out to kill his own son and that the holy patriarch Jacob took two wives, while Exodus tells of midwives who lied to Pharaoh and yet were rewarded by God. For a scholastic thinker, these texts would naturally raise questions about the status of the natural law, especially that portion of it recorded in the Ten Commandments, or Decalogue. If, as the scriptures suggest, these agents did not do wrong in acting as they did, did they not, despite appearances, violate the natural law? Or did God grant a dispensation from the law?

It is with these issues in mind that Scotus offers his most revealing discussion of the natural law. According to Scotus, God has in fact offered dispensations from the law. Dispensation may take two forms: God can revoke the law, or God can clarify the law. However, even God is limited in the extent to which he can dispense. That is because the natural law in the strict sense consists of laws known through themselves on the basis of their terms. Because they are logically necessary truths, they cannot be revoked, at the very least. Scotus takes the first two commandments of the Decalogue to belong to the law of nature in the strict sense. The commandment to love God, for example, exemplifies the principle that what is best is to be loved most, which is known through itself. Even God could not make it licit to hate him.

The natural law in the broad sense consists of laws that are “exceptionally harmonious” with the natural law in the strict sense. These laws are not known through themselves on the basis of their terms; their truth value is contingent. Therefore, God can grant dispensations from these laws, which include all the commandments in the second table of the Decalogue. Unfortunately, Scotus does not explain what he means when he says that the law of nature in the broad sense consists of laws that are “exceptionally harmonious” with the law of nature in the strict sense, and his vagueness has inspired astoundingly different interpretations of his account of natural law.

In some texts, Scotus presents a view of moral goodness that appears to be largely naturalistic. For example, in his 18th Quodlibet, Scotus writes that an agent’s act is morally good if it has an appropriate object, is performed in appropriate circumstances, is of a sort appropriate for the agent to perform, and furthermore if the agent rightly judges this to be the case and then acts on that judgment. To make these judgments about appropriateness, one needs to know only the nature of the agent, of the act, and of the power through which the agent performs the act. The moral law in its broad sense is therefore based on the natures of things and is accordingly rationally accessible to humans. On this interpretation, since human nature and human powers remain constant, the law of nature in the broad sense could change only if circumstances change, rendering appropriate what used to be inappropriate (or vice versa); in that case, however, God’s act of dispensation would seem little more than a formality.

In other texts, such as Ordinatio 1 d.44 n.6, Scotus appears to hold that what constitutes the natural law in the broad sense is simply God’s will: God wills certain propositions to be law, and they are thereby law. There is nothing self-contradictory about a system of law very different from the one we live under, for instance, a system that at least sometimes permits the killing or torture of the innocent, the telling of falsehoods, and stealing others’ property, and so no logical necessity of the sort we find in the first commandment constrains God from promulgating an alternative system of laws such as this. As Williams [1998] notes in reply to the objection that such a system is inconsistent with God’s own justice, Scotus contends that God can do whatever is not logically impossible, and whatever God wills is by that very fact right (Rep. 4 d46 q4). God’s justice, therefore, does not constrain his will to any single consistent system of laws; he may will any consistent system. It is simply God’s will that certain propositions comprise the moral law rather than others. If the laws we in fact live under benefit us, that is due to God’s graciousness, not his justice. On this interpretation, however, it is hard to see how human beings have rational access to the natural law. Williams [1997] suggests that the Biblical assertion that God writes his commandments on our hearts be interpreted to mean that God gives us moral intuitions that accord with his commands, but if that is the case, when God grants dispensations, those very intuitions (and the moral and cultural institutions built on them) would lead us far astray.

10. Action Theory and Will

Mediaeval philosophers agree that human acts have their source in the powers of will and intellect, and in articulating their detailed action theories and rich moral psychologies, these thinkers spell out the respective roles of the will and intellect. They often disagree, however, about what those roles are and, in particular, about the relative priority of these powers in the production of human acts, with intellectualists giving greater priority to the intellect and voluntarists to the will. Of course, that priority could take many forms, and so we find mediaeval philosophers investigating the extent to which the intellect influences, determines, causes, or necessitates the will’s act, and vice versa; whether our freedom or control over our acts stems more from the will, the intellect, or equally from both; and whether we resemble God more in our intellects or in our wills. While most mediaeval thinkers offer nuanced theories, the views of Aquinas, Giles of Rome, and Godfrey of Fontaines are predominately intellectualist, while those of Henry of Ghent and Peter John Olivi are predominately voluntarist. The debates between intellectualists and voluntarists are important not just because they represent disputes over the origination of human acts, but because they also represent deep disagreements on the nature of free will and rationality, on what makes humans morally responsible, and on the role of virtue in morality.

Scotus’s action theory is largely voluntarist. Although he admits that the intellect plays an important role in human action (after all, the will cannot will something that the intellect is not thinking of, nor can it will something that the intellect does not perceive as somehow good), in contrast to intellectualists such as Aquinas, Scotus denies that the intellect’s judgment about what one should pursue or avoid ever determines which alternative the will wills or, for that matter, whether it wills anything at all. Moreover, the will plays a large role in determining what the intellect thinks: Once the intellect has some object in mind, no matter how peripherally, the will can direct the intellect’s focus and regulate its thought accordingly.

Scotus means to show not just that the will is a higher power than the intellect, however. He argues for the remarkable claim that the will is unique among all created powers because it alone acts freely. Scotus’s account of the will’s freedom is complex, to say the least: In no other discussions does Scotus do more to earn his epithet “subtle.” Nevertheless, the following three key elements of his account should serve to summarize his audacious but sometimes murky discussion.

1. Some potentialities have natures that determine what operations they will or will not perform in any given set of circumstances. A 400 degree oven always operates the same way, and so unless there is some impediment, it will roast meat and dry clay, for that is the nature of heat. The way such human powers as the senses, sensory appetites, and even the intellect operate is also determined by their natures, even if they do have a greater intrinsic value than mere heat. The only power whose nature does not determine its operations is the will, which alone is a self-determining power for opposites. Among created things, the will alone transcends nature, not because it does not have a nature, but because no nature, including its own, determines its acts [Boler 1993]. The will, then, satisfies one necessary condition for freedom: It determines itself regarding opposites; that is, it determines whether it wills this object or that one, and also whether it wills this object or refrains from willing entirely.

2. The will’s capacity for self-determination is a necessary but not a sufficient condition for freedom because, as Scotus argues, even self-determined operations may be necessary. If the will’s acts are to be free, they must be contingent. To see what Scotus means, consider the following “diachronic” account of contingency. At time T1, the will has a real potentiality for willing a or b, as well as for refraining from willing. At time T2, the will determines itself to one of these alternatives, say, a. The proponent of this view admits that at T2 there is no longer a real potentiality for both opposites, but that does not matter because the real potentiality for opposites at T1 ensures the contingency of the will’s operation at T2. That strategy fails, Scotus argues, because contingency can be a feature only of something that is actual, and at T1 the will’s operation is not actual. Therefore, nothing at T1 can explain why the will’s operation at T2 is contingent. Rather, we must look for some feature of the will at T2 if we are to find an explanation of its contingency.

Scotus therefore argues that at T2 the will is really capable of opposites, even when it is determined to one of them. Like all the soul’s powers, the will is a first actuality, and so naturally prior to its operations, which are second actualities. To capture this idea of natural priority within a single instant of time, Scotus employs the device of instants of nature. In a single temporal instant T2 we find instants of nature N1 and N2. At N1 the will has a real potentiality for either a or b. At N2, the will determines itself to a. However, because all this occurs in a single instant of time T2, it is still true because of N1 that at T2 the will has a real potentiality for b, even though at that very temporal instant it is actually willing a. Therefore the will’s operation at T2 is contingent because of features true of the will at T2. Because the will’s operation is both contingent and self-determined, it is free. Finally, it is worth noting that this view does not imply the absurdity that the will can simultaneously will multiple opposites. For instance, a person cannot at the same time both intend to pursue a college degree and intend to stay out of school forever. Rather, if a person at T2 intends to pursue a college degree, there is at T2 the real potentiality for intending to stay out of school forever, but not for intending both.

3. Medieval eudaimonist philosophers contend that the will is determined to seek happiness, that is, the fulfillment of one’s nature. However, because one can at least partly determine the constituents of happiness, and because one can pursue happiness by different means, this determination of the will does not introduce any necessitation incompatible with free will and moral responsibility. Nor does eudaimonism amount to psychological egoism, because justice and its associated virtues are themselves constituents of or at the least, means to the fulfillment of one’s own nature. Eudaimonism, therefore, is no opponent of the moral life. Scotus, however, finds this line of thought problematic, and in spelling out his alternative to eudaimonism he articulates the third element in his discussion of freedom.

Drawing on Anselm’s discussion in On the Fall of the Devil, Scotus contends that in addition to the affection for the fulfillment of one’s nature, or affection for advantage, the will has a second affection, the affection for justice. Thanks to the affection for advantage, the will can seek things insofar as they benefit the willer. Thanks to the affection for justice, the will can seek things insofar as they are good in themselves. As Boler [1993] points out, the presence of the affection for justice over and above that for advantage explains two closely related human characteristics: the will’s capacity to transcend what is natural and the sort of freedom necessary for moral responsibility.

The precise sort of freedom Scotus thinks the affection for justice affords us, however, remains unclear. He might mean that our having the affection for justice in addition to the affection for advantage gives us moral freedom, that is, the freedom to determine whether and to what extent we will act justly. On the other hand, he might mean that having the affection for justice gives us metaphysical freedom, the freedom of self-determination. There is some reason to think that Scotus means both. In a famous example, Scotus asks us to conceive of a creature with an intellectual appetite that has merely one affection, the affection for advantage (because it lacks the affection for justice, this appetite does not count as a genuine will). Such a being, Scotus contends, would always seek its advantage and seek it to the maximum possible, for there would be no countervailing affection to place any restraints on its pursuit of advantage. It would therefore lack both moral freedom and metaphysical freedom as well. However, Scotus offers few details, and it is hard to see why such a creature could not have metaphysical freedom, even if it lacks moral freedom. If the will’s self-determination were limited to balancing the willer’s own advantage against the concerns of justice, then it would be easier to see Scotus’s motives for associating the affection for justice with metaphysical freedom. However, Scotus holds that it is possible, without any intellectual error or misleading passion, to will something unjust that is still less advantageous than an alternative open to the willer. In this case, the affection for justice plays no apparent role in explaining the will’s self-determination, and so it has struck some scholars that the addition of this affection explains the will’s moral freedom but not its metaphysical freedom. On the other hand, Scotus insists that the will’s two affections are not independent wills. Rather, the “addition” of the affection for justice transforms the intellectual appetite so that when one wills, the will always acts with both affections. One cannot “use” just one affection and not the other, even if one is pursuing simply one’s own advantage or simply justice. However, these observations still do not explain how the addition of the affection for justice affords the will metaphysical freedom (if in fact it does), and Scotus says little to shed any more light on the subject.

11. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Texts in Latin

  • Cuestiones Cuodlibetales (1963). In ed. Felix Alluntis, Obras del Doctor Sutil, Juan Duns Escoto. Madrid: Biblioteca de Autores Cristianos.
  • Opera Omnia (1639), ed. Luke Wadding. Lyons, 12 vols., revised and enlarged by L. Vives (1891-1895). Paris, 26 vols.
  • Opera Omnia (1950-). Ed. Scotistic Commission. Vatican City: Typis Polyglottis Vaticanis, 11 vols. prepared to date.

b. Primary Texts in English Translation

  • Duns Scotus, Metaphysician (1995). Ed. and trans. William A. Frank and Allan B. Wolter. West Lafayette: Purdue University Press.
  • Duns Scotus on the Will and Morality (1986). Ed. and trans. Allan Wolter. Washington: Catholic University of America Press.
  • John Duns Scotus: The Examined Report of the Paris Lecture (Reportatio I-A), vol. 1 (2004). Ed. and trans. Allan B. Wolter and Oleg V. Bychkov. St. Bonaventure: The Franciscan Institute.
  • John Duns Scotus: God and Creatures (1981). The Quodlibetal Questions. Trans. Allan Wolter and Felix Alluntis. Washington: Catholic University of America Press.
  • John Duns Scotus: A Treatise on God as First Principle (1983). Ed. Allan Wolter. Chicago: Franciscan Herald Press.
  • Philosophical Writings (1987). Trans. and ed. Allan Wolter. Indianapolis: Hackett.

c. Secondary Literature

  • Adams, Marilyn McCord (1976). “Ockham on Identity and Distinction,” in Franciscan Studies 36: 5-74.
  • Boler, John (1993). “Transcending the Natural: Duns Scotus on the Two Affections of the Will,” in American Catholic Philosophical Quarterly 67: 109-22.
  • Boulnois, Olivier (1989). “Analogie et univocité selon Duns Scot: La double destruction,” in Les etudes philosophiques 3/4: 347-83.
  • Cross, Richard (1999). Duns Scotus. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Cross, Richard (2002). “Duns Scotus on Divine Substance and the Trinity,” in Medieval Philosophy and Theology 11:181-201.
  • Day, Sebastian (1947). Intuitive Cognition: A Key to the Significance of the Later Scholastics. St. Bonaventure: The Franciscan Institute.
  • Dumont, Stephen (1987). “The Univocal Concept of Being in the Fourteenth Century: I. John Duns Scotus and William of Alnwick,” in Medieval Studies 49: 1-75.
  • Gelber, Hester Goodenough (1974). Logic and the Trinity: A Clash of Values in Scholastic Thought, 1300-1335. Ph.D. dissertation, University of Wisconson.
  • Gracia, Jorge J.E (1984). Introduction to the Problem of Individuation in the Early Middle Ages. Washington: The Catholic University of America Press.
  • King, Peter (2003). “Scotus on Metaphysics,” Chapter 1 in Williams [2003], 15-68.
  • Pasnau, Robert (2003). “Cognition,” Chapter 9 in Williams [2003], 285-311.
  • Williams, Thomas (1997). “Reason, Morality, and Voluntarism in Duns Scotus: A Pseudo-Problem Dissolved,” in The Modern Schoolman 74: 73-94.
  • Williams, Thomas (1998). “The Unmitigated Scotus,” in Archiv für Geschichte der Philosophie 80: 162-81.
  • Williams, Thomas, ed. (2003). The Cambridge Companion to Duns Scotus. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Wolter, Allan (1990a). “Duns Scotus on Intuition, Memory, and Our Knowledge of Individuals,” Chapter 5 in Wolter [1990b], 98-122.
  • Wolter, Allan (1990b). The Philosophical Theology of John Duns Scotus, ed. Marilyn McCord Adams. Ithaca: Cornell University Press.
  • Wolter, Allan (2003). “The Unshredded Scotus: A Reply to Thomas Williams,” in American Catholic Philosophical Quarterly 77: 315-356.

Author Information

Jeffrey Hause
Creighton University
U. S. A.

Last updated: June 5, 2007 | Originally published: