Scotus: Knowledge of God

Any discussion of John Duns Scotus (1266—1308) on our knowledge of God has to be a discussion of Scotus’s thesis that we have concepts univocal to God and creatures. By this, Scotus means that someone’s idea can equally represent both God and other types of things. This is striking even to modern ears and was perhaps more so for Scotus’s contemporaries. There are religious objections. Some call Scotus an idolater. But beyond this, as Scotus himself pointed out, the metaphysical ramifications of his thesis threaten to “destroy all philosophy.” By this, he means Aristotle’s thought, which did much to set the philosophical terrain of the thirteenth century. For Aristotle, words that refer to things that are different yet somehow related are analogical, words like ‘healthy’ said of both persons and medicine. Medievals adopted Aristotle’s scheme to make sense of the meaning of religious language, which uses words like ‘good’ to talk about God and creatures. For thinkers in the Latin West, concerns did not focus so much on whether God talk is analogical, as it did on exactly what type of analogy was at play. Imagine the reception when Scotus insisted that analogy (and with analogy, religious language) in fact rests tacitly on concepts univocal to God and creatures. In an Aristotelian universe, this would seem to require that God and creatures really do have something in common, that they differ only in kind, like cats and persons. But everyone, including Scotus, agreed that this was not so. Hence, Scotus and Aristotle would seem to be irremediably at odds with one another and Scotus would indeed destroy all philosophy. As bad as things seem for Scotus, these difficulties recede in light of the fact that his univocity thesis is about religious language, not things. Yes, we can think of radically distinct types of things using just one concept, but this does not mean that they really share in some feature. Thoughts and things need not line up that neatly. This is the way that it is for Scotus. The univocal concepts that represent God and creatures are high level abstractions, mental constructs formed through experience and conceived apart from the limits that attended the things that gave rise to them. These concepts are sufficiently vague to conceive God and creatures, provided that we see the concepts for the abstractions that they are. They really do not refer to anything, because every being is either finite (creatures) or infinite (God), and this makes all the difference. Scotus recognizes that the complex concept formed when a univocal concept is linked with the concept of God’s infinite being is about something that is metaphysically distinct from any creature. But, the genesis of the concept lies in concepts that are of creatures and creatures imitate God as effects imitate their causes. Therefore, to the extent that imperfect creatures imperfectly imitate the perfect creator, univocal concepts are of God. But only to this extent, which medieval thinkers, including Scotus, agree falls far short of the perfection of the divine essence.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
  2. Preliminaries
    1. Scotus’s Writings and Early Thought
    2. The Aristotelian Paradigm: Thirteenth-Century Categorial Metaphysics
  3. Contemporary Scholarship
  4. Scotus on our Natural Knowledge of God
  5. Univocity
    1. Univocity and Natural Theology
    2. Illumination Theory and Abstraction
    3. Analogy and Univocity
  6. Metaphysics as Natural Theology
    1. Metaphysics and the Transcendentals
    2. Does Scotus “Destroy All Philosophy?”
  7. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Introduction

John Duns Scotus (1266—1308) defends the existence of concepts univocal to God and creatures (on the medieval understanding of concepts, see below, section 2a), most importantly the concept of being. In so doing, Scotus helped to expand medieval thinkers’ understanding of the scope of metaphysics, which, following Aristotle, was conceived of as the science of being qua being or being as such (Metaphysics (Metaph.) 4.1). Because for Scotus being as such pertains to both God and creatures, he thinks of metaphysics as a natural theology (Wolter 1946). More specifically, Scotus believes that certain attributes characterize everything that exists (examples of such attributes include one, true and good) (Ordinatio (Ord.) I, d. 8, q. 3, Vat. IV). These transcendental attributes transcended the then generally accepted classification of types of beings (see below, sections 2b and 6a) and thereby apply to everything. Metaphysics is then for Scotus the science of the transcendentals.

Scotus’s work was vulnerable to a variety of objections on several fronts. First, on strictly philosophical grounds, medievals did not think that there was any concept broad enough to take in everything (see below, section 2b and King 2003). Again, were God similar to and different from creatures, God would be metaphysically complex. For medieval thinkers, this would mean that God is not God, but rather a contingent thing like any other and hence unable to function as the uncaused cause of all things. Scotus recognizes that his univocity thesis threatens “to destroy all philosophy” (1 Lectura (Lect.), d. 3, n. 105) and is at pains to answer these various charges. His strategy is to insist that the univocity thesis is about concepts, not things (Lect. 1, d. 8, n. 129, Vat. XVII:46). More specifically, the informational or intensional content of concepts that are common to God and creatures does not involve the respectively infinite and limited being of either. The concepts really do not apply to anything until these considerations are introduced (or, strictly speaking, reintroduced in the case of creatures, whence concepts are derived). This introduction renders a composite concept comprising the univocal concept and a concept of degree (limited or unlimited as regards creatures or God, respectively). This composition does not alter the content of the univocal concept, which therefore carries the same content in each application and, with that, the unity of meaning that is requisite for it to support the types of sound proof that interest most theologians (see below, section 5a). As the thesis is about how we talk about things and not how they are, univocal terms can apply to all things and the fact that we use these terms to speak of God does not entail any real metaphysical complexity of the divine essence. But, inasmuch as univocal concepts are drawn from creatures and creatures imperfectly represent or imitate God (Ord. I, d. 3, pt. 1, qq. 1-2, n. 56, Vat. III:38-39; pt. 2, q. 2, q. un., n. 294, Vat. III:179), univocal concepts are also of God (see below, sections 3 and 6b). The conceptual apparatuses that Scotus deploys in support of his thesis regarding religious language along with his construal of metaphysics as a natural theology have deeply influenced the Western tradition. For instance, Scotus’s thesis that things that do not share in any real feature may fall under one univocal concept opens the door to William of Ockham’s nominalism, which allows for universal concepts absent common natures (see Summa Logicae I.14 and Klima 2010). Again, Scotus’s influence is likewise seen in Francisco Suárez, David Hume, Immanuel Kant, Charles Sanders Peirce and Martin Heidegger, to name just a few.

Scotus’s earliest disciples were divided over how to understand the Subtle Doctor on the key issue of the univocity of being. Antonius Andreas (d. 1320 C.E.), for instance, looks for some reality common to God and creatures as the real basis for Scotus’s univocal concepts; whereas Peter of Navarre (d. 1347 C.E.) finds in Scotus a weak sense of univocity, whereby concepts univocal to God and creatures are such only inasmuch as they are so indifferent as to apply properly to neither. Peter thereby works to bring Scotus’s thought into line with the common opinion (which he links to Thomas Aquinas, d. 1274 C.E.) that denies that there are any concepts univocal to God and creatures, maintaining rather that theological discourse is analogical (Dumont 1992). This view recognizes that any idea that we have of God is proper rather to creatures, because ideas are in their genesis of creatures, not God. In light of this generally empiricist outlook, these theologians acknowledge that religious language is analogical. As creatures imitate or represent the creator, we are justified in assigning various perfections to God. But, creatures are limited and imperfect. Therefore, barring any special revelation, our grasp of God in this life must be inaccurate (see below, section 5c).

Debates such as those that unfolded soon after his death over whether Scotus held that concepts univocal to God and creatures pick out a reality common to both persist, though a consensus has emerged that Scotus’s univocal concepts are vague abstractions that apply properly to neither God nor creatures absent certain modal considerations relevant to finite and infinite being that serve to delimit the scope of these concepts (Cross 2001). Scotus was led to this account out of his belief that (1) analogy (and with analogy, religious language) tacitly relies on univocity (see below, section 5c) and (2) God and creatures do not share in any common reality.

Hampering the efforts of scholars to present a clear picture of Scotus’s considered opinion on the univocity of being is the fact that his thought on the matter shifts over the course of his career and his sudden passing in 1308 around the age of 43 left the bulk of his writings in a state of partially-edited disarray that can obscure its development, thereby lending credence to conflicting readings. Recent scholarship has done much to ameliorate this difficulty, but an understanding of Scotus’s development must also be parsed along the lines of the Aristotelian categorial metaphysics that dictate his approach. Accordingly, section 2 of this essay is devoted to such preliminary considerations. Section 2a lays out a chronology of Scotus’s writings, presenting his early view on the univocity of being (which appears to have reflected the view then standard amongst Oxford scholars). This shows where Scotus’s mature thought on univocity is to be found and helps to resolve difficulties posed by the decidedly mixed and confused treatment that the univocity thesis receives in Scotus’s commentary on Aristotle’s Metaphysics. Section 2b is a study of the thirteenth-century Aristotelian categorial metaphysics that led medieval theologians to rely on analogy to speak of God and creatures and determined the trajectory of Scotus’s thought.

2. Preliminaries

What we take to be Scotus’s mature position on the univocity of the concepts by which we conceive both God and creatures is drawn primarily from his Ordinatio. (Scotus’s Ordinatio is a revised version of the lectures on the Sentences of Peter of Lombard (d. 1160) that Scotus delivered in partial fulfillment of the curriculum of the faculty of Theology. Scotus was at work revising his Ordinatio up until his death.) Yet, Scotus’s thought on the univocity of concepts appears to shift over the course of his career. Whereas the Ordinatio presents Scotus’s considered opinion, other texts (such as his earliest, logical writings) conform to what we now know to be the standard, mid-thirteenth century Oxford tradition that looks on the term ‘being’ as either equivocal (from the point of view of the logician, who deals with concepts as such, that is, independently of the entities they conceive) or analogous (for the metaphysicians and natural philosophers (that is, physicists), who consider mind-independent realities) (Pini 2005a). Hence there is a striking dissonance between early and late Scotus as regards the univocity of the concept of being, and we find Scotus in his early-period commentary on Aristotle’s Categories (construed by medievals as a work on the properties of terms) stating that the term ‘being’ is in fact equivocal or analogical, from the respective standpoints of logic, on the one hand, and metaphysics and physics, on the other:

This term ‘being’ is simply equivocal . . . . However an utterance that for the logician is simply equivocal . . . is analogous for the metaphysician or the natural philosopher . . . Thus . . . ‘being’ is posited by the metaphysician as analogous . . . But for the logician, it is simply equivocal (Questions on the “Categories” of Aristotle Q. 4, sect. 37-38, trans. mine). (Unless otherwise noted, all translations are my own.)

Medieval semiotic theories develop along the lines laid down by Aristotle in his logical treatise on the properties of statements (the Perihermenias), better known today by its Latin title De Interpretatione. The first chapter presents a semiotic that remained open to a variety of interpretations throughout the middle ages as to whether it construes words primarily as signs of ideas or of extramental things. Scotus allows that there are good reasons to hold either opinion and leaves open the matter (Quaestiones in libros Perihermenias Aristotelis 1.2.51; see also Buckner and Zupko 186-87; Read 16-18). Aristotle’s account is as follows:

Spoken sounds are symbols of affections in the soul, and written marks symbols of spoken sounds . . . What these [that is, spoken sounds] are in the first place signs of – affections in the soul – are the same for all; and what these affections are likenesses of – actual things – are also the same (trans. Ackrill 16a3-8).

Affections in the soul, or concepts, are for medievals the components of mental propositions. Ultimately, concepts are traceable to impressions that things make on our minds and hence the medieval account is an empiricist one. Concepts are likenesses of the entities that they represent and are thereby that by which things are cognitively present to one who conceives. The property of a term whereby it brings to mind a concept is described by medieval thinkers as the term’s signification (Read 9-10).

Logic, for Scotus, considers, among other things, the signification of terms. Signification should not be understood in light of our contemporary notion of meaning, which allows us to speak loosely of the meaning of a term as what it brings to mind. The meaning of a term can be looked up, whereas an expression’s signification is ultimately traceable to something. Again, Scotus conceives of signification as a mental event, a state (or, in scholastic terminology, derived from Aristotle, an ‘accident’) of the mind through which an entity is cognitively present for the person who is conceiving (Pini 2015). On this view, significative utterances are said to be either univocal or equivocal dependent on what concepts they bring to mind. Drawing from Aristotle’s account in Categories 1, univocal (or synonymous) things have a name and definition or account in common. By extension, a term is univocal over two or more entities when it signifies the same idea for each. Again, things are equivocal (or homonymous) when they only have a name in common, the corresponding definition or account differing in each case. Accordingly, an equivocal term signifies differently in its different applications. Hence the term ‘man’ is univocal to Socrates and Plato, whereas it is equivocal when applied to Socrates and a painted image. As this example suggests, equivocity is not always the result of happenstance, absent any real relation, as it is with, for instance, the word ‘bank’, which refers to financial institutions and spots along rivers. Borrowing from Boethius’s (d. 480 C.E.) influential commentary on Aristotle’s Categories, medievals termed these types of equivocity ‘deliberate (a consilio)’ and ‘chance (a casu)’, respectively. Analogy is an instance of deliberate equivocity. Interestingly, the Oxford tradition of the latter-thirteenth and early-fourteenth centuries does not allow that analogy derived from real relationships carries over to the semantic level. Other thinkers, such as Thomas Aquinas who was active in Paris and Cologne, believe that the signification of analogous terms reflects real relations.

So, the term ‘healthy’ is analogous, signifying either an individual, her complexion or the medicine she takes:

This mode of community of idea is a mean between pure equivocation and simple univocation. For in analogies the idea is not, as it is in univocals, one and the same, yet it is not totally diverse as in equivocals; but a term which is thus used in a multiple sense signifies various proportions to some one thing; thus ‘healthy’ applied to urine signifies the sign of animal health, and applied to medicine signifies the cause of the same health (Summa Theologica (ST) Ia.13.5c) (All translations of ST are from the Fathers of the English Dominican Province).

The Oxford logicians, on the other hand, tend toward decoupling ontology and semantics. Terms that bring to mind different things (a person and her complexion) elicit discrete concepts and are therefore simply equivocal, regardless of the real relation that holds between the things signified. For instance, the term ‘being’ could be used to signify subsistent entities (substances) and inherent entities (accidents such as complexion that are parasitic upon substances for their existence). Substances and accidents stand in a real relationship to one another in reality; but, for the logician, this relationship is not reflected in the discrete concepts of each. The expression ‘being’ said of a substance signifies differently than the same expression said of an accident and hence, for the logician, the expression used in these ways is equivocal. For the metaphysician and the physicist, who are concerned primarily with things in the world, on the other hand, the expression is analogous. Perhaps this distinction between concepts and things proved influential for the later Scotus, inasmuch as the univocity thesis considers concepts apart real features of the extramental things that they conceive. Be that as it may, the influence of the Oxford tradition explains why early in his career Scotus holds that the term ‘being’ is equivocal in logic and analogous in metaphysics and physics.

In contrast to the logical writings’ clear rejection of the univocity of the concept of being, the account of the Questions on the Metaphysics of Aristotle is confused and indecisive. The unedited state of Scotus’s writings at the time of his early death is likely to blame and Giorgio Pini’s recent scholarship (2005a) persuasively casts the work as a conflation of early and late drafts that upon completion would have rendered an account in keeping with Scotus’s mature theory. Nevertheless, the impression remains that Scotus was never satisfied with the univocity thesis. In his Quodlibetal Questions (a record of Scotus’s participation in a public theological inquiry, composed near the end of Scotus’s life in either 1306 or 1307), Scotus states that it does not matter for the purpose of the investigation whether the concept of being at issue is analogical or univocal, provided that we allow that being is somehow common to God and creatures (14.39). Hence Steven Marrone (1983) suggests that perhaps Scotus was ready to give up univocity should anything better come along.

Owing at least in part to these conflicting claims and open questions, contemporary interpretations of Scotus’s thought on the univocity of concepts have reflected something of the dichotomy seen in Antonius and Peter over whether Scotus’s account entails a reality common to God and creatures (see above, section 1). And yet, with the recent completion of the critical editions of both Scotus’s Ordinatio (in 2013) and his philosophical writings (the Opera philosophica, in 2006), we are better able to chart the evolution of his thought on the univocity of the concept of being. And certain long-standing difficulties seem to have disappeared. The aforementioned logical writings along with Scotus’s earliest draft of the Questions on the Metaphysics endorse the denial of the univocity of being standard at the time and place of their composition. His Ordinatio, by contrast, reflects Scotus’s theological studies in Paris, where he was introduced to conceptual devices that led him to rethink the univocity of being. Scotus was at work revising his early writings in light of his mature position on univocity right up until his untimely death in 1308, hence the odd character of his Questions on the Metaphysics (Pini 2005a). Contemporary research then paints a developmental picture of Scotus’s thought. That said, as has been noted, there remains evidence that even late into his career Scotus was never completely satisfied with the univocity thesis, which threatened to “to destroy all philosophy.” By ‘all philosophy’ Scotus means Aristotelian philosophy and more specifically the thirteenth-century categorial metaphysics that developed out of Aristotle’s thought. Section 2b is an account of this system.

a. Scotus’s Writings and Early Thought

Medieval thinkers view Aristotle’s Categories as a work on the properties of terms. Under this broad classification, there was much debate over whether Aristotle was discussing: (1) mental acts or concepts; (2) linguistic entities; (3) extra-mental features or properties of the things about which we think and speak; or (4) words, concepts and properties, but in different ways (Gracia).  Scholars divide the work into three parts: the Prepredicamenta (chapters1-4), the Predicamenta (chapters 5-9) and the Postpredicamenta (chapters 10-15). (The Greek title of Categories is ‘katēgoriai’ meaning ‘predicates’, translated into Latin as ‘praedicamenta’.) The Prepredicamenta presents distinctions between homonyms and synonyms (see above, section 2a), substances and accidents and universal and particular terms (for example, ‘whiteness’ and ‘white’) as well as a list of things said (praedicamenta) without combination. The Predicamenta discusses these ‘things said’, the Postpredicamenta taking up a variety of tangential topics. Medieval debate over the subject matter of the Categories focused on the nature of the things said without combination, viz., substances and the nine categories of accidents. During the thirteenth century, it was generally agreed that the Categories treats words, concepts and things. For the metaphysician, the text presents a classification of extramental things (with substance most properly termed ‘being’ and the things in the nine categories of accidents derivatively so called), whereas the logician studies the work as a treatise on concepts of second intention. (Concepts of second intention are concepts derived by reflection on first-intention concepts, which are of things in the world. The concept species is a second intention concept.)

Each category (or highest genus) may be characterized as an ordered hierarchy of predicates (Ord. II, d. 3, p. 1, q. 4, n. 89). At the bottom of this hierarchy exists the individual substance or accident that is the ultimate locus of predication. Individuals are classed into species by means of differentiae (differences) that set species within the same category apart from one another (as, medievals believe, humans are set apart from other animals by virtue of the quality of rationality). Genera, in turn, can serve as species under still higher genera (animal, for instance, is a species of body – the animate type). The hierarchy culminates in a highest genus or category that is said of everything contained within it (as, for example, all things in the category of substance are termed ‘substances’). Things in different categories are primarily diverse, meaning that they are not classified in terms of any common predicate. Hence, the predicates that go into the definition of a particular type of thing within a particular category are particular to that category. Things in the same category, on the other hand, are different rather than diverse, meaning that (by virtue of belonging to the same category) they share in some predicate or predicates (as, for example, both humans and cats are sensitive, living, animate material substances) (Metaph. 10.3, 1054b13-32). As the predicates are category specific, univocity is not transcategorial, terms taken from one category apply only analogically to things in other categories, as, famously, when accidents (or inherent beings) receive the denomination ‘being’ by virtue of their relationship to the substances in which they inhere, about whom ‘being’ is more properly said (Metaph. 4.2). (See above, section 2a.)

Recall that Scotus’s thesis regarding the univocity of religious language needs a concept of being broad enough to apply to everything, whence metaphysics as a natural theology studies the transcendental attributes that are coextensive with being as such (see above, section 1 and below, 6a). So characterized, Scotus’s project faces several interwoven difficulties. First, although metaphysicians of the Latin West had explicitly held that there exist transcendental attributes of being since the time of Phillip the Chancellor (d. 1236 C.E.), they abided by the aforementioned restriction on univocity that it not be transcategorial and relied on analogy to secure an approximation of conceptual unity across the diverse genera (see above section 2a and below, 5c). Hence, for Scotus’s system to get off of the ground in an Aristotelian universe, he had to find a way to accommodate the transcategorial prohibition. The move to render being a super-genus or highest category over and above the ten highest genera and thereby secure univocity by denying that it is transcategorial would appear tempting, but it is ruled out, as the medievals agree with Aristotle that being cannot be a genus. Genera are predicated of the species and individuals that fall under them, but not of the differences that constitute these species (Topics 122b17-23). For instance, ‘animal’ is said of human beings but not of the rational quality that sets humans apart from other types of animals; for no quality that pertains to animal as such can serve to distinguish one type of animal from another. If, then, being were a genus, the differential qualities that constitute types of beings would not fall under the genus of being and hence would not exist. Differences do in fact exist and hence being is not a genus (Metaph. 3.3, 998b14-999a22).

Scotus avoids transcategorial predication without rendering being a genus by casting his univocity thesis as a semantic thesis: @

It is plain, therefore, from what has been said that God and creatures are in reality wholly diverse, agreeing in no reality . . . and nevertheless they agree in one concept such that there may exist one concept common to God and creatures fashioned by an imperfect intellect (Lect. 1, d. 8, n. 129, Vat. XVII:46; see also Ord. I, d. 3, pt. 1, qq. 1-2, nn. 38-40, Vat. III.25-27; q. 3, n. 163, Vat. III.100-101, d. 8, n. 136, Vat. III:221).

The type of being that figures into the univocity thesis is not a highest genus above both God and creatures. It is, rather, a mental construct arrived at through abstraction. Both God and creatures are beings, but they need not agree in anything real. Rather, they fall under a common concept that lacks any immediate referent as it is prescinded from the considerations of degree that make all the difference as regards its instantiation.

b. The Aristotelian Paradigm: Thirteenth-Century Categorial Metaphysics

Medieval thinkers view Aristotle’s Categories as a work on the properties of terms. Under this broad classification, there was much debate over whether Aristotle was discussing: (1) mental acts or concepts; (2) linguistic entities; (3) extra-mental features or properties of the things about which we think and speak; or (4) words, concepts and properties, but in different ways (Gracia).  Scholars divide the work into three parts: the Prepredicamenta (chapters1-4), the Predicamenta (chapters 5-9) and the Postpredicamenta (chapters 10-15). (The Greek title of Categories is ‘katēgoriai’ meaning ‘predicates’, translated into Latin as ‘praedicamenta’.) The Prepredicamenta presents distinctions between homonyms and synonyms (see above, section 2a), substances and accidents and universal and particular terms (for example, ‘whiteness’ and ‘white’) as well as a list of things said (praedicamenta) without combination. The Predicamenta discusses these ‘things said’, the Postpredicamenta taking up a variety of tangential topics. Medieval debate over the subject matter of the Categories focused on the nature of the things said without combination, viz., substances and the nine categories of accidents. During the thirteenth century, it was generally agreed that the Categories treats words, concepts and things. For the metaphysician, the text presents a classification of extramental things (with substance most properly termed ‘being’ and the things in the nine categories of accidents derivatively so called), whereas the logician studies the work as a treatise on concepts of second intention. (Concepts of second intention are concepts derived by reflection on first-intention concepts, which are of things in the world. The concept species is a second intention concept.)

Each category (or highest genus) may be characterized as an ordered hierarchy of predicates (Ord. II, d. 3, p. 1, q. 4, n. 89). At the bottom of this hierarchy exists the individual substance or accident that is the ultimate locus of predication. Individuals are classed into species by means of differentiae (differences) that set species within the same category apart from one another (as, medievals believe, humans are set apart from other animals by virtue of the quality of rationality). Genera, in turn, can serve as species under still higher genera (animal, for instance, is a species of body – the animate type). The hierarchy culminates in a highest genus or category that is said of everything contained within it (as, for example, all things in the category of substance are termed ‘substances’). Things in different categories are primarily diverse, meaning that they are not classified in terms of any common predicate. Hence, the predicates that go into the definition of a particular type of thing within a particular category are particular to that category. Things in the same category, on the other hand, are different rather than diverse, meaning that (by virtue of belonging to the same category) they share in some predicate or predicates (as, for example, both humans and cats are sensitive, living, animate material substances) (Metaph. 10.3, 1054b13-32). As the predicates are category specific, univocity is not transcategorial, terms taken from one category apply only analogically to things in other categories, as, famously, when accidents (or inherent beings) receive the denomination ‘being’ by virtue of their relationship to the substances in which they inhere, about whom ‘being’ is more properly said (Metaph. 4.2). (See above, section 2a.)

Recall that Scotus’s thesis regarding the univocity of religious language needs a concept of being broad enough to apply to everything, whence metaphysics as a natural theology studies the transcendental attributes that are coextensive with being as such (see above, section 1 and below, 6a). So characterized, Scotus’s project faces several interwoven difficulties. First, although metaphysicians of the Latin West had explicitly held that there exist transcendental attributes of being since the time of Phillip the Chancellor (d. 1236 C.E.), they abided by the aforementioned restriction on univocity that it not be transcategorial and relied on analogy to secure an approximation of conceptual unity across the diverse genera (see above section 2a and below, 5c). Hence, for Scotus’s system to get off of the ground in an Aristotelian universe, he had to find a way to accommodate the transcategorial prohibition. The move to render being a super-genus or highest category over and above the ten highest genera and thereby secure univocity by denying that it is transcategorial would appear tempting, but it is ruled out, as the medievals agree with Aristotle that being cannot be a genus. Genera are predicated of the species and individuals that fall under them, but not of the differences that constitute these species (Topics 122b17-23). For instance, ‘animal’ is said of human beings but not of the rational quality that sets humans apart from other types of animals; for no quality that pertains to animal as such can serve to distinguish one type of animal from another. If, then, being were a genus, the differential qualities that constitute types of beings would not fall under the genus of being and hence would not exist. Differences do in fact exist and hence being is not a genus (Metaph. 3.3, 998b14-999a22).

Scotus avoids transcategorial predication without rendering being a genus by casting his univocity thesis as a semantic thesis:

It is plain, therefore, from what has been said that God and creatures are in reality wholly diverse, agreeing in no reality . . . and nevertheless they agree in one concept such that there may exist one concept common to God and creatures fashioned by an imperfect intellect (Lect. 1, d. 8, n. 129, Vat. XVII:46; see also Ord. I, d. 3, pt. 1, qq. 1-2, nn. 38-40, Vat. III.25-27; q. 3, n. 163, Vat. III.100-101, d. 8, n. 136, Vat. III:221).

The type of being that figures into the univocity thesis is not a highest genus above both God and creatures. It is, rather, a mental construct arrived at through abstraction. Both God and creatures are beings, but they need not agree in anything real. Rather, they fall under a common concept that lacks any immediate referent as it is prescinded from the considerations of degree that make all the difference as regards its instantiation.

3. Contemporary Scholarship

For Scotus, univocal concepts must refer to both God and creatures without collapsing the metaphysical space that separates them. Accordingly, Scotus is careful to note that univocal concepts are, as Richard Cross (2001, 13) puts it, “vicious abstractions,” referring properly to neither God nor creatures. This being the case, it appears as if Scotus’s univocal concepts may leave the theologian empty-handed. As Scotus is working to make space for univocity absent real commonality, it is perhaps unsurprising that he appears as a protean figure in contemporary minority reports that criticize him as either idolatrous or apophatic. David Burrell thinks that Scotus does not appreciate the problematic nature of our conceptual access to mystery and N. Trakakis reads into Scotus an anthropic conception of God on account of which he accuses Scotus of idolatry. Catherine Pickstock, on the other hand, believes that by rendering the distinction between God and creatures one of degree, Scotus paradoxically makes the distinction over into one of kind, inasmuch as there would exist a nonnegotiable epistemic gulf between the two (1998, 2005). By way of contrast, Richard Cross (2001), Stephen Dumont (1992), Steven Marrone (1983), Jan Aertsen and Wouter Goris (2013), Peter King (2003) and Thomas Williams (2005) count among the scholars who represent the majority view that recognizes that Scotus’s univocity theory is a semantic theory that does not require that God and creatures share in any real, common trait. To the contrary, the claim that Scotus’s univocity thesis entails that there is some reality common to the two does not fully appreciate the importance of the distinction between semantics and ontology that Scotus is careful to draw:

Note how there can be a first intention [that is, a real concept] of a and b which is indifferent, and nothing of a single nature corresponds in reality, but two formal objects wholly diverse are understood in one first intention (Ord. I, d. 8, n. 136, Vat. IV:221) (See also above, section 2b.)

The univocity thesis concerns concepts, not things and this distinction is crucial for Scotus. But, this is not to suggest that Scotus thinks that we do not have any knowledge of God. We know God through univocal concepts of empirical origin:

Those things that are known of God are known through the species [that is, a mental grasp] of creatures . . . Creatures, which imprint proper species in the intellect are also able to imprint the species of the transcendentals which agree in common with them and God. And then the intellect by means of its proper power is able to use many species simultaneously for the purpose of conceiving simultaneously those of which these are species, e.g. the species good and the species highest and the species act for the purpose of conceiving some highest and most actual good (Ord. I, d. 3, pt. 1, n. 61, Vat. III:42).

God contains the perfection of every creature (Ibid., d. 8, pt. 1, q. 3, n. 116, Vat IV:207-208). Univocal concepts are of God inasmuch as univocal concepts are in their genesis of creatures who imitate or represent God (Ibid., d. 3, pt. 1, qq. 1-2, n. 56, Vat III:38-39; pt. 2, q. 2, q. un., n. 294, Vat. III:179). Hence univocal concepts are mere mental constructs only to the extent that they pertain properly to neither God nor creatures when entertained apart from relevant modal considerations, which considerations (as has been stressed) make all the difference. Scotus invites us to think of these univocal concepts along the lines of a concept of whiteness absent any particular degree of intensity (Ord. I, d. 8, q. 3, n. 138).

4. Scotus on our Natural Knowledge of God

Scotus offers various proofs that we possess concepts univocal to God and creatures. Perhaps the most well know argument is that from certain and doubtful concepts:

Every intellect certain of one concept and doubtful of others has the concept of which it is certain as other than the concept of which it is doubtful . . . But the intellect . . . can be certain of God that God is a being, doubting as to this being whether it is finite or infinite . . . Therefore, the concept of being as regards God is other than this [concept] and that [concept]. And therefore for its part it is neither and it is included in both. Therefore, it is univocal (Ord. I, d. 3, n. 27, Vat. 3:18).

Scotus cites the debates amongst Presocratic philosophers over the nature of the first principle to show that the concept of being is common to the composite concepts infinite-being and finite-being, which overlap at the simple concept of being. This simple concept is common to the composite concepts such that in both its modalization does not alter its intensional content, that is, the common concept of being remains exactly the same concept of being in each case. A person who mistakenly thinks of fire as the uncaused first principle or constituent of all things (and therefore as infinite with respect to being) can be corrected but would not then cease to think of fire as a being. The intensional content of the concept of being is thus univocal for the concepts infinite-being and finite-being: “This certain concept, which is for its part neither of the doubtful ones is preserved in both of them” (Ibid., n. 29, Vat. 3:19). Scotus’s point is that concepts said of God and creatures retain a core content univocal to both instances. Joining the concept of finitude or infinity to a concept does not alter its meaning but merely produces a new, composite concept.

We arrive at these concepts univocal to God and creatures through experience (see below, section 5b), but when these concepts are joined with the concept of infinity, they apply only to God. There are two types of concepts that are proper to God:

I say that it is possible to arrive at many concepts that are proper to God and that do not agree with creatures. Concepts of this type are the concepts of all of the perfections taken simply, in the highest degree. And the most perfect concept, through which as if by description we most perfectly know God, is by conceiving every perfection simply and in the highest degree. Nevertheless, a concept more perfect and yet simpler, available for us, is the concept of infinite being. This concept is simpler than the concept ‘good being’, ‘true being’ or concepts of other, similar things; because ‘infinite’ is not a quasi-attribute or property of being, or of that of which it is said. Rather it signals an intrinsic mode of that entity, such that when I say ‘infinite being’ I don’t have a concept that is like an accidental concept, composed out of the subject and property, but, rather, I have an essential concept of a subject in a certain grade of perfection, viz. infinity, just as ‘intense white’ doesn’t express the same things as an accidental concept like ‘visible white’, indeed the intensity expresses an intrinsic grade of whiteness in itself. And thus the simplicity of the concept ‘infinite being’ is evident (Ord. I, d. 3, pt. 1, qq. 1-2, n. 58, Vat. III.40).

Concepts that are proper to God describe only God. The first type of concept proper to God is a descriptive, cluster-concept composed of attributes and perfections conceived in the highest possible degree – infinite-goodness, infinite-wisdom, and so forth, bundled together as it were (Frank and Wolter 150-51). Another type of concept, yet more appropriate to the divine nature, is of God conceived simply as infinite being. This latter concept is superior to the cluster-concept for several reasons. First, the concept of infinite being only applies to God (Ibid., n. 60, Vat. III: 41-42). Second, unlike the cluster-concept, infinite being does not explicitly comprise distinct traits. This respects the medieval insistence that God is metaphysically simple (see, for example, De primo principio 4). The essence of God cannot comprise aspects that stand in a relationship of potentiality with respect to one another. Otherwise, the existence of God would require some account as to why it is the way that it is and God would not be God, that is, the uncaused (or unaccounted for) first cause. Third, the concept of infinite being is superior to the cluster-concept because the transcendental attributes and perfections are coextensive with being as such, as infinite being God has every perfection (see below, section 6a). Fourth, the distinction between infinite and finite being is one of degree and it is because the distinction between God and creatures is one of degree that Scotus avoids rendering being a genus over and above both God and creatures (see below, section 6b). (Nevertheless, we should not think of infinite being as a divisible quantity. Infinite being is, for Scotus, indivisible. See Cross 2001.) Finally, by Scotus’s estimation, the concept of God’s infinite being is the most fertile ground available to the natural theologian seeking to deduce various divine attributes.

In his De primo principio (A Treatise on God as First Principle), Scotus describes God’s infinite being as a “most fertile conclusion, which if it had been proved of you at the outset, would have made obvious so many of the conclusions we have mentioned so far” (4.47, trans. Wolter, 1966). Following a lengthy series of demonstrations that the divine essence is infinite, Scotus then concludes that (among other things):

Catholics can infer most of the perfections which philosophers knew of you . . . You are the first efficient cause, the ultimate end, supreme in perfection, transcending all things. You are uncaused in any way and therefore incapable of becoming or perishing; indeed it is simply impossible that you should not exist . . . You are therefore eternal . . . You live a most noble life . . . You are happy . . . You are the clear vision of yourself and the most joyful love . . . You . . . understand in a single act everything that can be known . . . You possess the power to freely and contingently will each thing that can be caused and by willing it through your volition to cause it to be. Most truly then you are of infinite power . . . You alone are simply perfect, not just a perfect angel, or a perfect body, but a perfect being . . . You are one God, than whom there is no other (Ibid., 4.84-87).

Just as our understanding of the goodness and wisdom that we ascribe to God originates in experience, so too does our notion of infinity. In his fifth Quodlibetal Question, Scotus walks us through the process of reflection by which we arrive at this concept. Aristotle defines the infinite as infinite with respect to quantity. No matter how many discrete quantities one takes away from it, an infinite amount remains (Physics 3.6, 207a7-9). Hence, Scotus notes that this infinity can never be in existence as a whole. We are then asked to imagine per impossibile that the entirety of this infinity should be present at once, hence “if this could be done we would have an actually infinite in quantity, because it would be as great in actuality as it was potentially” (5.6, trans. Alluntis and Wolter). God’s infinite perfection is conceived along the lines of this model of a quantitative infinity taken as a whole:

If we think of something among beings that is actually infinite in entity, we must think of it along the lines of the actual infinite quantity we imagined, namely as an infinite being that cannot be exceeded in entity by any other being. It will truly have the character of something whole and perfect. It will indeed be whole or complete (Ibid., n. 7).

God is then “infinite in perfection or power” (Ibid., n. 8).

In summary, we know God through the numerous concepts of various perfections and attributes by which creatures imitate and represent God. We know of God that God is an infinite being, and because God is an infinite being, God possesses these perfections in the highest possible degree. For this reason, of all of the things that we know of God, the most significant is that God is infinite being. It remains, then, to discuss the intensional or informational content of concepts univocal to God and creatures (section 5) with an eye toward why Scotus thinks we need these concepts (section 5a), how we acquire them (section 5b), why analogical concepts will not do in their place for the natural theologian (section 5c) and, finally, how Scotus uses concepts univocal to God and creatures to render metaphysics a natural theology (section 6a) without thereby “destroying all philosophy” (section 6b).

5. Univocity

Theological considerations are at the heart of Scotus’s univocity thesis. First, Scotus holds that theology is pointless absent any concepts univocal to God and creatures, as theologians would literally have no idea what they are talking about. (Section 5c, below, discusses why Scotus does not believe that the generally accepted account of God talk as analogical will do.) Again, theologians present certain conclusions as the product of sound reasoning and Scotus (naturally enough) holds that sound reasoning requires the univocity of concepts (Cross 2006). As regards this second point, Scotus’s description of univocal concepts draws attention to their role in demonstration:

I say that God is not only conceived in a concept analogous to the concept of a creature (namely a concept which is entirely different from a concept said of a creature), but also in some concept that is univocal to God and creatures. And so that there won’t be any contention about the term ‘univocal’, I call a concept univocal which is one such that its unity suffices for a contradiction when the concept is affirmed and denied of the same thing; likewise, it suffices for a syllogistic middle, so that the extreme [minor and major] terms joined in the middle that is one in this way are concluded to be joined to one another without the fallacy of equivocation (Ord. I, d. 2, qq. 1-2, n. 26, Vat. III:18).

a. Univocity and Natural Theology

We can think of Scotus’s univocity thesis as a thesis regarding how theological language has to work if it is to furnish the concepts that are needed to render theology a deductive science. The need for univocity is evident in the simplest syllogism, consider: ‘A loving parent cares for her child. God is as a loving parent and hence God cares for God’s creatures’. If the signification of the term ‘loving’ is not fixed across the demonstration but rather shifts from premise to premise, then what we know of parental love might not have any bearing or relevance when it comes to a proper understanding of the love of God. But then it would seem that natural theology is a dead-end practice. As Scotus says, we need a univocity sufficient to avoid the fallacy of equivocation.

Again, just as demonstration cannot proceed absent terms whose meanings are fixed, Scotus believes that without such terms we literally do not have any idea what we are saying when we talk about God. If some ideas do not pertain equally well to God and creatures, if the data of experience do not somehow map onto the divine essence, we know nothing of God, the correct account (ratio) of any divine attribute or perfection need not have anything at all in common with a similar correct accounting of the attribute as it is manifest in creatures. As Scotus puts it, if things were really this bad, we would have no better reason to call God wise than a rock (Ord. I, d. 2, qq. 1-2, n. 40, Vat. III:27).

Apart from univocity and analogy, Scotus had another option when it came to knowledge of God proffered in the negative theology of Rabbi Moses Maimonides (d. 1204 C.E.), who held that we know of God only what God is not (negative theology or strong apophaticism is also referred to as the way of remotion or the via negativa). On Scotus’s reckoning, even this supposed lack of knowledge presupposes some positive knowledge of God. Every denial entails an assertion and when we deny that God has some attribute, this is on the basis of positive knowledge that shows us that it is inconsistent to affirm this attribute of God. Likewise, and in keeping with Thomas Aquinas (ST Ia.13.2c.), Scotus notes that negative theology is incompatible with Christian faith: “We don’t fall intensely in love with negations” (Ord. I, d. 2, qq. 1-2, n. 10, Vat. III:5).

In sum, if we lack concepts univocal to God and creatures, Scotus believes that natural theology must fail on several counts. We could not construct sound proofs with God as the subject and all of our concepts of God would prove to be vacuous inasmuch as all knowledge is tied to experience and experience could not then serve to provide any correct account of God. Hence, Scotus charges that “All masters and theologians appear to use a concept common to God and creatures, though they deny this when they do it” (1 Lect. d. 3, n. 29).

b. Illumination Theory and Abstraction

Medieval illumination theory holds that God is somehow responsible for our having knowledge. God’s role in our acquisition of concepts is seen as more or less active often dependent on a thinker’s respective adherence to either a Platonic or an Aristotelian framework. During his middle period (c. 365-c. 347 B.C.E.), Plato (428/427-348/347 B.C.E.) states that various natural kinds, attributes (and perhaps even artefacts) acquire essential predicates by means of a type of vaguely described participation in unique, eternal, immutable, archetypical exemplars (termed ‘forms’ or ‘ideas’) that are more and less perfectly imitated by these various particulars. (See, for example, Republic 504e–518c and 596e–597a, Phaedo 100b–102a3, and Phaedrus 247c3–247e6. For the dating of these works in Plato’s middle-period, see Kraut.) Direct access to Plato’s writings in the middle ages was limited to a fragment of his Timaeus. Nevertheless, Plato’s thought was transmitted to medieval thinkers in a variety of ways, including the writings of Augustine (354-430 C.E.). By way of contrast, by the end of the twelfth century, the Latin West had access to more or less the entirety of the surviving writings of Aristotle that today comprise his corpus (prior to this medievals had access only to the Categories and On Interpretation as well as Porphyry’s (d. 305 C.E.) Isagoge, a tremendously influential introduction to Aristotle’s logic). Whereas Plato grants ontological priority to the immaterial forms and insists that the best knowledge we have is of these archetypical templates, Aristotle’s Categories upends this picture by rendering everyday substances the primary locus of predication:

All the other things are either said of the primary substances as subjects or in them as subjects. So if the primary substances did not exist it would be impossible for any of the other things to exist (trans. Ackrill, 2b4-6).

For Aristotle, predicates apply only to individual substances; they do not correspond to hypostasized, otherworldly Platonic essences such as goodness and beauty. Substances are therefore prior “by nature (tē phusei)” and hence responsible for the existence of the accidents for whom to be is to be in another (Cat. 14b11–13). Mundane substances, not otherworldly forms, ground our knowledge. It was accordingly natural for Aristotelian and Augustinian accounts respectively to downplay and emphasize the need for illumination.

Augustine straightforwardly identifies Plato’s forms with the divine ideas (De diversis Quaestionibus octoginta tribus liber unus, q. 46, 1-2). And Augustine’s account of knowledge of God incorporates direct illumination. Augustine’s On The Trinity spells out the abstractive process whereby we approach knowledge of God’s goodness and details the requisite illumination in which the idea of God’s goodness is “impressed” on us:

[Reflect on] ‘this [particular] good’ and ‘that [particular] good’; [and then] take away ‘this’ and ‘that’, and see good itself if you can; so you will see God who is good not by another good, but is the good of every good . . . In all these good things . . . we would be unable to call one better than the other . . . if the idea of the good itself had not been impressed upon us, according to which we approve of something as good, and also prefer one good to another (8.3, quoted in Frank and Wolter, 138).

For his part, Scotus holds that were the human intellect so weak as to require an illumination to form concepts of God, this very weakness would likewise undercut our ability to receive these concepts (Ord. I, d. 3, pt. 1, q. 4, n. 225, Vat. III:136). Rather, Scotus will allow for a general form of illumination to the extent that God both produces objects in intelligible being and is also that in virtue of which these objects move us to understanding (Ord. I, d. 3, pars 1, q. 4, n. 268, Vat. III: 163-64). Accordingly, Scotus believes that we can form concepts proper to God and creatures through purely natural means, apart from any special activity on the part of God over and above God’s having put into place certain factors. Scotus spells out how we do this in a discussion that runs parallel to Augustine’s while avoiding any reference to special illumination in the acquisition of concepts univocal to God and creatures:

Every metaphysical inquiry about God proceeds in this fashion: the formal notion of something is considered; the imperfection associated with this notion in creatures is removed, and then, retaining the same formal notion, we ascribe to it the ultimate degree of perfection and then attribute it to God . . . Consequently, every inquiry regarding God is based upon the supposition that the intellect has the same univocal concept which it obtained from creatures (Ibid., qq. 1-2, n. 39, Vat: III:26).

c. Analogy and Univocity

Scotus believes that natural theology rests (tacitly or otherwise) on the assumption that experience furnishes concepts univocal to God and creatures. But is not Scotus overhasty in his univocity-or-nothing approach to knowledge of God (see above, section 5a)? After all, for Scotus’s contemporaries, analogy is good enough for the purposes of natural theology. Thomas Aquinas makes this point when he states that whereas we lack terms univocal to God and creatures, demonstration can nevertheless proceed by means of analogical terms:

No name is predicated univocally of God and of creatures. Neither, on the other hand, are names applied to God and creatures in a purely equivocal sense, as some have said. Because if that were so, it follows that from creatures nothing could be known or demonstrated about God at all; for the reasoning would always be exposed to the fallacy of equivocation. Such a view is against the philosophers, who proved many things about God, and also against what the Apostle says: “The invisible things of God are clearly seen being understood by the things that are made” (Romans 1:20). Therefore, it must be said that these names are said of God and creatures in an analogous sense (ST Ia.13.5c).

Medieval theories of analogy develop out of Aristotle’s Physics and Metaphysics, where he discusses the many meanings that we attach to the term ‘being’. In the latter work, Aristotle investigates the possibility of metaphysics as the universal science of being qua being, ranging from substances and their modes or accidents to the first unmoved mover (4.1, 6.1). But, demonstration is not transcategorial, as diverse entities have nothing in common (Posterior Analytics 1.7; see also above, 2b). Hence, to function as a science that cuts across the categories, metaphysics uses what Aristotle terms ‘pros hen (toward one)’ equivocation or analogy, which conceives diverse entities under a concept that applies primarily to one and in a secondary or derivative sense to the other. Hence even accidents are termed ‘beings’ inasmuch as they derive their existence from substances of whom being is properly said (Metaph. 4.2). Aquinas uses Aristotle’s scheme to cast metaphysics as the study of creatures and God as their source, reliant on terms that signify in prior and posterior senses to supply the science with its universality (Wippel).

Separating the likes of Aquinas, on the one hand, and Scotus, on the other, were the Condemnations of 1277, drafted as a reaction to so-called Latin Averroist readings of Aristotle that developed out of the reception of the commentaries on Aristotle of the Muslim philosopher Averroes (d. 1198 C.E.), Latin Averroism suggested a possible disparity between truths of reason, on the one hand, and revelation, on the other. Though he was a strident and successful critic of this interpretation of Aristotle, some of Aquinas’s views were lumped in with those of the Averroists, leading to the condemnation of certain of Aquinas’s positions, for instance, that we can know of God only that God is, or exists. (In 1325, two years after Aquinas’s canonization, the Condemnations were repealed to the extent that they touched on his works.) Henry of Ghent (d. 1293), who had a hand in drafting the Condemnations, viewed Aquinas as too apophatic. Whereas Aquinas held that metaphysics studies God only indirectly as the cause of categorial beings, Henry construes metaphysics as the study of being taken absolutely, comprising both God and creatures (Dumont 1998b). Again, Henry holds that we have essential or quidditative knowledge of God (quidditative knowledge answers the question ‘What is it (Quid est)?’). Quidditative knowledge of God is of the divine attributes grasped in an imperfect or quasi-accidental manner (Dumont 1998a). Such knowledge of God and so broad a metaphysics requires concepts that are general enough to apply to God and creatures without suggesting that the two share in anything real, so as to avoid collapsing the metaphysical distance between them. As we shall see, Henry’s attempt to accommodate this demand will open the door to Scotus’s univocity thesis. Henry seeks concepts sufficiently general to apply to God and creatures in a model of pseudo-concepts of being and the various perfections, which concepts initially strike us as common to God and creatures owing to the concepts’ vagueness. On reflection, these pseudo-concepts are exposed as each being the conflation of two concepts, one proper to God, the other to creatures. As the pseudo-concept in fact comprises utterly distinct concepts, its existence does not entail that God and creatures actually share in any real feature. Henry calls these distinct concepts ‘analogical’ with respect to one another as they are of traits that apply primarily to God and in a derivative sense to creatures – though Henry sometimes speaks of the vague pseudo-concept itself as an analogous concept (Summa, a. 21, q. 3). The analogous concept that pertains only to God is ‘negatively undetermined’ (not open to any further determination by means of some advening perfection), whereas its creaturely counterpart is ‘privitively undetermined’ (conceived apart from the determinations that are bound up with its instantiations in creatures). It is because in either case the concepts are of being and its attributes as undetermined (either negatively or privitively) that the concepts were initially conflated (see Dumont 1998a and 1998b, and Quodlibeta 13, q. 10; Summa a. 21, q. 2; a.24, qq. 6-7).

Henry’s pseudo-concept that merely seems common to God and creatures is the progenitor of Scotus’s univocal concepts under which we conceive both. Scotus sees that if Henry’s account is correct, concepts of creatures tell us nothing of the creator and hence experience teaches us nothing of God. Hence, Scotus contends that on Henry’s account, an analogical concept of God is in fact “entirely different from a concept said of a creature” (Ord. I, d. 2, qq. 1-2, n. 26, Vat. III:18). Scotus therefore replaces the analogous pseudo-concept with the univocal concept and modalizes negative and privitive indetermination into the degrees of intensity that characterize the instantiation of traits in God and creatures, respectively (Dumont, 1992). Scotus’s attack on analogy is then directed at Henry’s version of analogy, which supposes radically distinct concepts only mistakenly thought to pertain to God and creatures. As regards the traditional sense of analogy wherein terms apply primarily to God and in a secondary sense to creatures, Scotus would likely insist that if religious language does not preserve a univocal conceptual content common to both senses, it devolves into chance equivocity as discussed above in section 2a (Williams 2005 and Cross 2012).

6. Metaphysics as Natural Theology

Scotus takes up the notion of the univocal concept of being that renders metaphysics a natural theology in response to the question as to whether we have natural knowledge of God. Ultimately, Scotus will conclude that although we cannot naturally grasp the divine essence in its individuality as it is distinct from all things, we nevertheless can naturally acquire a concept whereby we conceive God essentially and quidditatively as the subject of inherence with respect to the divine attributes. Scotus distinguishes his theory from Henry’s on the grounds that the latter’s quidditative knowledge of God does not pertain directly to the divine essence but is rather “quasi accidental (quasi per accidens)” (Ord. I, d. 3, pt. 1, qq. 1-2, nn. 25, 56, Vat. III.16-17, 38-39). As regards the properties of the divine essence that we arrive at in metaphysics, for Scotus these remain identical with the divine essence and yet formally distinct from one another inasmuch as they may be considered without reference to one another. (Scotus recognizes a formal distinction between inseparable aspects (or formalities) of one and the same individual, for example, an individual’s rationality and animality, such that they may be considered apart from one another. In the case of the divine essence the formal distinction implies even less composition than in that of creatures, wherein various formal aspects united in an essence perfect one another, as, for example, the rational quality may perfect animal nature. See Hall 136, n. 38; Noone; King, n. 13; Ross and Bates n. 13; Alluntis and Wolter 505-09). Nevertheless, as our grasp of what we would attribute to God leaves off at the level of a univocal concept under which we conceive both God and creatures in a manner that is proper to neither, we do not know the divine essence in a proper and particular manner; our finite mind’s finite grasp of a concept univocal to God and creatures proves inadequate when we allow that the attribute thus conceived is constituent of the infinite divine essence (see above, section 4). Scotus’s caution on this point grows out of his understanding of the unity in diversity of the divine essence. An infinite entity must possess every perfection of being (Quodlibet 5.8-9) while remaining utterly simple (De primo principio 4.75). Moreover, God’s infinite being exceeds finite being beyond any relative measure or proportion (Quodlibet 5.9). Hence the distance between God and creatures is secure.

a. Metaphysics and the Transcendentals

Scotus conceives of metaphysics as the universal science of what he terms the transcendentals as such (Questions on the Metaphysics, prologue). The medieval theory of the transcendentals has its roots in Plato and Aristotle and was developed by Augustine, Boethius, Pseudo-Dionysius the Areopagite (late-fifth or early-sixth century C.E.) and Avicenna (d. 1037 C.E.). Phillip the Chancellor codifies the theory in his Summa de bono, which asks how we speak of both God and creatures as good and proposes that goodness pertains to God and creatures (in respectively absolute and relative senses) inasmuch as goodness (and unity and truth) are transcendental attributes or properties of being as such.

Following Aristotle (Cat. 5), medieval thinkers recognize ten categories or highest genera of things that are, substance, on the one hand, and its various accidental modes (such as quantity, quality, relation, and so forth), on the other (see above, section 2b). The ten categories together comprise all things except God. Since the transcendentals are the attributes of being as such (that is, as conceptually prior to its division into finite (categorial) and infinite (divine) being), they therefore cut horizontally across the various categories and extend vertically to take in God and creatures. As regards unity, truth and goodness, these were thought to be coextensive properties of being. Apart from the coextensive properties of being, Scotus’s account of the transcendentals recognizes transcendental pure perfections and disjunctions. From Anselm’s (d. 1109 C.E.) Monologion, Scotus derives the notion of pure perfections as perfections that are absolutely and unqualifiedly better than whatever is incompatible with them. Hence it is better to be wise than not and if a dog cannot be wise it would be better for it were it not a dog but rather something that can attain wisdom (De Primo Principio 4.10). Transcendental disjunctions, on the other hand, are disjunctions whose extremes take in all things, for example, finite-infinite (Ord. I, d. 8, q. 3). Note that only the attributes of being are coextensive with all beings. The disjunctions are opposed to one another in the sense that they are mutually exclusive within one and the same individual and the pure perfections do not characterize all entities (neither dogs nor instances of whiteness are wise). Hence, strictly speaking, the pure perfections and disjunctions are transcendental only inasmuch as they aren’t contained under any one particular genus and not because they characterize all things.

As noted, transcendentals pertain to being as such prior to its division into finite and infinite being. Yet, Scotus does not hypostasize being as such. He does not maintain that being as such exists somehow independently of either God or creatures. Rather, all being is modalized being, infinite or finite being. Scotus’s talk of being considered in its indifference to finite and infinite modes refers to the univocal concept of being that pertains to both God and creatures in a manner that is not proper to either inasmuch as the univocal concept does not take into account the relevant modal characteristics that govern its various instantiations. But when we account for the relevant modal factors, this results in the production of new, complex concepts. As Scotus points out, we can be certain that God is a being, whereas we remain in doubt as to whether God is a finite or an infinite being and hence the complex concept of infinite being that is affirmed of God differs from both the simple, univocal concept of being, on the one hand, and that of creaturely, finite being, on the other (Ord. I, d. 3, pt. 1, qq. 1-2, n. 27, Vat.III:18) (see above, section 4).

Working out the implications of metaphysics as the science of the transcendentals as such, Scotus believes that the metaphysician is able to demonstrate that God exists and can ascribe to God various perfections and attributes. Proof of the existence of God draws on transcendental disjunctions such as necessary-or-contingent and relies on the principle that “as a general rule by positing the less noble extreme of some being, we can conclude that the nobler extreme is realized in some other being” (Ibid. d. 39, n. 13). Hence, Scotus’s strategy is to demonstrate God’s existence by means of transcendental disjunctions such as ‘necessary-contingent’:

If some being is contingent, then some being is necessary. For . . . it is not possible for the more imperfect extreme of the disjunction to be existentially predicated of being particularly taken, unless the more perfect extreme be existentially verified of some other being upon which it depends (Ibid.). (For the complete proof, with commentary, see Frank and Wolter, 40-107. Other versions of the proof are at Lect. 1, d. 2, q. 1, nn. 38–135; Reportatio 1, d. 2, q. 1; and De primo principio).

Moreover, the metaphysician’s proof is superior to the natural philosopher’s Aristotelian proofs of an unmoved mover, inasmuch as we know God more perfectly and immediately when we conceive God as necessary being rather than as first mover (as the former attribute is more intimately bound up with the divine essence). As regards perfections and attributes of the divine essence, the latter are known to belong to God inasmuch as they characterize all things, whereas the former are ascribed by means of a perfect-being theology that endorses the principle that pure perfections belong necessarily and in the highest degree to the highest nature (De primo principio, 4.3). Hence when the natural theologian has deduced that God is the highest being, the pure perfections are then known to apply to the divine essence, with our creaturely understanding of these perfections serving as the basis of our knowledge of God (Wolter, 1950).

b. Does Scotus “Destroy All Philosophy?”

Scotus’s natural theology rises or falls with the success or failure of the univocity thesis. Univocity is not supposed to be transcategorial; hence, Scotus’s contemporaries use analogy to predicate across the highest genera and of God and creatures (see above, sections 2a and 5c). On this scheme, Scotus’s claim that being (and with being its transcendental attributes) is univocal to God and creatures and this risks elevating being to a highest genus (see above, section 2b); how else can the concepts of being and its transcendental attributes be univocal across the categories on an Aristotelian worldview? Yet being cannot be a genus, genera are not said of their differences and yet the differences that specify types of beings certainly do exist (see above, section 2b). Perhaps even worse, were being a genus over God and creatures, God and creatures would then agree in some reality, rendering God metaphysically complex (composed of that common reality along with a reality that would uniquely determine the divine essence) and of a kind with creatures. God would no longer be God.

Scotus recognizes that the thesis of the univocity of being and its transcendental attributes would appear to ask that being function as a super-genus above the ten highest genera and that his scheme therefore threatens to collapse the metaphysical space that separates God and creatures. Scotus’s solution is to use the concept of being as such (that is, as conceptually prior to its division into finite (categorial) and infinite (divine) being) as a stand in for any such super-genus. Unlike such a super-genus, however, the concept of being as such is a mental abstraction that does not pertain to anything at all until the relevant modal considerations have been introduced and hence God and creatures needn’t agree in anything real in order to be conceived under the concepts of being as such its transcendental attributes. As noted, however, Scotus suggests that these modal differences entail a difference of kind: “The infinite exceeds the finite in being beyond any relative measure or proportion that could be assigned” (Quodl. 5.9). Be that as it may, the univocity thesis does not concern what God is. The thesis is about how we think and talk about God and the conditions to which religious language must conform in order to advance sound arguments. Hence the univocity of concepts under which both God and creatures are conceived is compatible with the metaphysical gap between God and creatures. But, it should be noted that the distance between God and creatures does not prevent our learning about God through experience. Like other medieval thinkers, Scotus holds that the attributes we ascribe to God belong primarily to God and in a secondary or derivative manner to creatures. Though the understanding of the attributes in question that we build up through experience is admittedly imperfect, it is nevertheless an understanding of God. Accordingly, Scotus’s univocity thesis conforms to the medieval consensus that inasmuch as concepts are of creatures that imperfectly imitate or represent God, they are of God imperfectly conceived (Ord. I, d. 3, pt. 1, qq. 1-2, n. 56, Vat III:38-39; pt. 2, q. 2, q. un., n. 294, Vat. III:179).

7. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

  • Aquinas, Thomas. Summa Theologica. Translated by Fathers of the English Dominican Province.
  • Aristotle. The Complete Works of Aristotle: The Revised Oxford Translation. Edited by J. Barnes. 2 volumes. Bollingen Series. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1984.
  • Duns Scotus, John. Opera omnia. Edited by C. Balić, et al. Vatican Scotistic Commission. Rome: Polyglot Press, 1950-
  • Duns Scotus, John. Duns Scotus on Time and Existence: The Questions on Aristotle’s ‘De interpretatione’. Translated with introduction and commentary by Edward Buckner and Jack Zupko. Washington, D.C.: The Catholic University of America Press, 2014.
  • Duns Scotus, John. Duns Scotus, Metaphysician. Translated and edited with commentary by William A. Frank and Allan B. Wolter. West Lafayette, Indiana: Purdue University Press, 1995.
  • Duns Scotus, John. John Duns Scotus, Philosophical Writings: A Selection. Translated with introduction and notes by Allan Wolter. Foreword by Marilyn McCord Adams. Indianapolis: Hackett, 1987.
  • Duns Scotus, John. John Duns Scotus, God and Creatures: The Quodlibetal Questions. Translated with introduction, notes, and glossary by Felix Alluntis and Allan B. Wolter. Princeton, N.J: Princeton University Press, 1975.
  • Duns Scotus, John. John Duns Scotus, A Treatise on God as First Principle. Translated and edited with commentary by Allan B. Wolter. Chicago: Franciscan Herald, 1984
  • Ghent, Henry. Quodlibeta Magistri Henrici Goethals a Gandavo Doctoris Solemnis. Paris, I. Badius, 1518; repr. In 2 vols., Louvain, Bibliothèquee, SJ, 1961.
  • Ghent, Henry. Summa quaestionem ordinariarum. Paris 1520; repr. In 2 vols., ST. Bonaventure, NY, Franciscan Institute, 1953.
  • Ockham, William. Opera Philosophica I - Summa Logicae St. Bonaventure, N.Y: Editiones Instituti Franciscani Universitatis S. Bonaventurae, 1974. 899 p., eds. Boehner, Philotheus, Gál, Gedeon, 1915- Brown, Stephen.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Burrell, David. “John Duns Scotus: The Univocity of Analogous Terms.” The Monist 49 (October 1965) 639-58.
  • Cross, Richard. Duns Scotus. Oxford, 1999.
  • Cross, Richard. “Where Angels Fear to Tread.” Antonianum 76 (2001): 7-41.
  • Cross, Richard. “Duns Scotus on God.” Ashgate, 2005.
  • Cross, Richard. “Univocity and Mystery.” In New Essays on Metaphysics as Scientia Transcendens. Edited by Roberto Hofmeister Pich. Fédération Internationale des Instituts d'Études Médiévales, 2007.
  • Cross, Richard. “Duns Scotus and Analogy: A Brief Note.” The Modern Schoolman 89:3/4 (2012): 147-54.
  • Dumont, Stephen D. “The Univocity of the Concept of Being in the Fourteenth Century: John Duns Scotus and William of Alnwick.” Mediaeval Studies 49 (1987): 1-31.
  • Dumont, Stephen D. “Transcendental Being: Scotus and Scotists.” Topoi 11 (Sept. 1992): 135-48.
  • Dumont, Stephen D. “Henry of Ghent and Duns Scotus.” Medieval Philosophy 3 (1998a): 291-328.
  • Dumont, Stephen D. “Scotus’s Doctrine of Univocity and the Medieval Tradition of Metaphysics.” In Was ist Philosophie im Mittelalter? Edited by Jan Aertsen and Andreas Speer. Walter de Gruyter, 1998b.
  • Goris, Wouter and Aertsen, Jan, "Medieval Theories of Transcendentals", The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Summer 2013 Edition), Edward N. Zalta (ed.), URL = http://plato.stanford.edu/archives/sum2013/entries/transcendentals-medieval/
  • Gracia, Jorge J. E. “Categories Vs. Genera: Suárez’s Difficult Balancing Act.” In Categories and What is Beyond. Proceedings of the Society for Medieval Logic and Metaphysics Volume 2. Cambridge Scholars Publishing, 2011: 7-18.
  • Hall, Alexander. Thomas Aquinas and John Suns Scotus: Natural Theology in the High Middle Ages. Bloomsbury, 2009.
  • Hall, Alexander “Confused Univocity?” In Proceedings of the Society for Medieval Logic and Metaphysics 7 (2007): 18-31; reprinted in Medieval Metaphysics; or is It “Just Semantics”?  Cambridge Scholars Publishing, 2011. Co-edited with Gyula Klima.
  • Ingham, Mary Beth. “RE-Situating Scotist Thought.” Modern Theology 21:4 (2005): 609-618.
  • King, Peter. “Scotus on Metaphysics.” In The Cambridge Companion to Duns Scotus. Edited by Thomas Williams, 15-68. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2003.
  • Klima, Gyula. “Nominalist Semantics.” In The Cambridge History of Medieval Philosophy. Volume 1. Edited by Robert Pasnau and Christina Van Dyke, 159-172.
  • Kraut, Richard. The Cambridge Companion to Plato. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1992.
  • Marrone, Steven. “The Notion of Univocity in Duns Scotus’s Early Works.” Franciscan Studies 43 (1983): 347-95.
  • Noone, Timothy. “Alnwick on the Origin, Nature and Function of the Formal Distinction.” In Franciscan Studies 53 (1993): 231-61.
  • Pickstock, Catherine. After Writing: On the Liturgical Consummation of Philosophy. Oxford: Blackwell Publishers, 1998.
  • Pickstock, Catherine. “Duns Scotus: His Historical and Contemporary Significance.” Modern Theology 21, no. 4 (2005): 543-574.
  • Pini, Giorgio. Categories and Logic in Duns Scotus: An Interpretation of Aristotle's Categories in the Late Thirteenth Century. Studien und Texte zur Geistesgeschichte des Mittelalters, Bd. 77. Brill, 2002.
  • Pini, Giorgio. “Univocity in Scotus’s Quaestiones Super Metaphysicam: The Solution to a Riddle.” Medioevo 30 (2005a): 69-110.
  • Pini, Giorgio. “Scotus’s Realist Conception of the Categories: His Legacy to late Medieval Debates.” In Vivarium 43.1 (2005b): 63-110.
  • Pini, Giorgio. “Two Models of Thinking: Thomas Aquinas and John Duns Scotus on Occurrent Thoughts.” In Intentionality, Cognition, and Mental Representation in Medieval Philosophy, edited by Gyula Klima, 81-103. Medieval Philosophy: Texts and Studies. Fordham University Press, 2015.
  • Read, Stephen. “Concepts and Meaning in Medieval Philosophy.” In Intentionality, Cognition, and Mental Representation in Medieval Philosophy, edited by Gyula Klima, 9-28. Medieval Philosophy: Texts and Studies. Fordham University Press, 2015.
  • Ross, James and Todd Bates. “Duns Scotus on Natural Theology.” In The Cambridge Companion to Duns Scotus. Edited by Thomas Williams, 193-238. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2003.
  • Trakakis, N. N. “Does Univocity Entail Idolatry?” Sophia 49 (2010): 535-555.
  • Williams, Thomas, ed. The Cambridge Companion to Duns Scotus. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2003.
  • Williams, Thomas. “The Doctrine of Univocity is True and Salutary.” Modern Theology 21, no. 4 (2005): 575-585.
  • Wipple, John. “Metaphysics.” In The Cambridge Companion to Aquinas. Edited by Norman and Eleonore Stump, 85-127. Cambridge, Cambridge University Press, 1993.
  • Wolter, Allan B. Transcendentals and their Function in the Metaphysics of Duns Scotus. New York: St. Bonaventure, 1946.

 

Author Information

Alexander Hall
Email: AlexanderHall@clayton.edu
Clayton State University
U. S. A.