Self-Consciousness

Philosophical work on self-consciousness has mostly focused on the identification and articulation of specific epistemic and semantic peculiarities of self-consciousness, peculiarities which distinguish it from consciousness of things other than oneself. After drawing certain fundamental distinctions, and considering the conditions for the very possibility of self-consciousness, this article discusses the nature of those epistemic and semantic peculiarities.

The relevant epistemic peculiarities are mainly those associated with the alleged infallibility and self-intimation of self-consciousness. It has sometimes been thought that our consciousness of ourselves may be, under certain conditions, infallible, in the sense that it cannot go wrong: when we believe that some fact about us obtains, it does. It has also sometimes been thought that some forms of consciousness are self-intimating: if a certain fact about us obtains, we are necessarily going to be conscious that it does. These claims have come under heavy attack in more recent philosophical work, but it remains unclear whether some restricted forms of infallibility and self-intimation survive the attack.

The relevant semantic peculiarities have emerged in recent work in philosophy of language and mind. Two of them stand out: the so-called immunity to error through misidentification of our consciousness of ourselves and the special character of self-regarding (or de se) consciousness that cannot be assimilated to other kinds of consciousness. Some philosophers have argued that these are not genuine features of self-consciousness, while others have argued that, although genuine, they are not peculiar to self-consciousness. Other philosophers have defended the proposition that these features are genuine and peculiar to self-consciousness. We will consider the case for these claims in due course.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
  2. Self-Consciousness: Some Distinctions
  3. (How) Is Self-Consciousness Possible?
  4. Epistemic Peculiarities of Self-Consciousness
  5. Semantic Peculiarities of Self-Consciousness
    1. Immunities to Error through Misidentification
    2. Essential Indexicals and De Se Thoughts
  6. Conclusion: A General Theory of Self-Consciousness?
  7. References and Further Reading

1. Introduction

Throughout our waking life, we are conscious of a variety of things. We are often conscious of other people, of cars, trees, beetles, and other objects around us. We are conscious of their features: their colors, their shapes, and the sound they make. We are conscious of events involving them: car accidents, tree blooming, and so forth.

Sometimes we are also conscious of ourselves, our features, and the events that take place within us. Thus, we may become conscious, in a certain situation, of the fact that we are nervous or uncomfortable. We may become conscious of a rising anxiety, or of a sudden cheerfulness. Sometimes we are conscious of simpler things: that we are seeing red, or that we are thinking of tomorrow’s errands.

In addition, we sometimes have the sense that we are continuously conscious of ourselves going about our business in the world. Thus William James, who was very influential in the early days of experimental, systematic psychology (in addition to being the brother of novelist Henry James and a gifted writer himself), remarked once that “whatever I may be thinking of, I am always at the same time more or less aware of myself, of my personal existence” (James 1961: 42).

These forms of self-consciousness—consciousness of ourselves and our personal existence, of our character traits and standing features, and of the thoughts that occur to us and the feelings that we experience—are philosophically fascinating, inasmuch as they are at once quite mysterious and closest to home. Our scientific theories of astrophysical objects that are incredibly distant from us in both space and time, or of the smallest particles that make up the sub-atomic layer of reality, are mature, sophisticated, and impressive. By contrast, we barely have anything worth the name “scientific theory” for self-consciousness and its various manifestations, in spite of self-consciousness’ being so much more familiar a phenomenon—indeed the most familiar phenomenon of all.

Here, as elsewhere, the immaturity of our scientific understanding of self-consciousness invites philosophical reflection on the topic, and is anyway partly due precisely to deep philosophical puzzles about the nature of self-consciousness. Many philosophers have thought that self-consciousness exhibits certain peculiarities not to be found in consciousness of things other than ourselves, and indeed possibly not to be found anywhere else in nature.

Philosophical work on self-consciousness has thus mostly focused on the identification and articulation of these peculiarities. More specifically, it has sought some epistemic and semantic peculiarities of self-consciousness, that is, peculiarities as regards how we know, and more generally how we represent, ourselves and our internal lives. (In philosophical jargon, “epistemology” is the theory of knowledge and “semantics” is—more or less—the theory of representation.) This entry will accordingly focus on these peculiarities. After drawing certain fundamental distinctions, and considering the conditions for the very possibility of self-consciousness, we will discuss first the nature of the relevant epistemic peculiarities and then (more extensively) the semantic ones.

2. Self-Consciousness: Some Distinctions

Let us start by drawing some distinctions. (The distinctions I will draw are meant as conceptual distinctions. Whether they stand for real differences between the properties putatively picked out by the relevant concepts is a separate matter.) The first important distinction is between self-consciousness as a property of whole individuals and self-consciousness as a property of particular mental states. Thus, when we say “My thought that p is self-conscious” and “I am self-conscious,” the property we ascribe is in all likelihood different. My being self-conscious involves my being conscious of my self. But my thought’s being self-conscious does not involve my thought’s being conscious of its self, since (i) it does not have a self, and (ii) thoughts are not the kind of thing that can be conscious of anything. We may call the property that I have creature self-consciousness and the property that my thought has state self-consciousness.

Another distinction is between consciousness of oneself (one’s self) and consciousness of a particular event or state that occurs within oneself. Compare “I am self-conscious of myself thinking that p” to “I am self-conscious of my thought that p.” The latter involves awareness of a particular thought of mine, but need not involve awareness of self or selfhood. It is a form of self-consciousness in the sense that it is directed inward, and takes as its object an internal state of mine. But it is not a form of self-consciousness in the stronger sense of involving consciousness of self. I will refer to the stronger variety as strong self-consciousness and the weaker as weak self-consciousness. State self-consciousness is consciousness of what happens within oneself, whereas creature self-consciousness is consciousness of oneself proper. (Note, however, that a mental state may be both creature- and state-self-conscious. Thus, if I am conscious of my thought that p as my thought, as a thought of mine, then I am conscious both of my thought and of myself.)

Another traditional distinction, which dates back to Kant, is between consciousness of oneself qua object and consciousness of oneself qua subject. Suppose I am conscious of Budapest (or of Budapest and its odors). I am the subject of the thought, its object is Budapest. But suppose now that I am conscious of myself (or of myself and my feelings). Now I am both the subject and the object of the thought. But although the subject and the object of the thought happen to be the same thing, there is still a conceptual distinction to be made between myself in my capacity as object of thought and myself in my capacity as subject of thought. That is to say, even though there is one entity here, there are two separate concepts for this entity, the self-as-subject concept and the self-as-object concept. To mark this difference, William James (1890) introduced a technical distinction between the I and the me. In its technical use, “I” (and its Mentalese correlate) refers to the self-as-subject, whereas “me” (and its Mentalese correlate) refers to the self-as-object. By “Mentalese correlate,” I mean the expression that would mean the same as “I” and “me” in something like the so-called language of thought (Fodor 1975) or Mentalese.)

Corresponding to these two concepts, or conceptions, of self, there would presumably be two distinct modes of presentation under which a person may be conscious of herself. She may be conscious of herself under the “I” description or under the “me” description. Thus, my state of self-consciousness may employ either the “I” mode of presentation or the “me” mode of presentation. (We could capture the difference, using James’ technical terminology, by distinguishing “I am self-conscious that I think that p” and “I am self-conscious that methinks that p.”) In the latter case, there is a sort of “conceptual distance” between the thing that does the thinking and the thing being thought about. Although I am thinking of myself, I am not thinking of myself as the thing that does the thinking. By contrast, in the former case, I am thinking of myself precisely as the thing that is therewith doing the thinking.

Through Kant’s influence on Husserl, philosophers in the phenomenological tradition have long held that something like consciousness of self-as-subject is a distinct, irreducible, and central aspect of our mental life. Philosophers in the analytic tradition have been more suspicious of it (for exceptions to this rule, see for instance Van Gulick 1988 and Strawson 1997). But the distinction between consciousness of self-as-subject and consciousness of self-as-object might be captured using analytic tools, through a distinction between transitive and intransitive self-consciousness (Kriegel 2003, 2004a). Compare “I am self-conscious of thinking that p” and “I am self-consciously thinking that p.” In the former, transitive form, self-consciousness is construed as a relation between me and my thinking. In the latter, intransitive form, it is construed as a modification of my thinking. That is, in the latter the self-consciousness term (if you will) does not denote a state of standing in a relation to my thought (or my thinking) that p. Rather, it designates the way I am having my thought (or doing my thinking). In transitive self-consciousness, the thought and the state of self-consciousness are treated as two numerically distinct mental states. By contrast, in intransitive self-consciousness, there is no numerical distinction between the thought and the state of self-consciousness: the thought is the state of self-consciousness. The adverb “self-consciously” denotes a way I am having my thought that p. No extra act of self-consciousness takes place after the thought that p occurs. Rather, self-consciously is how the thought that p occurs.

I have been speaking of the self-as-subject in terms of “the thing that does the thinking,” and correspondingly of consciousness of oneself as subject in terms of consciousness of oneself as the thing that does the thinking. But recent work in philosophical psychopathology counsels caution here. Schizophrenics suffering from “thought insertion” and “alien voices” delusions report that they are not in control of their thoughts. Indeed, they often envisage a particular individual who, they claim, is doing the thinking for them, or implants thoughts in their mind. Note that although they do not experience themselves as doing the thinking, they do experience the thinking as happening, in some sense, in them. To account for the experiential difference between doing the thinking and merely hosting the thinking, between authorship of one’s thoughts and mere ownership of them (respectively), some philosophers have drawn a distinction between consciousness of oneself as agent and consciousness of oneself as subject (Campbell 1999, Graham and Stephens 2000). The distinction between self-as-agent and self-as-subject is orthogonal, however, to the distinction between self-as-object and self-as-subject. To avoid confusion, let us suggest a different terminology, that of self-as-author versus self-as-owner, and correspondingly, of consciousness of oneself as author of one’s thoughts and consciousness of oneself as owner of one’s thoughts. To be sure, in the normal go of things, ownership and authorship are inseparable. But the pathological cases show that there is daylight between the two notions.

Another important distinction is between propositional self-consciousness and non-propositional self-consciousness. There is no doubt that there is such a thing as propositional self-consciousness: consciousness that some self-related proposition obtains. Presumably, such self-consciousness has conceptual content. But a strong case can be made that there is a form of self-consciousness that is sub-propositional, as it were, and has non-conceptual content (Bermúdez 1998). When a report of self-consciousness uses a “that” clause, as we just did, it necessarily denotes propositional self-consciousness. But when it does not, as is the case, for instance, with “I am self-conscious of thinking that p,” it is left open whether it is propositional or non-propositional self-consciousness that is denoted. That is, “I am self-conscious of thinking that p” is compatible with, but does not entail, “I am self-conscious that I am thinking that p.” In any case, the terminology leaves it open whether there is a non-propositional or non-conceptual form of self-consciousness.

Other distinctions can certainly be drawn. I have restricted myself to those that will play a role in the discussion to follow. They are five:

(a) State self-consciousness versus creature self-consciousness
(b) Strong versus weak self-consciousness
(c) Transitive versus intransitive self-consciousness
(d) Consciousness of self-as-object versus consciousness of self-as-subject
(e) Consciousness of self-as-author versus consciousness of self-as-owner

As I warned at the opening, these distinctions are meant as conceptual ones. This is doubly significant. First, the fact that there is a distinction between two concepts does not entail that there is a difference between the putative properties picked out by these concepts. Second, the existence of a concept does not entail the existence of the property putatively picked out by that concept. In fact, philosophers have questioned the very existence of self-consciousness.

3. (How) Is Self-Consciousness Possible?

Perhaps the best known philosophical threat to the very possibility of self-consciousness hails from Hume’s remarks in the Treatise of Human Nature (I, IV, vi): “For my part, when I enter most intimately into what I call myself, I always stumble on some particular perception or other… I never can catch myself without a perception, and never can observe anything but the perception.”

This passage makes two separate claims, of different degrees of skepticism. The modest claim is:

(MC) Upon “turning into” oneself, one cannot “catch” oneself without a particular mental state.

MC rules out the possibility of a mental state whose sole object is the self. But though it disallows catching oneself without a perception, it does not disallow catching oneself with a perception. Hume makes the latter, stronger, immodest claim next, however:

(IC) Upon “turning into” oneself, one cannot “catch” anything but particular mental states.

IC rules out the possibility of any consciousness of one’s self. That is, it rules out the possibility of creature self-consciousness, allowing only for state self-consciousness.

In assessing Hume’s claims, particularly the immodest one, we must ask, first, what did Hume expect to catch? And second, what sort of catching did he have in mind?

One way to deny the possibility of consciousness of oneself is to reject the existence of a self of which one might be conscious. But the inexistence of a self is not a sufficient condition for the impossibility of self-consciousness: there could still be thoroughly and systematically illusory experience of selfhood that gives rise to a form of (illusory) self-consciousness. Nor is such rejection a necessary condition for the impossibility of self-consciousness. Hume himself not only countenanced the self, he offered a theory of it, namely, the bundle theory. What Hume rejected was the existence of a substantival self, a self that is more than just a stream of consciousness and a sum of experiences. What he rejected is the reifying conception of the self according to which the self is an object among others in the world, a substrate that supports the internal goings-on unfolding therein but is distinct from, and somehow stands above, these proceedings. This rejection is shared today by several philosophers (see, for example, Dennett 1991).

This suggests an answer to our first question, concerning what Hume had expected to catch upon turning into himself. What he expected to catch is a self-substance (if you please). It is unclear, however, why Hume thought that consciousness of oneself, even non-illusory consciousness of oneself, required the existence of a substantival self. Consider how self-consciousness might play out within the framework of Hume’s own bundle theory. Upon turning into herself, a person might become conscious of a particular mental state, say an inexplicable cheerfulness, but become conscious of it as belonging to a larger bundle of mental states, perhaps a bundle that has a certain internal cohesion to it at and across time. In that case, we would be well justified to conceive of this person as conscious of her self.

As for the second question, concerning what sort of “catching” Hume had in mind, it appears that Hume envisioned a quasi-perceptual form of catching. He expected self-consciousness to involve some sort of direct encounter with the self. There is no question that one can believe (or otherwise think purely intellectually) that one is inexplicably cheerful. One can surely entertain purely intellectually the proposition “I am inexplicably cheerful.” But Hume wanted more than that. He wanted to be confronted with his self, by turning inward his mind’s eye, as he would with a chair upon directing his outward gaze in the right direction.

In other words, Hume was working with an introspective model of self-consciousness, according to which self-consciousness involves the employment of an inner sense: an internal mechanism whose operation is analogous in essential respects to the operation of the external senses. This inner sense conception was clearly articulated in Locke: “The other fountain [of] ideas, is the perception of the operations of our own minds within us… And though it be not sense, as having nothing to do with external objects; yet it is very like it, and might properly enough be called internal sense” (Essay Concerning Human Understanding II, i, 4).

The plausibility of the introspective model is very much in contention. Thus, Rosenthal (1986) claims that for self-consciousness to be genuinely analogous with perceptual consciousness, the former would have to exhibit the sort of qualitative character the latter does; but since it does not, it is essentially non-perceptual. On this basis, Rosenthal (2004) proceeds to develop an account of self-consciousness in terms of purely intellectual thoughts about oneself (more specifically, thoughts that are entertained in the presence of their object or referent).

On the other hand, self-consciousness can sometimes have a quality of immediacy about it (and its way of putting us in contact with its objects) that seems to parallel perceptual consciousness. At the same time, philosophers have sometimes charged that self-consciousness is in fact too immediate, indeed unmediated, to be thought of as quasi-perceptual. Thus, Shoemaker (1996) argues that the quasi-perceptual model falters in construing self-consciousness along the lines of the act-object analysis that befits perceptual consciousness. When one is perceptually conscious of a butterfly’s meandering, a distinction is always called for between the act of perceptual consciousness and the meandering butterfly it takes as an object. But when one is conscious of one’s cheerfulness, a parallel distinction between the act of self-consciousness and one’s cheerfulness, supposedly thereby taken as object, is misleading, according to Shoemaker.

One way to interpret Shoemaker’s claim here is that while Hume’s argument may be effective against transitive self-consciousness, it is not against intransitive self-consciousness. Recall that transitive self-consciousness requires a duality of mental states, the state of self-consciousness and the state of (for example) cheerfulness. But in intransitive self-consciousness there is no such duality: there is not a distinction between an act of self-consciousness and a separate object taken by it. On this interpretation, Shoemaker’s claim is that being self-conscious of being cheerful may well be impossible, but it is nonetheless possible to be self-consciously cheerful. We might combine Rosenthal’s and Shoemaker’s perspectives and suggest the view that self-consciousness can come in two varieties: intellectual transitive self-consciousness and intransitive self-consciousness. Both varieties escape the clutches of Hume’s threat: one can catch oneself (with a particular mental state) if the catching is intellectual rather than quasi-perceptual, or if the catching is somehow fused into the particular mental state thereby caught. What Hume showed is that quasi-perceptual transitive self-consciousness is impossible; but this leaves untouched the possibility of intellectual transitive self-consciousness and of intransitive self-consciousness.

In summary, it is quite likely that self-consciousness is indeed possible. But reflecting on the conditions of its possibility puts non-trivial constraints on our conception of self-consciousness. In this respect, contending with Hume’s challenge still proves immensely fruitful. If anything, it wakes us from our dogmatic slumber about self-consciousness and brings up the question of the nature of self-consciousness.

One question regarding the nature of self-consciousness that arises immediately is what is to count as having self-consciousness. Many contemporary cognitive scientists have operationalized the notion of self-consciousness in terms of experiments on mirror self-recognition and the so-called “mark test.” In these experiments, a creature’s forehead is marked with a visible stain. When placed in front of a mirror, some creatures try to wipe off the stain, which suggests that they recognize themselves in the mirror, while others do not (see mainly Gallup 1970, 1977). Successes with the mark test are few and far between. Among primates, it is passed with any consistency only by humans, chimpanzees, and orangutans, but not by gorillas or gibbons (Suarez and Gallup 1981); and even humans do not typically pass it before the age of a year and a half (Amsterdam 1972) and chimpanzees not before three years of age nor after sixteen years of age (Povinelli et al. 1993). Outside the group of primates, it is passed only by bottlenose dolphins (Reiss and Marino 2001) and Asian elephants (Plotnik et al. 2006). However, this operational treatment of self-consciousness is problematic at a number of levels. Most importantly, it is not entirely clear what the true relationship between mirror self-recognition and self-consciousness is. One would need a principled account of the latter in order to clarify that matter. Mirror self-recognition experiments thus cannot take precedence over the search for an independent understanding of self-consciousness.

To that end, let us consider the ways in which self-consciousness has been claimed to be different, special, and sometimes privileged, relative to consciousness of things other than oneself. Early modern philosophers, from Descartes on, have often claimed certain epistemic privileges on behalf of self-consciousness. More recently, twentieth century analytic philosophers have attempted to identify certain semantic peculiarities of self-consciousness. We take those up in turns.

4. Epistemic Peculiarities of Self-Consciousness

In what follows, we will consider, somewhat hastily, about a dozen epistemic peculiarities sometimes attributed to self-consciousness. Traditionally, the most discussed special feature claimed on behalf of self-consciousness is infallibility. According to the doctrine of infallibility, one’s consciousness of oneself is always veridical and accurate. We may say that whenever I am self-conscious of thinking that p, I am indeed thinking that p. It is important to note, however, that to the extent that “self-conscious of” is a success verb, this claim would be trivially true, whereas the point of the doctrine under consideration is that it is true even if “self-conscious of” is not a success verb (or also for any non-success uses of the verb). To bypass this technicality, let us insert parenthetically the qualifier “seemingly” into our formulation of the claim. We may formulate the doctrine of infallibility as follows:

(DIF) If I am (seemingly) self-conscious of thinking that p, then I am thinking that p.

Thus, whenever I believe something about myself and my mental life, the belief is true: things are in fact the way I believe them to be.

The doctrine of infallibility ensures that my beliefs about my mental life are true. A parallel doctrine ensures that such beliefs are (epistemically) justified. We may, without too much injustice to traditional terminology, call this the doctrine of incorrigibility. The traditional notion of incorrigibility is the notion that the subject cannot possibly be corrected by anyone else, which suggests that the subject is in possession of (and makes correct use of) all the relevant evidence. We may thus formulate the doctrine of incorrigibility as follows:

(DIC) If I am (seemingly) self-conscious of thinking that p, then I am justifiably (seemingly) self-conscious of thinking that p.

Whereas according to DIF, whenever I believe something about my mental life, my belief is true, according to DIC, whenever I believe something about my mental life, my belief is justified.

Against the background of the tripartite analysis of knowledge, the conjunction of DIC and DIF would entail a doctrine about self-knowledge in general, namely:

(DIK) If I am (seemingly) self-conscious that I am thinking that p, then I know that I am thinking that p.

That is, if I am in a state of self-consciousness whose content is “I am thinking that p”, then my state of self-consciousness will necessarily qualify as knowledge. Note, however, that the thesis is entailed by DIF and DIC only against the background of the tripartite analysis—though it may be independently true. (If the tripartite analysis is incorrect, as it probably is, then the thesis does not follow from the conjunction of DIC and DIF. But it can still be formulated.)

The three doctrines we have considered claim strong privileges on behalf of self-consciousness. But there are stronger ones. Consider the converse of the doctrine of infallibility. DIF ensures that when I am (seemingly) self-conscious of thinking that p, then I am in fact thinking that p. Its converse is a stronger thesis: whenever I think that p, I am self-conscious of doing so. That is, nothing can pass through the mind without the mind taking notice of it. Having a thought entails being self-conscious of having it. Thoughts are, in this sense, self-intimating. We may formulate the doctrine of self-intimation as follows:

(DSI) If I am thinking that p, then I am self-conscious of thinking that p.

Thus, whenever I think something, I inevitably come to believe (or be aware) that I am. Note that DSI entails DIF, because if I am indeed thinking that p, then my self-consciousness of thinking that p must be true or veridical.

A distinction is sometimes made between weak self-intimation and strong self-intimation (Shoemaker 1996). What we have just considered is the weak variety. The strong variety ensures not only that when I think something, I am aware that I think it, but also that when I do not think something, I am aware that I do not think it. Let us formulate the doctrine of strong self-intimation as follows:

(DSSI) If I am thinking that p, then I am self-conscious of thinking that p; and if I am not thinking that p, then I am self-conscious of not thinking that p.

Strong self-intimation renders the mind in some traditional sense transparent to itself. But the term “transparency” has had such wide currency in recent philosophy of mind that it would be better not to use it in the present context.

Consider now the converse of the doctrine of incorrigibility. It is the thesis that if I think that p, then I am justifiably self-conscious of thinking that p. It also entails DIF, as well as DSI. Again, a strong version can be formulated: If I think that p, then I am justifiably self-conscious of thinking that p; and if I do not think that p, then I am justifiably self-conscious of not thinking that p.

Finally, a parallel thesis could be formulated regarding knowledge: If I think that p, then I know that I think that p. The strong version would be:

(OSC) If I think that p, then I know that I think that p, and if I do not think that p, then I know that I do not think that p.

This last feature is probably the strongest epistemic privilege that could be claimed on behalf of self-consciousness. We may call the associated doctrine the Omniscience of Self-Consciousness. For it is the thesis that one knows everything that happens within one’s mind, and everything that does not.

Freud’s work on the unconscious has all but refuted the above doctrines (see especially Freud 1915). Thus few if any philosophers would defend them today. But many may consider restricted versions of them. The above doctrines are formulated in terms of thoughts, understood as mental states in general. But some theses can be formulated that would restrict the epistemic privileges to a special subset of mental states, such as sensations and feelings, or phenomenally conscious states, or some such. A thus restricted self-intimation thesis might read: if I have a sensation S, then I am self-conscious of having S; or, if I have a phenomenally conscious state S, then I am self-conscious of having S.

Counter-examples to even such appropriately restricted theses have been offered in the literature. Staying with self-intimation, it has been suggested that there are sensations and conscious states that occur without their subject’s awareness. Arguably, I may have a sensation—indeed, a phenomenally conscious sensation—of the refrigerator’s hum without becoming self-conscious of it, let alone of myself hearing it.

Consider now a restricted version of the infallibility doctrine: If I am (seemingly) self-conscious of having sensation S, then I do have sensation S. An alleged counter-example is the fraternity initiation story. Suppose that, blindfolded, I am told that a particular spot on my neck is about to be cut with a razor (this is part of my fraternity initiation); then an ice cube is placed on that spot. At the very first instant, I am likely to be under the impression that I am having a pain sensation, while in reality I am having a coldness sensation. That is, at that instant, I am (seemingly) self-conscious of having a pain sensation but do not in fact have a pain sensation, or so the argument goes (see Horgan and Kriegel 2007).

Another way to restrict the above doctrines is by making their claims weaker. Consider the following variation on self-intimation: If I am thinking that p, then I am self-conscious of thinking. Whereas DSI claims that when I have the thought that p, I am self-conscious not just of having a thought, but of having specifically the thought that p, this variation claims only that I am self-conscious of having a thought—some thought.

We can apply strictures of this type to any of the above doctrines, and some of the resulting theses may be quite plausible. Thus, consider the following thesis:

If I am (seemingly) self-conscious of being in a phenomenally conscious state S, then I am in some phenomenally conscious state.

It is difficult to conceive of a situation in which one is aware of oneself as being in some conscious state when in fact one is in no conscious state (and hence is unconscious). In particular, the fraternity initiation tale does not tell against this thesis: although in the story I am not in fact in a pain state, I am nonetheless in some conscious state.

Such nuanced theses may thus survive modern critiques of the traditional doctrines of epistemic privilege. Their exploration in the literature is, in any case, far from complete. But let us move on to the semantic privileges sometimes imputed on self-consciousness.

5. Semantic Peculiarities of Self-Consciousness

a. Immunities to Error through Misidentification

On the two extremes, the first-person pronoun “I” has been claimed by some to be entirely non-referential (Anscombe 1975) and by others to be the only true form of reference (Chisholm 1976 Ch. 3, and in a more nuanced way, Lewis 1979). Presumably, analogous statements could be made about the concept we use in thought in order to think about ourselves in the first person. For convenience, I will call the relevant concept the Mentalese first-person pronoun, or just the Mentalese “I”. Plausibly, the special features of linguistic self-reference (the way “I” refers) derive from, or at least parallel, corresponding features of self-consciousness, and more specifically mental self-reference (the way the Mentalese “I” refers). In the present context, it is the latter that interest us. Our discussion will focus on two main features. In the next section, we will consider the alleged essential indexicality of self-consciousness (Perry 1979) and irreducibility of de se thoughts (Castañeda 1966, 1967, 1968, 1969). (These terms will be explicated in due course.) The present section considers a semantic peculiarity pointed out by Sydney Shoemaker (1968) under the name “immunity to error through misidentification relative to the first-person pronoun” and related peculiarities discussed by Anscombe (1975), Evans (1982), and others.

When I think about things other than myself, there are two ways in which my thoughts may turn out to be false. Suppose I think that my next-door neighbor is a nice person. I may be wrong about either (i) whether he is a nice person or (ii) who my next-door neighbor is. The first error is one of mispredication, if you will, whereas the second is one of misidentification. Thus, if I mistake my neighbor’s tendency to smile for kindness, when in fact it serves a cynical ploy to lure me into signing an unjust petition against the superintendent, then I make a mistake of the first kind. By contrast, if I mistake the mailman for my next-door neighbor, and think that it is my next-door neighbor who is a nice person, when in fact it is the mailman who is, then I make a mistake of the second kind.

In this sense, my thought that my next-door neighbor is a nice person displays a composite structure, involving identification and predication. We may represent this by saying that my thought has the internal structure “my next-door neighbor is the person smiling at me every morning & the person smiling at me every morning is a nice person”, or more generally “my next-door neighbor is the φ & the φ is a nice person”. This is not to say that when I think that my next-door neighbor is a nice person I am thinking this as a conjunction, or that my thought takes a conjunctive proposition as its object. The above conjunctive representation of my thought is meant just as a device to bring out the fact that my thought has a composite structure. The point is just that my thought has two separable components, an identificational component and a predicational component.

Correspondingly, we can envisage three sorts of semantic peculiarity or privilege. (1) There could be a kind of thought K1, such that if a thought T is of that kind, then T can only be false due to misidentification; thoughts of kind K1 are thus immune to error through misidentification. (2) There could be a kind of thought K2, such that if T is of that kind, then T can only be false due to mispredication; thoughts of kind K2 are thus immune to error through mispredication. (3) There could be a kind of thought K3, such that if T is of that kind, then T can be false due to neither mispredication nor misidentification; thoughts of kind K3 are thus immune to error tout court. The above are just definitions of privileges. It remains to be seen whether any of these definitions is actually satisfied. Shoemaker’s claim is that the first definition is indeed satisfied by a certain subset of thoughts about oneself.

Note that the third peculiarity, immunity to error tout court, is basically infallibility. This way of conceiving of immunity to error through misidentification brings out its relation to the more traditional doctrine of infallibility. Unlike the latter, the doctrine of immunity to error through misidentification does not claim blanket immunity. But it does restrict in a principled manner the ways in which the relevant thoughts may turn out to be false. If I think that I feel angry, then I can be wrong about whether that is a feeling I really have, but I cannot be wrong about whom it is that is allegedly angry.

We said that according to Shoemaker, a certain subset of thoughts about oneself is immune to error through misidentification. What subset? One can think about oneself under any number of descriptions. And some descriptions one may not be aware of as applying to one. Thus, I may think that my mother’s nieceless brother’s only nephew is brown-eyed, without being aware that I am my mother’s nieceless brother’s only nephew. In that case, I think about myself, but not as myself. We might say that I have a thought about myself, but not a self-aware thought about myself. Let us call self-aware thoughts about oneself I-thoughts. According to Shoemaker, some I-thoughts are immune to error through misidentification, namely, those I-thoughts that are directed to one’s mind and mental life, as opposed to one’s body and corporeal life. (To take an example from Wittgenstein, suppose I see in the mirror a tangle of arms and I mistakenly take the nicest one to be mine. I may think to myself “I have a nice arm.” In that case, I may not only be wrong about whether my arm is nice, but also about whom it is that has a nice arm. Such an I-thought, being about my body, is not immune to error through misidentification. But my thoughts about my mind are so immune, claims Shoemaker.) More accurately, as we will see later on, Shoemaker holds that absolute, as opposed to circumstantial, immunity to error through misidentification applies only to mental I-thoughts.

We should distinguish two versions of the doctrine of immunity. According to the first, the relevant I-thoughts cannot be false through misidentification because the identifications they involve are always and necessarily correct; call this the infallible identification (II) version of the doctrine of immunity. According to the second version, the relevant I-thoughts cannot be false through misidentification because they do not involve identification in the first place; call this the identificationless reference (IR) version of the doctrine of immunity. (Brook [2001] speaks of ascriptionless reference, which may also be a good label for the specific feature under consideration.) Both versions claim a certain distinction on behalf of the relevant I-thoughts, but the distinction is very different. The first version claims the distinction of infallible identification, whereas the second one claims the distinction of dispensable identification.

Shoemaker appears to hold the IR version (see, for example, Shoemaker 1968: 558). In some respects this is the more radical version. On the II version, I-thoughts have the same composite structure as other thoughts. When I think that I am amused, the content of my thought has the structure “I am the φ & the φ is amused”. It is just that there is something special about the identificational component in the relevant I-thoughts that makes it impervious to error. Whenever I think that I am the φ, I am. The IR version is more radical. It claims that the relevant I-thoughts do not have the same composite structure as other thoughts—that they are structurally different. More specifically, they lack any identificational component. My thought that I am amused hooks onto me in some direct, identification-free way.

The distinction between these two versions is important, because the burden of argument is very different in each case. To make the case for II, one would have to argue that the relevant self-identifications are infallible. To make the case for IR, by contrast, one would have to argue that the relevant I-thoughts are identification-free. There is also a corresponding difference in explanatory burden. II must explain how is it that certain acts of identification are impervious to error, whereas IR must explain how is it that some acts of reference can dispense with identification altogether (How do they hook onto the right referent without identifying it?).

Shoemaker’s (1968) argument for IR, in its barest outlines, proceeds as follows. Suppose (for reductio) that every self-reference required self-identification. Then every thought with a content “I am F” would have the internal structure “I am the φ & the φ is F”. That is, ascertaining that one is F would require that one identify oneself as the φ and then establish that the φ is F. But this would entail that the same would apply to “I am the φ”: it would have to have the internal structure “I am the ψ & the ψ is the φ”. That is, in order to ascertain that one is the φ, one would have to first identify oneself as the ψ and then establish that the ψ is the φ. And so on ad infinitum. To avert infinite regress, at least some self-reference must be identification-free.

To claim that immunity to error through misidentification is a peculiarity of self-consciousness is to claim that it is a feature peculiar to self-consciousness. One can deny this claim in two ways: (i) by arguing that it is not a feature of self-consciousness, and (ii) by arguing that it is not peculiar to self-consciousness (that is, although it is a feature of self-consciousness, it is also a feature of other forms of consciousness).

Several philosophers have pursued (i). Perhaps the most widely discussed argument is the following, due to Gareth Evans (1982: 108). On the basis of seeing in a mirror a large number of hands, one of which is touching a piece of cloth, and a certain feeling I have in my hand, as of touching a piece of cloth, I come to think that I am feeling a piece of cloth. But this is false, and false due to misidentification: I am not the one who is feeling the piece of cloth. Therefore, there are states of self-consciousness that are not immune to error through misidentification; so such immunity is not a feature of self-consciousness as such.

Arguably, however, this is not a pure case of self-consciousness. The thought in question involves self-consciousness, but it is also partly consciousness of something external, and it is the latter part of it that leads to the error. Consider the difference between the thought “I am feeling a piece of cloth” and the thought “I am having a feeling as of a piece of cloth,” or even more perspicuously, “I am having a cloth-ish feeling.” It is clear that if it turns out to be erroneous that I am having a cloth-ish feeling, it is not because I have misidentified myself in the mirror. Indeed, what I see in the mirror is entirely irrelevant to the truth of my thought that I am having a cloth-ish feeling.

More often, philosophers have pursued (ii), arguing that immunity to error through misidentification is not peculiar to self-consciousness. Evans (1982) himself, for instance, argued that thoughts about one’s body, and even certain perceptions and perception-based judgments, can be equally immune to error through misidentification, indeed be identification-free. When I think that my legs are crossed, my thought seems to be immune to error through misidentification: it cannot turn out that someone’s legs are indeed crossed, but not mine.

One response would be to claim that thoughts about one’s own body are a genuine form of self-consciousness, albeit bodily self-consciousness. But another would be to draw finer distinctions between kinds of immunity and attach a specific sort of immunity to self-consciousness. Shoemaker (1968) distinguished between absolute and circumstantial immunity to error through misidentification, claiming that only the relevant I-thoughts exhibit the absolute variety. In the same vein, McGinn (1983) distinguishes between derivative and non-derivative immunity to error through misidentification, and Pryor (1999) between de re misidentification and which-object misidentification, both claiming that only the relevant I-thoughts exhibit the latter. However, Stanley (1998) erects a considerable challenge to all these attempts. The issue of whether some kind of immunity to error through misidentification is a peculiarity of self-consciousness is still very much debated.

Let us end this section with a few general points. First, immunity to error through misidentification is at bottom a semantic, not an epistemic, peculiarity. It concerns the special way the Mentalese “I” hooks onto its referent. Thus, immunity to error through misidentification is not to be confused with immunity to error through unjustified identification, immunity to unjustifiedness through misidentification, or immunity to unjustifiedness through unjustified identification—all of which would be epistemic peculiarities.

Second, immunity to error through misidentification is a semantic peculiarity of strong self-consciousness, not weak self-consciousness, since it involves essentially consciousness of oneself, not just consciousness of a particular thought of one. So, if I am (seemingly) self-conscious of thinking that p, it may be that I am not thinking that p, but only because it is not thinking that p that I am doing—not because it is not I who is doing the thinking.

Third, Shoemaker’s “discovery” of immunity preceded the Kripkean revolution in philosophy of language and more generally the theory of reference. A question therefore arises concerning the relation between his claim that self-reference is identification-free and Kripke’s claim that many kinds of reference are direct or rigid. Direct reference—which is commonly thought to characterize proper names, natural kind terms, and indexicals—is reference that is sense-free, if you will: it does not employ a sense, or mode of presentation, in hooking onto the referent. What is the relation, then, between sense-free reference and identification-free reference?

A natural thought is that some (perhaps all) senses are identifications, and so identification-freedom is simply one special case of sense-freedom. If so, Shoemaker’s “discovery” may be just a foreshadowing of the Kripkean revolution: it is the discovery of the possibility of sense-free reference, but with an overly restrictive assessment of its scope (where Kripke claimed that all sorts of representational devices are sense-free, Shoemaker thought that only “I” is).

But there is also another view of the matter. Kripke’s directly referential terms do not employ senses, but they do employ reference-fixers. When I think that Tom is generous, there is something that fixes the reference of my Mentalese concept for Tom—for example, the fact that Tom is the salient person called “Tom.” This reference-fixing fact is not necessarily something I am aware of, which is why it does not qualify as a sense. But it is nonetheless operative in the reference-fixing. When thinking that Tom is generous, I am performing an identification of Tom, albeit an implicit identification, one of which I am not explicitly aware. One way to interpret Shoemaker’s claim is that self-reference does not even employ a reference-fixer. It is not only sense-free, but also reference-fixer-free. It is not only that the relevant I-thoughts hook onto oneself without the subject performing an explicit identification, but they hook onto oneself without the subject performing any identification, explicit or implicit. If so, Shoemaker’s claim is more radical than Kripkean direct reference: identification-free reference is not just direct, it is entirely unmediated.

A similar point can be made with respect to Elizabeth Anscombe’s claim that, unlike all other expressions, “I” cannot fail to refer. So I-thoughts are “secure from reference-failure” (Anscombe 1975: 149). That is, such I-thoughts as “I am feeling hungry” are, in effect, immune to error through reference-failure. What is the relation between immunity to error through misidentification and immunity to error through reference-failure? One view would be that there is no difference—the two are the same. But this would make Shoemaker’s ultimate claim that the relevant I-thoughts enjoy identification-freedom the same as Anscombe’s ultimate claim that they enjoy reference-freedom. Shoemaker states explicitly that “I” does refer, though in some identification-free manner. One way to make sense of this is by appeal, again, to freedom from reference-fixing. Here identification-free reference is construed as reference-fixer-free reference. On this view, the Mentalese “I” is referential, but it has the peculiarity that its reference is unmediated by any reference-fixing mechanism.

A crucial issue that remains unaddressed is how reference-fixer-free reference is possible. How can a representational item “find” its referent without any mechanism ensuring a connection between them? Any general theory of self-consciousness that embraces Shoemaker’s IR version of the doctrine of immunity must explain the possibility of reference unfixed. To my knowledge, this challenge remains to be broached in the literature.

b. Essential Indexicals and De Se Thoughts

In the last section we saw that, when one employs the Mentalese “I” in thought, one’s thought probably acquires certain unusual features. In this section, we will see that in certain thoughts one cannot avoid employing the Mentalese “I.” This, too, is a semantic peculiarity, albeit of a different order.

In a well-known story, John Perry tells of his experience following a trail of sugar in a supermarket and thinking to himself “The shopper with the torn bag of sugar is making a mess.” Upon realizing that he is the person with the torn bag, he forms a new thought, “I am making a mess.” This thought is new: its functional role is different from the one of the original thought. Perry’s subsequent actions can be explained by ascribing to him this I-thought in a way they cannot by ascribing to him the “I”-free thought. Perry calls beliefs such as “I am making a mess” locating beliefs, and argues that such beliefs cannot avoid employing Mentalese indexicals. There is no way to think the same thought without employing the Mentalese “I.” Such a thought thus contains an essential indexical, or more accurately, essentially contains an indexical reference. In this sense, these thoughts are irreducible to any other, non-indexical kind of thought.

It should be emphasized that the point here is not that such I-thoughts cannot be reported by anyone other than the subject, or that such first-person reports cannot be matched by third-person reports. In direct speech (oratio recta), one might report Perry’s I-thought as follows:

(1) Perry thinks “I am making a mess”.

The same report could be made more naturally in indirect speech (oratio obliqua). In order to do so, however, one would need to employ what linguists call an indirect reflexive. Some languages apparently contain unique words for the indirect reflexives. English does not. But fortunately, the English indirect reflexives were discerned in the late 1960s by Hector-Neri Castañeda (curiously perhaps, not himself a native speaker). Castañeda showed that (1) is equivalent to:

(2) Perry thinks that he himself is making a mess.

At least this is so for paradigmatic uses of “he himself.” (There are also uses of “he” that function in this way, but these are more rare. And there are probably—somewhat unusual—uses of “he himself” that do not function this way. Castañeda introduced the term “he*” as a term that behaves as an indirect reflexive in all its uses.) Castañeda called reports of this sort de se (that is, of oneself) and claimed that de se reports cannot be paraphrased into any de dicto or de re reports, and are thus semantically unique and irreducible. Correlatively, the mental states reported in de se reports, to which we may refer as de se thoughts, are irreducible to mental states reported in de dicto and de re reports. In a “material mode of speech,” this means that states of self-consciousness form an irreducible class of mental states.

Note, in any case, that Castañeda’s thesis is a generalization from Perry’s thesis about reports of one’s own self-conscious states (that is, first-person reports) to all reports of self-conscious states, including reports of others’ self-conscious states (third-person reports). According to Castañeda’s thesis, self-reference is irreducible to either de dicto or de re reference to what is in fact oneself. Castañeda argues for this by showing that the indirect reflexives “he himself,” “she herself,” and so forth, have special logical features. Thus (2) cannot be paraphrased into any (indirect-speech) report that does not employ “he himself.” Consider the following de dicto report:

(3) Perry thinks that the author of “The Essential Indexical” is making a mess.

The truth conditions of (3) and (2) are different, since the latter does not entail the former: Perry may be unaware that it is he who is the author of “The Essential Indexical” (that is, that he himself is the author of “The Essential Indexical”). So (3) and (2) are not equivalent. Presumably, the same goes for any other description “the φ” that picks out Perry uniquely—it could always be that Perry is unaware that he himself is the φ.

Consider next a de dicto report with a proper name instead of a definite description:

(4) Perry thinks that Perry is making a mess.

Again, Perry may be unaware that it is he who is Perry. Therefore, the truth conditions of (2) and (4) are different, and the two are not equivalent. What about the de re versions of (3) and (4)? These can be obtained, in fact, by reading “the author of ‘The Essential Indexical’” and “Perry” in (3) and (4) as used, in Donnellan’s (1966) terms, referentially rather than attributively. But the de re versions are more perspicuously put as follows:

(5) Perry thinks, of the author of “The Essential Indexical,” that he is making a mess.

(6) Perry thinks, of Perry, that he is making a mess.

Boër and Lycan (1980), for instance, claim that (2) is equivalent to (6). But Castañeda argued that it is not. The argument proceeded as follows. The conjunction of (4) and “Perry exists” entails (6), and likewise, the conjunction of (3) and “The author of ‘The Essential Indexical’ exists” entails (5). But neither the conjunction of (4) and “Perry exists,” nor the conjunction of (3) and “The author of ‘The Essential Indexical’ exists,” entails (2). Thus, “Perry thinks that Perry is making a mess” and “Perry exists” do not entail “Perry thinks that he himself is making a mess.” Therefore, (2) has a different logical force from, and is thus not equivalent to, either (6) or (5). There is perhaps only one approach that may plausibly succeed in reducing de se reports to de dicto ones. It is the approach Eddy Zemach (1985) refers to as neo-Cartesian, and according to which the thought “I am making a mess” is equivalent to:

(7) The thinker of this very thought is making a mess.

On this approach, (2) is equivalent to:

(8) Perry thinks that the thinker of that very thought is making a mess.

In terms of the distinction drawn in §1, the idea here is that self-consciousness is essentially indexical and irreducibly de se inasmuch as it is consciousness of self-as-subject. On this approach, one’s self-conscious thought refers to oneself by referring to itself. In other words, one’s self-reference is mediated by the self-reference of one’s thought.

The emerging view is quite natural. Just as an utterance of the word “I” refers to whoever betokened that very utterance, so a deployment of the Mentalese “I” refers to whoever betokened that very deployment, that is, the thinker of that very I-thought. It may be that “I” is not synonymous with “the utterer of this very word,” but surely the latter functions as the reference-fixer of the former. Likewise, even if the Mentalese “I” is not synonymous with a Mentalese “the thinker of this very thought,” the latter still functions as the reference-fixer of the former.

One problem with the neo-Cartesian approach, however, is that it replaces one sort of indexical self-reference with another. It replaces the thinker’s self-reference with the self-reference of his or her thought. We are thus left with an unexplained essential and irreducible indexical self-reference.

Castañeda actually discussed the neo-Cartesian approach before it was expounded by Zemach, and found a different fault in it. According to Castañeda, what dooms the approach is “the fact, which philosophers (especially Hume and Kant) have known all along, that there is no object of experience that one could perceive as the self that is doing the perceiving” (Castañeda 1966: 64). Whether or not it reflects Hume’s or Kant’s thinking on self-consciousness, the idea is that the subject of thought cannot be thought about as such. Castañeda is effectively denying here the possibility of consciousness of oneself-as-subject. When I think about myself and my mental life, what I am thinking of thereby becomes the object of my thought. I cannot think of myself qua the subject of thought, that is, the thing that does the thinking. The self-as-subject is in this way elusive. As Ryle (1949) put it, trying to think of the self-as-subject is like trying to hop on one’s own shadow: every time you take a step back in order to observe your self-as-subject, your self-as-subject takes a step back with you, as it were.

This objection may apply with more force to what we called in §1 transitive self-consciousness than to what we called intransitive self-consciousness. Even if I cannot become self-conscious of thinking that the thinker of this very thought is cheerful, it does not follow that I cannot self-consciously think that the thinker of this very thought is cheerful. This is because, as pointed out in §1, self-consciously thinking that p, unlike being self-conscious of thinking that p, does not involve two separate states, such that the second one takes the first one as its object. That is, intransitive self-consciousness does not involve “taking a step back,” which is required for Ryle’s regress to get going.

We cannot pursue this issue here with any seriousness. It seems clear, however, that if de se thoughts are not irreducible to de dicto thoughts, it would probably be because the Mentalese “I” can be somehow understood in terms of reference to the subject of the very act of referring. Either way, there is almost certainly some semantic peculiarity to be reckoned with here. The question is merely how best to characterize that peculiarity.

6. Conclusion: A General Theory of Self-Consciousness?

Discussions of the peculiarities of self-consciousness, both epistemic and semantic, mostly focus on whether a given alleged peculiarity in fact obtains or is merely alleged. But as Brook (2001) stresses, these peculiarities must also be explained, or accounted for, in the context of a general theory of self-consciousness. With a handful of exceptions (for example, Bermúdez 1998) current work on self-consciousness does not appear to address the need for a general theory thereof. Instead, it rests content with a piecemeal treatment of each alleged peculiarity in separation from the rest. Sooner or later, however, this will have to be rectified by a reorientation or reorganization of research in this area.

The alleged peculiarities of self-consciousness will then come in handy. For they are useful in providing explananda for any putative theory of self-consciousness, or data against which to “test” such a theory (this is indeed how Bermúdez 1998 proceeds). This is not to say that they must be the only explananda. Such empirical data as are gleaned from mirror self-recognition experiments and other studies of animal metacognition should also be accommodated by a philosophical theory of self-consciousness.

My suggestion is that a general theory of self-consciousness could be configured in two steps. The first would be to determine which of the alleged epistemic and semantic peculiarities of self-consciousness in fact obtain. The second would be to devise an account of the metaphysical structure, as well as of the cognitive mechanisms underlying the formation, of states of self-consciousness, such that the relevant account would explain, by predicting or “retrodicting” (as C. S. Peirce puts it), the obtaining of just those peculiarities.

The peculiarities discerned in the second half of the last century are so subtle that we should be open to the idea that there may be further peculiarities which have yet to be “discovered.” There may also be familiar peculiarities that have not been recognized as such. Thus, some recent authors have drawn a new connection between self-consciousness and Moore’s paradox, which presents the challenge of understanding the logical impropriety of beliefs or thoughts of the form “p & I do not believe that p” (see Moran 2001, Kriegel 2004b, and Fernández 2006). Thus it may well be that Moore’s Paradox is at bottom another peculiarity of self-consciousness.

All this suggests that, as far as philosophical research on self-consciousness is concerned, the hardest, but in a way the most interesting, challenges are yet to be faced. At present, the philosophical literature on self-consciousness is quite disparate in the respects mentioned above. But it invites unification under a systematic framework for a general theory of self-consciousness. The most philosophically rewarding work on self-consciousness is still ahead of us.

7. References and Further Reading

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Author Information

Uriah Kriegel
Email: theuriah@gmail.com
University of Arizona
U. S. A.