Roy Wood Sellars (1880—1973)

from The Papers of Roy Wood Sellars; used by permission of the Bentley Historical Library at the University of MichiganRoy Wood Sellars was one of a generation of systematic philosophers in America the likes of which has not been seen before or since. He was born in Seaforth, Ontario in Canada, and spent most of his career at the University of Michigan where he continued working well into his 90s.  He was a fiercely independent thinker who resisted the fashions of the day in order to follow his own instincts.  He believed that the philosopher should be well-grounded both in the history of philosophy and in the sciences, and that the philosopher should engage philosophically with the major moral, social, and political issues of the day. His central aims were to combine and harmonize the insights of science and common sense, to update religion with the scientific advances of the day, and to promote a science-grounded system of progressive humanistic values. Over the course of his long life, Sellars wrote and published prolifically. He is the author of 15 books, over 100 articles, 14 book reviews and several miscellaneous works. He is best known for his pioneering formulations of critical realism (roughly, the view that, first, human beings normally perceive independent objects with their sensations but do not perceive sensations, and, second, human beings must interpret their sensations), evolutionary naturalism (a naturalistic version of emergent evolution), the “double knowledge” and mind-brain identity theory (the view that human beings possess two modes of knowledge of a single material reality), and a defence of religious humanism (the view that religion must be reinterpreted in terms of its role in improving humanity’s “this-worldly” existence).  He is the primary author of the Humanist Manifesto I of 1933.  Finally, he is the father of Wilfrid Sellars, a highly influential philosopher in his own right, many of whose views, allowing for the different vernacular and emphasis of the two periods, are continuous with his father’s views.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
  2. Critical Realism
  3. Evolutionary Naturalism
  4. Organicism
  5. Value Theory
  6. Socialism
  7. The Humanist Manifesto
  8. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Biography

Roy Wood Sellars (July 9, 1880-Sept. 5, 1973), was born in Seaforth, Ontario, the second son of Ford Wylis and Mary Stalker Sellars. (Warren 2007, 211 lists Sellars’ birth year as 1883, but this is an aberration. Most sources, including Warren elsewhere, all give the 1880 date. See Warren 1970, xi-xxv; 1973, 19-22; 1975, Ch. 1; Frankena 1973-74.) His ancestors had migrated from the Glasgow region in Scotland to Nova Scotia and later moved to Ontario.  In Ontario, the Sellars’ clan married into the prestigious Wood family, which included a distinguished Captain from the War of 1812 (David Wood) and the acting commissioner of the North West Mounted Police and Commissioner of the Canadian Yukon Territory (Zachary Taylor Wood).  This made him a relative to the 12th president of the United States (Zachary Taylor).  Sellars also took great pride in the fact that one of his ancestors, Lord Stanley, appears in Bosworth Field in Shakespeare’s Richard III.

Roy’s father, Ford, had been a schoolteacher and a school principal until health considerations forced him to abandon that profession.  Thereafter, Ford studied at the Medical School at the University of Michigan and became a physician in 1882. After graduating from medical school, the Sellars family settled in Pinnebog, Michigan. As this was a small town, Roy’s youthful companions were farm boys. In his youth, Roy pursued swimming, baseball, and hockey, and retained an interest in sports all his life.  His father’s library was the only one in the neighbourhood, and though young Roy knew little about philosophy, he read Emerson and Carlyle and had numerous discussions with his father about medicine. In this small rural community, Roy’s intellectual gifts quickly set him apart and he was sent to the Ferris Institute in Big Rapids, Michigan to prepare for a university career.

Roy entered the University of Michigan in 1899, where he did his own cooking and washed dishes for his lodgings.  Due to his small-town, rural background, the insecure young boy felt unprepared for a university program but he resolved to “make a go of it” and, upon his graduation, was voted one of the top two scholars in the class.  He studied widely in both the arts and the sciences, including rhetoric and calculus.  Sellars received his B.A. in 1903 from the University of Michigan and went on to Hartford Theological Seminary, where he studied New Testament Greek, Hebrew, and Arabic (and read the Koran in the original). He acquired a critical historically and culturally grounded approach to religion and a sympathy for social liberalism and humanism that remained with him throughout his life. In 1904 Professor R.M. Wenley of the Department of Philosophy at Michigan recommended Sellars for a fellowship at the University of Wisconsin, where he studied for a time before returning to the University of Michigan as Professor Wenley’s replacement while the latter was on sabbatical leave. Apart from a brief stint at University of Chicago in the summer of 1906 and a year studying in Europe (either 1908-09 or 1909-10 – sources differ on this), Sellars remained at the University of Michigan for the remainder of his approximately 40-year career, first as an instructor and doctoral student (he earned the Ph.D. in 1908 or 09 – again, sources differ), and then as a member of the permanent faculty.

During his year in Europe Sellars studied at the Sorbonne and discussed the possibility of a naturalistic formulation of emergent evolution with Henri Bergson. Bergson in turn referred him to the scientist and vitalist Hans Driesch. Sellars went on to study with Driesch and the neo-Kantian Wilhelm Windelband at Heidelberg. The precise details of Driesch’s influence on Sellars are not known but it seems likely that he directed Sellars to the study of physiology.  After returning to Michigan from his European adventures, Sellars developed a new course in the philosophy of science in which he used James Ward’s Naturalism and Agnosticism, as well as texts by Huxley, Mach, Poincaré, and Pearson.  Many of his students at this time came from the physical and biological sciences. Sellars remained scientifically-oriented throughout his life, a trait which he passed to his son Wilfrid. Even when Sellars was inspired by Bergson’s romantic or mystical theory of creative evolution, he sought (much like Popper) to recast it in more “naturalistic” terms acceptable to the sciences. Sellars’ naturalistic bent put him at odds with his most ardent supporter, Professor Wenley. Although Wenley regarded him as his best student, he could not accept Sellars’ naturalism, and did not approve of the publication of Sellars’ thesis by the University.

Sellars enjoyed considerable teaching success. His course, “The Principles and Problems of Philosophy,” was favorably remembered by many alumni who found it a “liberating” experience, “like taking a cold bath” (Frankena, 1973-74, 230). Several of the students in his political philosophy course, in which he discussed democracy, communism, socialism, and fascism, remarked that though they had expected him to be a propagandist, the course turned out to be a good scholarly treatment of the issues with no discernible bias.  Sellars had earlier taught a course in elementary logic and eventually published a textbook based on that course.  It was a chance reading of that textbook by Charles Stevenson that led him to the study of philosophy and later become one of Sellars’ colleagues (Frankena, 1973-74, 230).

Sellars married his cousin Helen Maud Stalker, an intelligent and accomplished woman, in 1911. He wrote the Preface to Helen’s translation (from the French) of Celestine Bougle’s Evolution of Values.  Helen provided Sellars with much support and they remained close until her death in 1962.  In 1912 and 1913, respectively, their two children, Wilfrid and Cecily, were born. Cecily become a state-employed psychologist in North Dakota, but was killed in an automobile accident in 1954, an event which impacted Sellars’ scholarly work for decades. Twenty years later, well into his 90’s, he was still working on papers that had been in progress at the time of her death.  Wilfrid Sellars went on to become a highly influential philosopher in the latter half of the 20th century who, like his father, emphasized a firm grounding in the history of philosophy, fluency in the sciences, and a systematic approach to philosophical problems. It is noteworthy that his son Wilfrid developed a sophisticated version of scientific realism that builds on his father’s critical realism. In fact, Wilfrid’s views are often similar in substance to his father’s even if they differ in language and style.

Sellars believed in a fruitful, reciprocal relationship between epistemology and ontology, but saw epistemology as philosophically basic.  His most vehement criticism of other philosophers was often that they were weak in epistemology, but he also considered himself a proud ontologist. Sellars also had a strong interest in ethics, social philosophy, and political philosophy.  Indeed, Sellars belonged to a genre of philosophers, which includes his son Wilfrid, that is rare today, who believed that a philosopher must be knowledgeable in virtually all areas of philosophy. Sellars made contributions to epistemology, metaphysics, ethics, the philosophy of science, social and political philosophy, and the history of philosophy. He could discourse in an intelligent and informed a way about Heidegger, Sartre, and Bergson just as he could about Russell, Carnap, or Einstein.  He was as at home in a discussion about ethics or social and political philosophy as he was in logic or scientific method.

Sellars was an independent thinker who resisted the fashions of the day in order to pursue his own philosophical direction.He formulated what may have been the most viable form of realism in his era. He offered a course, titled “Main Concepts of Science,” that may have been the very first course offered anywhere in the philosophy of science.  He formulated evolutionary naturalism, the view that life and mind are emergent products of naturalistically conceived evolution (i.e., without invoking the supernatural element in Alexander or Bergson’s élan vital). He (1923b; 1938a) pioneered the identity theory of the “brain-mind,” which he called the “double knowledge emergence approach” to mind-brain identity.  Although his basic views changed little over his career, he was constantly reformulating, developing, and clarifying them.  In his later years he watched as many of his views became commonplace, without being recognized for his role in their genesis.  

Perhaps because of his fierce independence, Sellars often found himself out of the mainstream. Until 1930, philosophy was dominated by idealism and pragmatism, religion by theism, and social theory by capitalism, while Sellars was a realist, an atheist, and a socialist. Later, analytical philosophy came into dominance and fundamentalism resurged in religion, neither of which appealed to him. Socialism did eventually enjoy a resurgence, but it was Marxist and totalitarian while Sellars was committed to a more moderate and gradual reform of social institutions based on rational persuasion.  Sellars was also critical of the American philosophy in his day. He (1970a, vii; see also Warren, 1975, 28) once remarked that, amongst philosophers, it is “almost always a Sellars against the world”. He often felt that he was better understood by psychologists and biologists than by philosophers and that he was better understood in Europe than in America (Warren 1975, 25).

Nonetheless, Sellars was a respected member of the philosophical community in America and it is safe to say that he inspired a personal affection from many of his colleagues that is unusual. He served as Vice-President of the Eastern Division of the APA in 1918 and President of the Western Division in 1923. He was an energetic correspondent and carried on friendly discussions with Samuel Alexander, C. Judson Herrick, Lloyd Morgan, and Marvin Farber. He also corresponded with F.H. Bradley, Bernard Bosanquet, C.A. Strong, and Donald Williams, and he debated with D.C. Macintosh, H.N. Wieman, and Sydney Hook.  In 1954 the journal Philosophy and Phenomenological Research devoted an entire issue to Sellars’ philosophy, and in 1964 Andrew Reck listed Sellars as one of the 10 most notable philosophers in recent American philosophy. At the University of Michigan the Roy Wood Sellars Chair was created in his honor and Bucknell University honored him by establishing the Roy Wood Sellars Lecture Series. The first Roy Wood Sellars Lectures were given by Warren and the second by Wilfrid Sellars with Roy Sellars in attendance. In 1970 Notre Dame University honored Roy in his 90th year with a symposium on his philosophy, including presentations by Andrew Reck, Wilfrid Sellars, and C.F. Delany.  Although Roybelonged to a generation of America’s greatest systematic philosophers, Frankena (1973-4, 231) observes that, with hindsight, Sellars may have been one of the most important of them.  However, the fact that his son Wilfrid has developed a powerful formulation of his father’s views may be the greatest testament to Roy Wood Sellars’ lasting achievement.

2. Critical Realism

Much of Sellars’ philosophical work is an attempt to replace outdated mythopoetical views about knowledge, religion, values, and so forth, by up-to-date scientifically grounded views.  Science, he holds, “builds” on common sense, but since it develops new concepts based on new instruments and the application of mathematics to experience, the philosopher’s job is to harmonize the common sense and scientific frameworks (1932a, v; 1973, 160-161).

In his first book, Critical Realism , he attempts to justify common sense realism, which is also the view of philosophers when they are not in a reflective mood (1916a, 6)—the view that people perceive real external objects, not just intermediaries of some kind. He also aims to clarify the relation of common sense realism to scientific knowledge: “We start from independent things; and not from percepts” (1916a, 3).  Sellars also argues against the main theories of perception of his day: idealism, representationalism, pragmatism, and positivism, all of which he saw as undermining common sense realism. Other versions of critical realism were espoused by Santanaya and Lovejoy.

The defence of common sense realism, he (1941b; 1959c) holds, requires a robust defence of the correspondence theory of truth.The basic error in those mistaken views of perception is the failure to distinguish between the content and object of perception (1922a, 70 n 4).  Since the content of perception is fixed by aspects of the organism, those mistaken theories wrongly infer that the object of perception is not independent of the perceiver.

Sellars’ critical realism requires real substances (as opposed to ideas, universals, impressions, and so forth) as objects of perception. He (1929c; 1970a, 32; 1973, 182, 346-348, 353) rejects “the historical desiccation of the category of substance,” that is, the whittling down of the Ancient and Medieval robust notion of substance to Locke’s “I know not what”. While representationalism, idealism, pragmatism, and positivism tend to volatize the object of perception into ideas, sensations, or a mere placeholder for properties, Sellars holds the normal objects of perception are real full-bodied independent substances.

Although Sellars’ critical (or “referential”) realism is “built up from” common-sense realism, it is not identical with common sense since the latter has not faced the problems arising from discrepancies in perception (See his 1922c; 1924b; 1927b; 1927c; 1937a; 1938b; 1939b; 1959b; 1961a; 1962; 1963; 1970, 6-8, 13, 15-16, 17-27, 33-35, 161; see also Warren, 1975, 35, 37). Despite his defense of common sense realism,Sellars rejects the “naïve realism” that identifies the immediate datum of knowledge with objects in the world. He distinguishes between the common sense realism of the ordinary person and the crude philosophical understanding embodied in naïve realism, the view that in perception one actually “intuits” the object (1963; see also Warren, 1975, 36-7).  In opposition to that naïve view, he holds that in perception one interprets one’s sensations. The interpretation of sensations is not a purely intellectual process: “A gull does not in the Lockean way apprehend his sensation …. [It] looks through his sensation at the fish in the water. It is a one-step sensi-motor process” (See his 1970a, 118; 1973, 49-50, 161; 1975; and Warren, 1975, 38-45!).

Sellars holds that the biological basis of knowledge consists in the organism’s adjustment to its external environment, where both the internal adjustment of the organism and external factors must be taken into account.  He sees his version of critical realism as a “mediate realism” that attempts to do justice both to the contribution of the perceiving organism and the claims of objective knowledge. That is, he aims to do justice to both the real and the “ideal” sides of cognition. It is absolutely crucial, he (1922a, 76-77) stresses, to distinguish between the causal conditions of perception and the referential act of perceiving. Perception is the interpretation of sense mediated by factors both internal and external to the perceiving subject. These internal factors are not to be confused with the mechanism or processes that underlie perception (that is, the account of the internal mechanism or processes is not an account of the content of perception). By taking account of both the internal and external factors, he seeks to avoid the evils of both naïve realism and the non-realist view that the objects of perception are not independent of mind.

The attempt of simultaneous justice to both  the subjective contribution of the organism and  the claims of objective knowledge is no easy matter. Various critical realists could not always agree how best to formulate the view (See Ramsperger, 1967). For example, Sellars (1970a, 5) rejects the sort of critical realism espoused by Santayana that erects a barrier of essences between the perceiver and the external object. Perhaps his basic point is that human beings perceive independent objects with their sensations, but do not perceive sensations, essences, or other mental or ideal intermediaries themselves (Warren, 1975, 38, 42). Sellars (1970a, 114-5) stresses that the fact that the object is present to consciousness does not mean that it must be present within consciousness.

Although Sellars’ sometimes wrote as if his version of critical realism is definitive,few agree that it is unproblematic. Since he acknowledges the subjective contribution of the perceiver, it can resemble representationalism. Since, however, he emphasizes that perception is a direct perception of independent objects, it can resembles naïve realism. Sellars counters that critical realism is the view that human knowing is a direct knowledge of objects, but that this knowledge is mediated by “logical ideas” (See his 1970a, 113 and the “Epilogue on Berkeley” in his 1968).  The problem is that it is hard to see how knowledge can be both mediated and direct. The claim that one perceives independent objects via one’s sensations but does not perceive those sensations themselves is a fair negative point, but seems to require a more robust positive account of the precise role of sensations in the perception of external objects. Sellars’ version of critical realism is intriguing, but many feel it requires further clarification (Chisholm 1955; Herbert, 1994; Wright, 1994; Levine, 2007).  Perhaps this is why Sellars continued to return to the issue again and again over the decades (See his 1929a; 1929b; 1929c; 1937a; 1938b; 1939b; 1950a; 1961a; 1962; 1963; 1965; 1969d, Ch’s 4-5; 1970a, 112-131; and so forth).

3. Evolutionary Naturalism

Sellars does not have a fully developed philosophy of science, this being more characteristic of his son’s generation, but he does have definite views about scientific method and about the close relation of science to philosophy, some of which do anticipate his son’s views.  Sellars’ conception of science and its relation to philosophy is intimately related to his own views of evolutionary naturalism.

In Sellars’ (1973, 160-1) view, science “builds” on common sense, but it develops new concepts based on new instruments and the application of mathematics to experience, and so forth. He rejects the monochrome Newtonian universe in favor of an evolution-generated hierarchy of different levels of emergent causality: Under certain favorable conditions, life emerges from matter and mind from life (See his 1920c; 1922a, Ch. IX; 1924a; 1927a; 1933a; 1944b; 1959a; 1932, 4; 1969d, 64-68; and 1973, 290).  He is committed to the emergence of downward causal forces. That is, while the emergence of higher-order entities is causally dependent upon lower-order entities (bottom-up causation), once they emerge, the former may causally influence the latter (top-down causation) in ways not reducible to bottom-up causation (see Roy’s 1970, 38, 44-46 and Meehl and Sellars 1956). Sellars insists that the higher emergent entities are still material systems.

Although he does not deny the possibility of reductions in special cases, his conception of science is generally anti-reductionist (1922a, 16, 332; 1970, 136, 141, 240-1; Warren, 1975, 29).This explains why he holds that the scientific method cannot be identified with that of any particular science, such as physics (Warren, 1975, 29). When he (1932a, 5) describes his own view as physicalism, he does not mean physicalism in the more familiar sense but a view that accepts his own critical realism and emergence. Each of the sciences; natural, psychological, and social, treats of a particular domain in the emergent hierarchy, but none is privileged over the others.

The commitment to real independent substances in his critical realism dovetails with his evolutionary naturalism. The different levels in the emergent hierarchy are not just of events or properties, but of substances (1922a, Ch. XIII; 1932a, Ch. XII; 1943c; 1959a; 1970, 215).  Though the higher emergent levels are not reducible to material mechanisms, they do not introduce new non-natural forces. Life and mind are not non-natural forces entering nature from outside, but emergent capacities of natural substances (See his 1917b, 276-283; 1922a, vii-ix, 277-278, 333-336; 1933a; 1950b). See Emmet (1932, 222-23) for Whitehead’s very different Platonistic view)!

Sellars tends not to employ the classical formulation of emergence, that certain wholes are “greater than the sum of their parts”.  He (1922a, 302) does, however, use such formulations occasionally. See also his remarks on the relations of wholes and parts (1917a, 31, 145, 288). Since he talks of new unitary substantial wholes, talk of separable “parts” may be seen as misleading.Wilfrid Sellars (1949) clarifies his father’s somewhat obscure views. In general, however, in language reminiscent of Bergson but understood naturalistically, Sellars (1922a, viii, 17, 139, 167, 214-215, 297, 303, 322, 335, and so forth; 1932a, 3, 401; Blitz 2010) holds that modern science is beginning to accept the notion of “creative synthesis”, the view that change sometimes involves “the genesis of what Locke called ‘real essences’”.For a discussion of the classical part-whole formulations of emergence see McDonough (2002).

Agential causality, which is central to Sellars’ ethics, is underwritten by his evolutionary naturalism (1970a, 262-267). Agential causality emerges at a certain level of evolution and organization (1970a, viii; 1973a, Ch. 15). Human beings possess no “pushbutton free will,” but rather, an emergent capacity of the human brain is able to develop new judgments and standards that make a causal difference in behaviour (1932a, 396, 405; 1957a; 1959a; 1970a, 305; 1973a, 290-1, 361-384). He called his view “critical anthropomorphism” (1917b, 278).

Sellars’ evolutionary naturalism colors his view of the relation between science and philosophy. The diversity of the various irreducible levels in the emergent hierarchy requires a diversity of distinct autonomous sciences: physics, chemistry, biology, and so forth.  This yields problems with which none of the special sciences are prepared to deal.  The physicist can describe the behaviour of subatomic particles, but, qua physicist, is unfamiliar with the regularities and properties at higher levels in the emergent hierarchy. Similar points, in reverse, can be made about the biologist (psychologist, sociologist, and so forth), who are familiar with the objects at their higher levels of the hierarchy, but qua biologist, psychologist, sociologist, and so forth, are unfamiliar with the laws and properties at the lower levels.  Since, however, the evolutionary naturalist holds that the different levels in the emergent hierarchy constitute autonomous regions that fall outside any of the particular sciences, and since the items at different levels of the emergent hierarchy are linked in interesting ways that cannot be captured by reductions of one level to another, knowledge of the interrelations between these levels requires a different sort of knowledge, not possessed by any of the special sciences.

It is the distinctive job of the philosopher to obtain an overview of the relations between the different sciences, and between the sciences and the common sense framework, harmonize the new levels in the emergent hierarchy with each other and with the more stable and fixed background of inorganic nature (1922a, 263, 329; 1932a, 44ff, 79ff, 92ff).  Thus, philosophy completes science. “The job of philosophy is to size up the whole situation; and it often needs new leads” (1973, 161).One can see here the general outlines of his son’s (1991, 2, 18-19, 34, and so forth) view, that the distinctive job of philosophy is to obtain a synoptic view of the way things hang together, in the broadest sense.

Sellars published Evolutionary Naturalism in 1922, a year before both Morgan’s Emergent Evolution and Alexander’s “Natural Piety” (Warren, 1970, vi), although the latter two came to be better known for the formulation of emergent evolution. Warren (1973b) remarks that Morgan told Sellars that to his knowledge, Sellars was the first to publish on emergent evolution.  Bergson’s Creative Evolution, first published in 1907, does precede Sellars’ publications, but it differs in that it posits the non-scientific élan vital. Sellars saw his position as more systematic, empirical, and naturalistic than Bergson’s and Morgan’s since it does not introduce any non-natural controlling factors. Although Sellars’ evolutionary naturalism fell out of favor as reductionism gained ground, emergentism has once again arisen as a viable position in science, philosophy and religion (Beckermann, Kim, and Flores 1992; Hasker 2001; McDonough 2002; Davies and Clayton 2008, Blitz 2010; Vintiadis, and so forth).

4. Organicism

Although Sellars (1991, 415, 433) states that no other writer in recent times had challenged him as much, he claims that his own view deserves the title “philosophy of organism” more than Whitehead’s.  This is because Sellars sees living organisms as substantial wholes, whereas Whitehead sees them as a societies or nexuses of more fundamental entities. Sellars (1922a, vii-ix, 164-168) sees an organism as a product of emergent evolution in which simpler materials at a lower level are organized into new integrated substances with new causal powers at higher levels in the hierarchy. This higher-order substance is a true unity and not, as for Whitehead, a plurality (see Roy’s 1961b).

The living organism is, for Sellars, the background against which consciousness must be understood (1922a, 63, 298; 1932a, 446-7; 1949b, 95, 99). This leads him (1991, 415; 1970, 205) to agree with contemporaneous developments in physics, chemistry, biology, and psychology that emphasize fields and Gestalten, both of which are wholes that are not reducible to more fundamental entities.  Even so, the focus on the important organismic background should not lead one to confuse knowledge of the object with knowledge about the organism (1922a, 186-187). For similar reasons, he does not see a person as a combination of two separable substances as in Cartesian Dualism. He (1991, 415) describes his own position, which rejects the vitalistic and non-evolutionary elements in classical Aristotelianism, as an “Aristotelianism of the Left”. The same considerations lead him (1932a, 14-15; 1961b; 1973, 354-56; 1991, 416-7) to oppose the “reformed subjectivism” which he saw as the source both of the Platonism and rejection of naturalism and humanism in Whitehead’s philosophy of organism.

5. Value Theory

Sellars’ evolutionary naturalism make values “centripetal” to human life and supports a humanistic theory of ethics and religion (1932a, 448; 1948b; 1949b, 78; 973, Ch. 14), all of which he counts as a virtue  He holds that human freedom emerges at a certain level or organization of organic development and lends a dignity and meaning to human life that is absent in a purely mechanical cosmos (1957a; 1949b, 103-4; 1970, 319-331).  Whereas the “old materialism” had been criticized as being unable to accommodate higher values, Sellars sees it as a virtue of his “new materialism” that it “flowers into humanism” (See also his 1932a, 19; 1944b; 1950b, 427-428). The emergence of living organisms from inorganic nature is a necessary condition for the existence of a world of values (1932a, 446-7).  It is people and human institutions that form the “hot center” of conscious life, while the inorganic world forms the “periphery and yet absolute condition for the whole drama” (1932a, 450).

Sellars is generally averse to ontological dualisms (1916a, 204, 245; 1922, 3091973a, Ch. 14; see also Sellars, McGill, and Farber, 1949) and holds they have done particular damage in value theory (see Roy’s 1917b, Ch. XVI; 1918, Ch. XII and Ch. XVI; 1921a; 1950b; Warren, 1975, 27, 41-2).  In general, he holds that each side in value-dualisms captures some fragment of the truth, but in their pure forms such dualisms are incapable of yielding a coherent theory of value.  Whereas some theories emphasize the objective basis, and others the subjective basis, for values, Sellars’ aims to do justice both “to the possibilities in the object and in the subject,” while taking “as objective a view of value as possible” (1932a, 445, 475; 1969d, Ch. 12). He sees this as an area where compromise and balance are essential. Value judgments are similar to cognitive judgments in some ways, but different in others. One can make mistakes in value judgments just as in cognitive judgments, but physical science does not discover values as properties of objects (1932a, 445; 1973, 344).  Rather, values are an interpretation of objects as having the capacity to affect human life in ways important to an individual or group (1932a, 445, 459-473; Warren 1975, 40).

In cognitive judgments, human beings regard themselves as disclosing the object itself, while in value judgments human beings are estimating the object with respect to its bearing on human life (1932a, 46).When the subjectivist claims that values are based on feelings, Sellars agrees, but holds that these subjective feelings are directed towards facts that can be objectively criticized. When the objectivist claims that values are based on objective facts, Sellars agrees, but holds that these facts only have value when “estimated with respect to human living” (1932a, 444). In valuing we are constrained by objective factors just as in perceiving, but we are also “interpreting” the object in the light of factors which are taken to be intimately linked to the self (1932a, 471; 1970, 244, 253, and so forth). It is important to acknowledge that Sellars (1922a, 29-30, 194-5, 312; and see and Wood, 1950, 525) does see the need for a kind of dualism in epistemology.

Sellars subjects “absolutism” and “factualism” about values to similar criticisms.  He (1932a, 457-459) rejects belief in absolute or intrinsic values since “a good which is not good for someone strikes me as meaningless”.  He (1932a, 16ff) describes “Eleatic views” that deny the significance of everyday beliefs as versions of “illusionism”. Similarly, when the “factualist” attempts to reduce values to some fact about human beings or human groups, for example, the fact that human beings prefer certain things and not others, Sellars (1932a, 452-3; 1970a, 245) replies that people are not like stones with only one possible reaction.  That is, alluding to his critique of “naïve realism”, these various “facts” are always really only some naïve immediate value (1932a,452). Even if some authority, for example, a church or an anthropologist, holds X is good, it is always possible to criticize that naïve immediate valuation by estimating its effect on human life. No authority, neither religious nor “scientific”, is immune to criticism.

Sellars (1932a, 446-7) stresses that “the background” to judgments of value is the emergent level of living organisms presupposed by the existence of value.Since an organism emerges from inorganic nature in the evolutionary process, his evolutionary naturalism is an essential part of his account of the genesis of the complex subject-object situations required for the existence of value (1922a, Ch. XV; 1932a, 68, 442; 1970a, 248-9, 267). Referring to his “open ended” emergent evolutionism (1970a, 267), he states that his “metaphysics of ethics in many ways represents its culmination” and that any attempt to explain the existence of value by reference to mere lifeless nature cannot succeed (1973, 359-60).

Sellars’ evolutionary naturalism is not just another version of materialism, but is enriched by his belief in the evolution of an emergent hierarchy containing the higher levels organisms and persons (1950b, 420, 422-6; 1970a, 154-173).  His naturalism “does not,” as some older versions of materialism, focused only on the physical sciences, did, “ignore the specialized areas of human living, morals, art, politics” (1932a, 449). Because man is “not just a knower but an agent” and a “desirer of good things”, the philosopher, in order to avoid an overly narrow conception of the human situation, must turn to the poets for a sense of “creative agency and decision” (1932a, 449).

6. Socialism

In The Next Step in Democracy (1916b) Sellars defends his own version of socialism (See also his 1970a, 272-73, 277-79, 289, 311, 334). Sellars distinguishes three stages of socialism: (1) the Utopian socialism of Fourier and Saint-Simon, (2) the “political socialism” that began with Marx’s Communist Manifesto, and (3) the later modification of Marx’s socialism based on an updated understanding of how society and people really work (1944-45b; 1970a, 272). The political socialism of Marx is called “scientific socialism” by its admirers, “orthodox socialism” by its critics (1970a, 279ff).

Sellars also rejects Utopian socialism as naïve and romantic, having little understanding of the obstacles to the creation of a genuine socialist society (1970a, 81). In contrast to the Utopian socialists, Sellars promotes a gradual modification of existing institutions in the light of new scientific advances with a full awareness that any “reckless unsettling” of the social foundations leads to disaster (1970a, 280, 292-293).  Sellars rejected the program to overthrow tradition on the basis of naïve romantic dreams of wishful thinking.

Although Sellars (1970a, 28-287) sees Marx as a fairly realistic and concrete “sort”, he holds that Marx was misled by revolutionary ardour into seeing history as a constant war of class struggle. Sellars, by contrast, sees the Marxian stage of socialism, not so much scientific as realistic, but he thinks Marxist realism (the recognition that the old order will not easily give way to rational persuasion) led to the introduction of a dangerous militancy into socialism. Further, whereas many saw Marx’s determinism as a strength, Sellars takes Marx’s view that capitalist society contains the seeds of its own destruction as empirically falsified (1970a, 308). Further, Marx underestimated the ability of capitalism to make adjustments (1970a, 284, 286, 307-8; 1944-45b).  Sellars (1970a, 287, 303-304) replaces Marx’s “semi-mechanical and almost wholly deterministic” outlook by the view that the people must learn to emancipate themselves by participation in the political process. Participation in the democratic process requires the development of the necessary virtues: cooperation and ingenuity, the application of continuous experiments to find out what works best, the determination and patience to approach the ultimate goal by slow degrees (1970a, 287).  Whereas Marx seems to absolve the individual of responsibility for the eventual outcome by representing the march towards the goal as the inevitable result of the great supra-individual forces of history, Sellars (1971a, 333-334) emphasizes the essential educative role of the individuals participation in the process that renders the individual prepared for and worthy of the final goal. Although Sellars was sometimes seen as a radical in his day (1970a, 272), he defines socialism as a democratic movement whose aim is to secure the greatest justice and liberty for the maximum number of people at any given time, without the wholesale overturning of tradition by violent methods (1943d).  In opposition to the militant socialism of old, he presents a moderate democratic recipe for achieving socialist goals via “rational reform” while escaping the “vicious dialectic of hate and counter-hate” (1970a, 291, 304). Progress cannot be achieved by one side imposing its view on the whole but by the “interplay” of conservatives on the one side and liberals on the other that the direction and speed of social progress is determined” (1916b, 3; 1970a, 307-308).

7. The Humanist Manifesto

Early in his studies, Sellars considered a career in comparative religion, but with his usual idiosyncratic twist, he wished to do so from a scientific, humanistic, and atheistic point of view. In Evolutionary Naturalism, he describes the religious impulse as “one of the most admirable … in human nature” (1922, 5; see also his 1918, 26 and his 1969a, Ch. 11), but he also holds that religion must be “brought to the world disclosed through science” (1918, 44-45, 222; see also Warren 1975, 24-25).  Given his naturalism, the appeal to supernatural entities and explanations must be eliminated and replaced by an emphasis on human flourishing as citizens of a shared world (Wilson, 1995, Ch. 17).  Whereas religions traditionally conceived salvation as something that comes to man from the outside, Sellars (1918, 12) sees it as something that must arise out of the “loyal union” of human beings who share a belief in the values of life. Traditional religions also often see creation as completed, meaning that a person’s job is merely to understand the pattern in order to follow it, Sellars (1947), reflecting Bergson’s influence, holds that people must learn to recognize creation as “a going concern,” in which their contribution to the further emergence of the universe is essential.

In 1932, Sellars was approached by Raymond Bragg on behalf of a Chicago-based group of humanists associated with The New Humanist (for which Bragg was an associate editor). The group had for some time been contemplating the need for an official statement of the religious humanist position, but recognizing the difficulties inherent in group authorship, chose to have a complete first draft written by a single author. After hearing him lecture in Chicago, Bragg approached Sellars about the project and Sellars accepted with the unanimous support of the Chicago group.  The document published in the following year, the Humanist Manifesto of 1933 (or Humanist Manifesto I), is the result of numerous revisions by multiple contributors upon Sellars’ original draft. While that draft has been lost to history, the fact that Sellars signed the 1933 document, and later-on claimed primary authorship of it, suggests that whatever changes were made did not, in his mind, affect the substance of what he had written. For these reasons it has Sellars as the pre-eminent author of the Manifesto, although that is not to minimize the contributions of others.

In the Manifesto, Sellars attempts to put the essence of his religious humanism into a form suitable not just for fellow professors, but for the general public. It is important to remember that along with many of the original signers of the Humanist Manifesto I, Sellars conceived of humanism not as a replacement for religion but as a new religion (1918, Ch. XVI; 1969d, Ch. 11; Wilson 1995, Ch. 17).  Nevertheless, his naturalized religion shades inevitably into a this-worldly humanist philosophy that, he (1932a, 7) holds, attempts to blend “those two great naturalists, Spinoza and Nietzsche, uniting the passion for life of the one with the cosmic calm of the other.”

Humanist Manifesto I was conceived as the statement of a new secular religion designed to replace the old religions that had been founded on claims of supernatural revelation, or on fear and helplessness (1918c, Foreword).  It opposes an acquisitive and profit-motivated society, and outlines a mutually cooperative worldwide society committed to the rational resolution of problems. Thirty-four of sixty-five persons asked to sign did, including Edwin Burtt of Cornell, and John Dewey and John Hermann Randall of Columbia. About one-third of the signatories were professors from the University of Chicago and from Columbia University; about half were Unitarians (Wilson 1995, Ch. 10).

The Manifesto contains fifteen theses (briefly summarized here):

  1. The universe is self-existing, not created.
  2. Man is a part of nature that has emerged in a continuous process.
  3. Since humanists hold an organic view of life, they reject the traditional mind-body dualism.
  4. Man’s religious culture is a result of gradual natural development as a result of  man’s interaction with the natural environment and social heritage.
  5. Science has shown that supernatural and cosmic guarantors of human values are unsupported, so religion must re-formulate its views in the light of scientific knowledge.
  6. Theism, modernism, and other varieties of “new thought” have been surpassed.
  7. The distinction between the secular and the religious cannot be defended any longer: Nothing that is human is alien to religion.
  8. The purpose of man’s life is the complete realization of the possibilities in human personality.
  9. Humanists find their religious feelings expressed in an intensified sense of their personal lives and the cooperative effort to produce social well-being.
  10. There are no uniquely religious emotions connected with the supernatural.
  11. Man must discourage sentimental hopes and wishful thinking and face the challenges of life by embracing rational procedures.
  12. Religious humanists aim to enhance the creative element in man in order to add to produce a more meaningful life.
  13. All social associations should exist for the promotion of human flourishing.
  14. A socialized cooperative economic system must be established for the fair distribution of the necessities of life to all human beings.
  15. Religious humanists seek to affirm human life rather than deny it, seek to discover the full possibilities of life, not run from them, and aim to establish the conditions of a just and meaningful life for all, not just the privileged few.

For a complete statement of the theses, see Sellars (1970a, 331-335).

Some humanists declined to sign Manifesto I. Dr. Arthur Morgan stated several differences of emphasis, but also some more substantial objections (Wilson 1995, Ch. 7). Anticipating recent views in “deep ecology” (See Sessions, 1995), Morgan felt that Manifesto I placed too much emphasis on human life and failed to recognize that there may be significance in other life-forms. Morgan called for a “race of businessmen” which sees business as a public trust, not a means to personal enrichment, and he objected to the “unjustified cocksureness” of Manifesto I, feeling that it is “not dictated by humility or imagination”. Morgan also felt that though religion should be disciplined by science, it should not be limited by it.  His most biting criticism was that many humanists are “not strong in faith, hope, and love.”

John Haynes Holmes, the prominent Unitarian minister and noted pacifist, declined to sign Manifesto I since he objected to the rejection of theism in the 6th thesis, holding instead that a rational humanism “inevitably unfolds into a rational theism” (Wilson 1995,Ch. 7). He also found terms like “modernism,” in the 6th thesis “hopelessly vague” and wondered why a humanist could not claim to represent the best of modernism. Although he found the deism of some of the authors “not half bad,” he insists that “Theism … is the blossom that grows on the plant of humanism, the poetry into which it unfolds in mystic beauty”.

Howard Shapley, a Harvard astronomer, spoke for many scientists who were reluctant to make judgments about religion: “As a social philosopher I am embryonic and I have decided that I should not misuse my position by pretending to intelligence or comprehension in a field in which my thoughts have been too scattered and probably too prejudiced” (Wilson 1995, Ch. 7). Although Shapley agrees with current traditions of protecting the weak, he is not sure that this is in keeping with “the biological traditions of the planet”. His point is not that the weak should not be protected, but that, as a scientist, he cannot claim to know this, and, therefore, he should not put his authority as a scientist behind the claim.

In his retrospective on Humanist Manifesto I, Wilson remarks that he now feels it to be a mistake to tie humanism directly to socialism. Humanism should not be tied to any particular economic system, but should concern itself with the more general goals of ending disease, poverty, ignorance, prejudice, and so forth (Wilson 1995, Ch. 18).

Later versions of the Manifesto found their own objections.  Humanist Manifesto II found the language in Manifesto I to be “far too optimistic” about the possibility of eliminating social evils. Frances Schaeffer (2005) authored A Christian Manifesto (in opposition to the Communist Manifesto) which holds that both the humanist and communist Manifestos, despite significant differences between them, tend to foster similar forms of social degeneration. Schaeffer sees humanism as the unfortunate view that man is the measure of all things, and holds that even if that is not the humanist’s intention Manifesto I undermines the ideals of objective truth and morality. One major difference between Manifesto I and later humanist Manifestos and statements is that Manifesto I arose out of religious humanism (1918, Ch. XVI), and was, accordingly, much more sympathetic to religion per se than these later documents.

The objections by various humanists, both earlier and later, to signing Humanist Manifesto I show just how difficult it is to obtain agreement on such a central issue from such a diverse group of intellectuals representing different fields and backgrounds. Nevertheless, despite the various objections and reservations to Manifesto I, and the various replacement manifestos and declarations that appeared in later years, Manifesto I remains a significant historical document in the genesis of the humanist movement, and one that Sellars, who, it is probably fair to say, is “the principal author” of the published version, played an fundamental role in creating.

8. References and Further Reading

Several of Roy Wood Sellars’ works can be obtained in electronic form at The Internet ArchiveThe Autodidact Project and the online library of The Secular Web. Additional information on the various versions of the Humanist Manifestos and The Amsterdam Declaration is available online from the International Humanist and Ethical Union, the American Humanist Association, and the Council for Secular Humanism.

a. Primary Sources

  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1902. "Re-interpretation of Democracy.” Inlander (University of Michigan publication), 12: 252-61.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1907a. "The Nature of Experience." Journal of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific Methods: 14-18.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1907b. "A Fourth Progression in the Relation of Body and Mind." Psychological Review 14: 315-28.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1907c. "Professor Dewey's View of Agreement." Journal of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific Methods 4 (16): 315-28.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1908a. "An Important Antinomy." Psychological Review 15 (4): 237-249.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1908b. "Consciousness and Conservation." Journal of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific Methods 5 (9): 235-38.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1908c. "Critical Realism and the Time Problem I." Journal of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific Methods 5 (20): 542-48.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1908d. "Critical Realism and the Time Problem II." Journal of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific Methods 5 (27): 597-602. 
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1909a. "Causality." Journal of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific Methods 6: 323-28.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1909b. "Space." Journal of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific Methods. 6: 617-23.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1912. "Is There a Cognitive Relation?" Journal of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific Methods 9 (9): 225-328.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1915. "A Thing and its Properties." Journal of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific Methods 12 (12): 318-28.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1916a. Critical Realism: A Study of the Nature and Conditions of Knowledge. Chicago: Rand-McNally and Co.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood.  1916b. The Next Step in Democracy. New York: Macmillan.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1917a. The Essentials of Logic. Boston: Houghton Mifflin Co.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1917b. The Essentials of Philosophy. New York: Macmillan.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1918a. "An Approach to the Mind-Body Problem." Philosophical Review 27 (2): 150-63.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1918b. "On the Nature of Our Knowledge of the External World." Philosophical Review 27 (5): 502-12.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1918c. The Next Step in Religion. New York: Macmillan.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1918d. “Review of P. Coffey, Epistemology, Journal of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific Methods 15: 557-8.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1919a. "The Epistemology of Evolutionary Naturalism." Mind 28 (112): 407-26.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1919b. “Review of George Wobbermin, Christian Belief in God.” Journal of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific Methods 16: 277-9.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1920a. "The Status of Categories." The Monist 30 (2): 220-39.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1920b. "Space and Time." The Monist 30 (3): 321-64.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1920c. "Evolutionary Naturalism and the Mind-Body Problem." The Monist 30 (4): 568-98.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1920d. "Knowledge and Its Categories." Essays in Critical Realism, R.W. Sellars, Durant Drake, A.O. Lovejoy, James Pratt, Arthur Rogers, George Santayana, (ed’s). New York: Macmillan: 187-219.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1920e. “Review of J. A. Leighton, The Field of Philosophy.” Journal of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific Methods 17: 79-81.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1920f. "Preface." to Evolution of Values, Helen Maud Sellars, (trans.). New York: Henry Holt.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1921a. "Epistemological Dualism versus Metaphysical Dualism." Philosophical Review 30 (5): 482-93.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1921b. "The Requirement of an Adequate Naturalism." The Monist 31 (2): 249-70.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1922a. Evolutionary Naturalism. Chicago: Open Court.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1922b. "Is Consciousness Physical?" Journal of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific Methods 19 (25): 690-94.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1922c. "Concerning 'Transcendence' and 'Bifurcation'" Mind 31 (121): 31-39.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1923a. "Le Cerveau, L'âme et La Conscience." Bulletin de la Société Francais de Philosophie: 1-14.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. January, 1923b (some sources say 1922). "The Double Knowledge Approach to the Mind-Body Problem." Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, N.S. 23: 55-70 (reprinted in Principles of Emergent Realism: 188-201).
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1924a. "The Emergence of Naturalism." International Journal of Ethics 34 (4): 309-38.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1924b. "Critical Realism and Its Critics." Philosophical Review 33 (4): 379-97.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1926a. The Principles and Problems of Philosophy. New York: Macmillan.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1926b. "Cognition and Valuation," Philosophical Review 35 (2): 124-44.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1927a. "Realism and Evolutionary Naturalism: A Reply to Professor Hoernlé." The Monist. 37 (1): 150-55.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1927b. "Current Realism in Great Britain and the United States." The Monist 37 (4): 503-520.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1927c. "What is the Correct Interpretation of Critical Realism?," Journal of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific Methods 24 (9): 238-241.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1927d. "Why Naturalism and Not Materialism?," Philosophical Review 36 (3): 215-25.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1928a. Religion Coming of Age. New York: Macmillan.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1928b. "Current Realism in Great Britain and the United States." Philosophy Today Edward L. Schaub, (ed.). Chicago and London (reprint from The Monist, 1927): 19-36.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1929a. "Current Realism." Anthology of Recent Philosophy D. S. Robinson, (ed.). New York: Thomas Y. Crowell Co. (re-print from Philosophy Today): 279-290.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1929b. "A Re-examination of Critical Realism." Philosophical Review 38 (5): 439-55.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1929c. "Critical Realism and Substance." Mind 38 (152): 473-88. Reprinted in Ruth Goff, (ed.). 2008. Revitalizing Causality: Realism About Causality in Philosophy and Social Science. New York: Routledge: 13-25.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1930a. "A Naturalistic Interpretation of Religion." The New Humanist 3 (4): 1-4.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1930b. "Realism, Naturalism and Humanism." in Contemporary American Philosophy G. P. Adams and W. P. Montague, v. 2. (eds.), New York: Macmillan: 261-85.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1931. "Humanism, Viewed and Reviewed." The New Humanist 4 (15): 12-16.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1932a. The Philosophy of Physical Realism. New York: Macmillan.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1932b. "Reinterpretation of Relativity." Philosophical Review 41 (5): 517-18.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1933a. "L'Hypothèse de l'Émergence." Revue de Métaphysique et de Morale 40 (3): 309-24.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1933b. "Religious Humanism." The New Humanist 6 (3): 7-12.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood (Drafter and co-signer). May-June, 1933c. "Humanist Manifesto." The New Humanist 6 (3): 58-61.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1933d. "In Defense of the Manifesto." The New Humanist 6 (6): 6-12.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1933e. “Review of Durant Drake, Introduction to Philosophy.” Journal of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific Methods 3: 667-9.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1934. "Nature and Naturalism." The New Humanist 7 (2): 1-8.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1935a. “Review of C. F. Gauss, Primer for Tomorrow.” Michigan Alumnus Quarterly Review. 41: 465-6.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1935b. "George S. Morris." Dictionary of American Biography 13: 208-9.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1937a. "Critical Realism and the Independence of the Object." Journal of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific Methods 34 (20): 541-550.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood.  1937b. "Henry Philip Tappan." Dictionary of American Biography 18: 302-3.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1938a. "An Analytic Approach to the Mind-Body Problem." Philosophical Review 47 (5): 461-87.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1938b. "A Statement of Critical Realism." Revue Internationale de Philosophie 3: 472-496.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1939a. "Positivism in Contemporary Philosophical Thought." American Sociological Review: 26-42.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1939b. "A Clarification of Critical Realism." Philosophy of Science 6 (4): 412-92.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1940. "Knowledge and its Categories." The Development of American Philosophy, W. G. Muelder and Laurence Sears, (ed’s). Cambridge, Mass: 431-40  (Reprinted from Drake, Durant. 1920. Essays in Critical Realism. New York: Gordian Press: 187-219)
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1941a. "Humanism as a Religion." The Humanist 1 (1): 5-8.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1941b. "A Correspondence Theory of Truth." Journal of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific Methods 38 (24): 653-54.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1942a. "Aspects of Democracy II: the Quality of Democracy." Michigan Alumnus Quarterly Review 48: 98-103.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1942b. "Galileo Galilei." Michigan Alumnus Quarterly Review 48: 301-7.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1942c. “Review of E. Gilson, God and Philosophy.” The Humanist 2: 36-7.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1942-43. "Dewey on Materialism." Journal of Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 3 (4): 381-92.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1943a. "Science , Philosophy, and Religion." The Humanist 3: 84-5.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1943b. "Verification of Categories: Existence and Substance" Journal of Philosophy 40 (8): 197-205.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1943c. "Causality and Substance." Philosophical Review.”.  52 (1): 1-27 (Reprinted in Ruth Goff, (ed.). 2008. Revitalizing Causality: Realism About Causality in Philosophy and Social Science. New York: Routledge: 26-45).
  • Sellars, Roy Wood.  1943d. "Reason and Revolution," Michigan Alumnus Quarterly Review  49: 212-14.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1943e. “Review of J. Maritain, Education at the Cross Roads.” The Humanist 3: 165-70.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1944a. "Causation and Perception." Philosophical Review 53 (6): 534-56.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood.  1944b. "Reformed Materialism and Intrinsic Endurance." Philosophical Review. 53: 359-82.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood.  1944c. "Is Naturalism Enough?" Journal of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific Methods 41 (September): 533-44.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood.  1944d. "Does Naturalism Need Ontology?" Journal of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific Methods 41 (25): 686-94.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood.  1944e. "Can a Reformed Materialism Do Justice to Values?" Ethics 55 (1): 28-45.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1944-45a. "The Meaning of True and False." Journal of Philosophy and Phenomenological Research  5 (1): 98-103.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood.  1944-45b. "Reflections on Dialectical Materialism." Journal of Philosophy and Phenomenological Research  5 (2): 157-79.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1944-45c. "Knowing and Knowledge." Journal of Philosophy and Phenomenological Research  5 (3): 341-344.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood.  1944-45d.  "Knowing through Propositions." Journal of Philosophy and Phenomenological Research  5 (3): 348-9.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1945-46. “Review of Yervant Krikorian, Naturalism and the Human Spirit." Journal of Philosophy and Phenomenological Research  6: 436-9.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood.  1946a. "A Note on the Theory of Relativity." Journal of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific Methods  43 (12): 309-17.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood.  1946b. "Materialism and Relativity: A Semantic Analysis." Philosophical Review 55 (1): 25-51.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1946c. "Philosophy and Physics of Relativity." Philosophy of Science 13 (3): 177-95.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1946-47. "Positivism and Materialism." Journal of Philosophy and Phenomenological Research  7 (1): 12-40.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1947. "Accept the Universe as a Going Concern." Religious Liberals Reply Henry Wieman, (ed.). Boston: Beacon Press.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood.  1948a. "Do the Natural Sciences Have a Need of the Social Sciences?," Philosophy of Science  15 (2): 104-8.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1948b. "Naturalistic Humanism." Religion in the Twentieth Century Vergilius Ferm, (ed.). New York: Littlefield and Adams (later edition date 1958): 415-31.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1948c. “Review of A. N. Whitehead, Essays in Science and Philosophy." The Humanist  8: 92-3.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1949a. "Social Philosophy and the American Scene." Philosophy for the Future R. W. Sellars, V. J. McGill, and M. Farber, (ed.’s). New York: Macmillan: 61-75.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1949b. "Materialism and Human Knowing." Philosophy for the Future R. W. Sellars, V. J. McGill, and M. Farber, (ed’s). New York: Macmillan: 75-106.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1949c. "Resume of W. Cook Foundation Lectures.” (delivered by Ralph Barton Perry), Michigan Alumnus Quarterly Review 55: 185-94.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood, McGill, V.J., Farber, Marvin. 1949. Forward to Philosophy for the Future, R. W. Sellars, V. J. McGill, and M. Farber, (ed’s). New York: Macmillan: v-xii.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood.  1949-50. “Review of Leslie A. White, The Science of Culture." Journal of Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 10: 586-7.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1950a. "Critical Realism and Modern Materialism." Philosophical Thought in France and the United States, Marvin Farber, (ed.). Buffalo: The University of Buffalo Publications: 463-82.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1950b. "The New Materialism." A History of Philosophical Systems V. Ferm, (ed.). New York: Philosophical Library: 418-28.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1950c. “Review of Frank Chapman Sharp, Good Will and Ill Will," The Humanist.  10: 277-8
  • Sellars, Roy Wood.  1950d. "Review of Leslie A. White, The Science of Culture." Michigan Alumnus Quarterly Review 56: 175-6.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1950-51. "The Spiritualism of Lavelle and Le Senne." Journal of Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 11 (3): 386-93.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1951. "Professor Goudge's Queries with Respect to Materialism." Philosophical Review 60 (2): 243-8.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood.  1951-52a. "Review of R. W. Boynton, Beyond Mythology." Journal of Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 12: 146-8.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1951-52b.  "Review of Charles Mayer, “Man: Mind or Matter." Journal of Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 12: 436-42.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1952. “Le spiritualisme de Louis Lavelle et de René le sense.” Les Études Philosophiques 9(1/2): 30-40.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1955. "My Philosophical Position: A Rejoinder." Journal of Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 16 (1): 72-97.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1956a. "Physical Realism and Relativity: Some Unfinished Business." Philosophy of Science  23 (2): 75-81.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1956b. "Gestalt and Relativity: An Analogy." Philosophy of Science 23 (4): 275-279.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1957a. "Guided Causality, Using Reason and 'Free Will'." Journal of Philosophy 54 (August): 485-93.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood.  1957b. "Philosophical Orientation and Peace." The Idea of War and Peace in Contemporary Philosophy Irving Louis Horowitz, (ed.). New York: vii-xx (The book was re-released by Literary Licensing Publisher in 2012).
  • Sellars, Roy Wood.  1959a. "Levels of Causality: The Emergence of Guidance and Reason in Nature." Journal of Philosophy and Phenomenological Research  20 (1): 1-17.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. January, 1959b. "Sensations as Guides to Perceiving." Mind 68 (January): 2-15.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood.  1959c. "'True' as Contextually Implying Correspondence." Journal of Philosophy 56 (18): 712-22.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood; Lamont, Corliss; Otto, Max; Huxley, Julien; Williams, Gardner; Randall Jr; John Herman. 1959. A Humanist Symposium on Metaphysics. Journal of Philosophy 56 (2): 45-64.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. October 1960. "Panpsychism or Evolutionary Materialism." Philosophy of Science 27 (October): 229-50.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1961a. "Referential Transcendence." Journal of Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 22 (1): 1-15.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood.  1961b. "Querying Whitehead's Framework." Revue Internationale de Philosophie 56-57: 135-66.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1962. "American Critical Realism and British Theories of Sense Perception I and II." Methodos: 61-108.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1963. "Direct, Referential Realism." in Dialogue 2 (02): 135-43.         
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1965. "Existentialism, Realistic Empiricism, and Materialism." Journal of Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 25 (3): 315-32.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1968. Lending a Hand to Hylas. Ann Arbor: Edward Brothers.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood.  1969a. "A Possible Integration of Science and Philosophy," Zygon 4 (3): 293-97
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1969b. "Some Questions and Suggestions: An Exposition," Journal of Philosophy. 66 (24): 859-60
  • Sellars, R.W. 1969c. “Le naturalisme de Sellars,” Dialectica 23 (1): 79-80
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1969d. Reflections on American Philosophy from Within. Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1970a. Principles of Emergent Realism. W. Preston Warren, (ed.) . St. Louis: Warren H. Green.
  • This book is really the best place to obtain an overview of R.W. Sellars’ writings with both extensive primary sources and commentary over the course of his development.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1970b. Social Patterns and Political Horizons. Nashville: Aurora Publishers.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1970c. Principles, Perspectives, and Problems of Philosophy. New York: Pageant Press International Corp.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1973a. Neglected Alternatives: Critical Essays by Roy Wood Sellars. William. Preston Warren, (ed.), Lewisburg: Bucknell University Press.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1973b. January-February. "Toward a New Humanist Manifesto." The Humanist
  • Sellars, Roy Wood.  1973c. "Recollections of Marvin Farber." In Phenomenology and Natural ExistenceDale Riepe, (ed.). Albany: State University of New York Press.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood. 1975. Forward to William Preston Warren. Roy Wood Sellars. Boston: Twayne.
  • Sellars, Roy Wood.  1991. “Philosophy of Organism and Physical Realism”. The Philosophy of Alfred North Whitehead. Paul A. Schlipp, (ed.). LaSalle: Open Court: 407-433 (Original publication date, 1941).

b. Secondary Sources

  • Avery, Jon Henry. 1989. “An Analysis and Critique of Roy Wood Sellars' Descriptive and Normative Theories of Religious Humanism.” PhD diss., The Iliff School of Theology and University of Denver.
  • Bahm, Archie, 1954. "Evolutionary Naturalism." Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 15 (1): 1-12.
  • Baker, Richard R. 1950. “The Naturalism of Roy Wood Sellars,” New Scholasticism. 24 (1): 3-31.
  • Beckermann, Angsar, Flohr, Hans, Kim, Jaegwon. 1993. Emergence or Reduction: Essays on the Prospects of Non-Reductive Physicalism. Berlin: De Gruyter.
  • Benjamin, Cornelius. 1934. Book Review: “The Philosophy of Physical Realism.” Roy Wood Sellars. Ethics. 44 (2): 270.
  • Bergson, Henri. 1998. Creative Evolution. Arthur Mitchell, (trans.). New York: Dover.
  • Blau, Joseph, 1952. Men and Movements in American Philosophy. New York: Prentice-Hall.
  • Blitz, David. 2010.  Emergent Evolution and Creative Novelty. New York: Springer.
  • Bogomolov, A.S. 1962. “Roy Wood Sellars in the Materialist Theory of Knowledge,” Russian Studies in Philosophy. 1 (3): 31-32.
  • Chisholm, Roderick, 1955. "Critical Realism," Philosophy and Phenomenological Research. 15 (1): 33-47.
  • Davies, Paul, Clayton, Philip, (ed’s). 2008.  The Re-Emergence of Emergence: The Emergentist Hypothesis from Science to Religion. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Delaney, C. F., 1969. Mind and Nature: A Study of the Naturalistic Philosophy of Cohen, Woodbridge and Sellars. Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press.
  • Delaney, C. F. 1971. "Sellars and the Contemporary Mind-Body Problem," The New Scholasticism 45: 245-68.
  • Emmet, Dorothy. 1932. Whitehead’s Philosophy of Organism. London: Macmillan.
  • Ferm, Vergilius. 1950. “Varieties of Naturalism,” A History of Philosophical Systems. V. Ferm, (ed.). New York: Philosophical Library: 429-441.
  • Frankena, William. 1954. "Theory of Valuation," Philosophy and Phenomenological Research. 15 (1): 65-81.
  • Frankena, William. Dec. 1973. “Roy Wood Sellars: Obituary,” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 34 (2): 300-301.
  • Frankena, William. 1973-74. “Roy Wood Sellars: Memoriam,” Proceedings and Addresses of the American Philosophical Association 47: 230-232.
  • Gluck, Samuel E. 1971. Review of  Norman Paul Melchert’s Realism, Materialism, and the Mind: The Philosophy of Roy Wood Sellars. Springfield, Illinois: Charles C. Thomas. Philosophy 46 (177): 281ff.
  • Grayling, A.C. 2003. Meditations for the Humanist: Ethics for a Secular Age. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Griffin, James Phillip,  1966. “Foundations of Ethical Value in the Philosophy of Roy Wood Sellars and William Temple.” PhD diss., Boston University.
  • Hasker, William. 2001. The Emergent Self. Ithaca: Cornell University Press.
  • Herbert, David. 1994. “A New Critical Realism: An Examination of Roy Wood Sellars’ Epistemology,” Transactions of the Charles Sanders Peirce Society 30 (3): 477 - 514.
  • Hoor, Marten. 1954.  "Humanism as a Religion," Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 15 (1): 84-97.
  • Hudson, Yeager. 1965. “Metaphysical Causality in the Philosophies of Brand Blanshard, Roy Wood Sellars, and John Laird.” PhD diss., Boston University.
  • Iobst, Philip Kirschman. 1975. The Normative Philosophy of Roy Wood Sellars: A Critical Examination, Ph. D. Dissertation, State University of New York at Buffalo
  • Kreyche, Robert.  1951. “The Naturalism of Roy Wood Sellars.” PhD diss., University of Ottawa.
  • Kuiper, John. 1954 (some references say 1955). "The Mind-Body Problem," Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 15 (September): 46-84.
  • Kurtz, Paul. 1973. Humanist Manifestos I and II. Amherst, NY: Prometheus Books.
  • Kurtz, Paul. 1981. “The Arrogance of Humanism,”  International Studies in Philosophy 13 (1):91-93.
  • Kurtz, Paul. 1983. A Secular Humanist Declaration. Amherst, NY: Prometheus Books.
  • Kurtz, Paul. 2000. Humanist Manifesto 2000: A Call for a New Planetary Humanism. Amherst, NY: Prometheus Books.
  • Levine, Steven. 2007. “Sellars’ Critical Direct Realism,” International Journal of Philosophical Studies 15 (1): 53-76.
  • Kurtz, Paul. 2007. What is Secular Humanism? Amherst, NY: Prometheus Books.
  • Lamont, Corliss. 1997. The Philosophy of Humanism.  Washington, D.C: Humanist Press.
  • McDonough, Richard. 2002. “Emergence and Creativity: Five Degrees of Freedom,” Creativity, Cognition, and Knowledge Terry Dartnall, (ed.). Westport, Connecticut: Praeger: 283-321.
  • Melchert, Norman Paul.  1964. “An Examination of the Physical Realism of Roy Wood Sellars.” PhD diss., University of Pennsylvania.
  • Melchert, Norman Paul.  1968. Realism, Materialism, and the Mind: The Philosophy of Roy Wood Sellars. Springfield, Ill.: Charles C. Thomas.
  • Munk, Arthur W. P. 1945. “Roy Wood Sellars' Criticism of Idealism.” PhD diss., Boston University.
  • Ramsperger, A.G.  1967. “Critical Realism” Encyclopedia of Philosophy, v. 2. Paul Edwards., (ed.) (New York: Macmillan and the Free Press: 262-263.
  • Reck, Andrew. 1962. Recent American Philosophy: Studies of Ten Representative Thinkers. New York: Pantheon Books.
  • Reck, Andrew. 1971. "The Realism of Roy Wood Sellars," The New Scholasticism. 45 (2): 209-44.
  • Sellars, Wilfrid. 1949. “Aristotelian Philosophies of Mind”. Philosophy for the Future, Roy Wood Sellars, V.J. McGill, Marvin Farber, (ed’s). New York: Macmillan: 544-570.
  • Sellars, Wilfrid. 1955. "Physical Realism," Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 15 (1): 13-32.
  • Sellars, Wilfrid, and Meehl, Paul. 1956. “The Concept of Emergence,” Minnesota Studies in the Philosophy of Science, v. 1.  Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press: 239-252.
  • Sellars, Wilfrid. 1965. “The Identity Approach to the Mind-Body Problem,” Review of Metaphysics 18 (March): 430-51.
  • Sellars, Wilfrid, 1971. "The Double-Knowledge Approach to the Mind-Body Problem," The New Scholasticism. 45 (2): 269-89. (Note that Roy had published an article with the same title in 1923)
  • Sellars, Wilfrid. 1991. “Philosophy and the Scientific Image of Man,” Science, Perception and Reality Atascadero, California: Ridgeview: 1-40.
  • Schaeffer, Francis. 2005. A Christian Manifesto. Wheaton, Illinois: Crossway Books.
  • Sessions, George. 1995. Deep Ecology for the Twenty-First Century. Boston: Shambhal.
  • Slurink, Pouwel. 1996. “Back to Roy Wood Sellars: Why His Evolutionary Naturalism is Still Worthwhile,” Journal of the History of Philosophy 34 (3):425-44.
  • Rowntree, Clifford. 1964. “Direct, Referential Realism: A Comment,” Dialogue 2 (04): 452-453.
  • Shoemaker, Sydney. 2002. “Emergence,” Philosophical Studies 58 (1-2): 53-63.
  • Trelo, Virgil J. 1966. The Critical Realism of Roy Wood Sellars. Lisle, Ill.: St. Procopius College.
  • Vintiadis, Elly. “Emergence,” Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy
  • Warren, William Preston. 1967. "Realism 1900-1930: An Emerging Epistemology," The Monist. 51 (2): 179-205.
  • Warren, William Preston. 1970. Introduction to Roy Wood Sellars. Principles of Emergent Realism, W. Preston Warren, (ed.). St. Louis: Warren H. Green: xi-xxiv.
  • Warren, William Preston, 1972a. "Foundations of Philosophy," Bucknell Review 19 (3): 69-100.
  • Warren, William Preston. 1972b. "Experimentalism Plus," Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 33 (2): 149-82.
  • Warren, William Preston. 1973a. “A Brief Biography of Roy Wood Sellars,” Neglected Alternatives: Critical Essays by Roy Wood Sellars. W. Preston Warren, (ed.). Lewisburg: Bucknell University Press: 19-22.
  • Warren, William Preston. 1973b. Preface to Roy Wood Sellars’ Neglected Alternatives. Lewisburg: Bucknell University Press: 7-15.
  • Warren, William Preston. 1975. Roy Wood Sellars. Boston: Twayne.
  • This book is probably the best sympathetic secondary source on R.W. Sellars’ views.
  • Werkmeister, W. H. 1981. History of Philosophical Ideas in the United States. New York: Ronald Press.
  • Warren, William Preston. 2007. “Roy Wood Sellars: Philosopher of Religious Humanism,” Notable American Unitarians, Herbert Vetter, (ed.).  Cambridge, Harvard Square Library: 211-213.
  • Wilson, Edwin. 1995. The Genesis of a Humanist Manifesto. Amherst, NY. Humanist Press.
  • Wood, Ledger. 1950. “Recent Epistemological Schools,” A History of Philosophical Systems, V. Ferm, (ed.). New York: Philosophical Library: 516-539.
  • Wright, Edmund. 1994. “A New Critical Realism: An Examination of the Critical Realism of Roy Wood Sellars,” Transactions of the Charles Sanders Pierce Society 30 (3): 477-514.


Author Information

Richard McDonough
Arium School of Arts & Sciences