Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Sengzhao (Seng-Chao) (c.378—413 CE)

Sengzhao (Seng-Chao) was a Buddhist monk who lived during China’s “Period of Disunity” between the stability of the Han and Tang dynasties.  His Zhaolun (Treatises of [Seng]zhao) is perhaps the most significant text for the study of early Mādhyamika (“middle-ist”) or Sanlun (“Three-Treatise”) Buddhism in China.  His work may be the only extensive compilation of early Chinese Mādhyamika treatises available, although no Mādhyamika “school” is likely to have existed in China until Jizang (549-623 CE) projected such a lineage back to the time of Sengzhao.  Mādhyamika, a philosophical development that arose within Mahāyāna Buddhism in India during the first few centuries CE, concentrates on distinguishing between concepts and ideas as necessary but insubstantial tools for functioning within the world of conventional reality and the false sense of duality between subject and object that they often engender.  As Sengzhao puts it in his Commentary to the Vimalakīrtinirdesha Sūtra: “Those things which are find their genesis in the mind; [those things] which originate in the mind arise from things. That region of affirmation and negation is a place of illusion.”  Considered to have been a brilliant young monk who was the principal person responsible for the transmission of  Mādhyamika teaching in China, Sengzhao has received a great deal of attention from scholars interested in resolving the question of the extent to which the Chinese fully understood the Indian religio-philosophical system and its relationship to the indigenous Daoist and Confucian traditions.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
    1. Traditional Biography
    2. Other Accounts
  2. Works
  3. Background
    1. Indian Mdhyamika
    2. Chinese Mdhyamika
  4. The Treatises
    1. Overview
    2. Things Do Not Shift
    3. Non Absolute Emptiness
    4. Prajn Is Without Dichotomizing Knowledge
    5. Correspondence with Liu Yimin
    6. Nirvna Is Without Conceptualization
    7. The Treatises as a Whole
  5. References and Further Reading

1. Life

a. Traditional Biography

The Gaoseng Zhuan (Biographies of Eminent Monks), contains the following traditional account of Sengzhao’s life: The monk Sengzhao was a man from Jingzhao. His family being impoverished, Zhao hired himself out as a copyist in order to make a living. As such, he successively went through the Classics and History, in the process becoming proficient in writing. Zhao’s interests inclined towards the subtle and profound, having always considered Lao[zi] and Zhuang[zi] as particularly important in terms of the mind. After studying Laozi’s Daodejing, Zhao declared, “It is indeed beautiful, but I have not yet discovered the region where my spirit can settle down and my worldly ties be completely severed.” After a time, Zhao read the old [version] of the Vimalakrtinirdesha Stra and was overcome with happiness and pleasure. Opening it repeatedly, he relished its flavor and exclaimed, “At last I know where I should be!” Because of this, Zhao became a learned monk, studying both the Vaipulya Stra and the Tripitaka.

Having reached the age for capping [coming of age], Zhao’s reputation had become widespread through the Passes and in the administrative capital. In time, however, quarrelsome people doubted the fame that had come to him primarily because of his youth. Coming from as far away as one thousand li, they entered the Passes and engaged Zhao in debate. However, since Zhao had a talent for profound thinking and was also an expert in pure conversation, he seized whatever openings he had and pointedly crushed his opponents, who could not obstruct him. In time, respected scholars from Jingzhao and from outside the Passes wondered at his discriminating arguments and considered trying to challenge him.

At the time when Kumrajva [a famous Central Asian Buddhist missionary to China, c. 344-413 CE] arrived in Gecang, Zhao followed him in order to become a disciple. Kumrajva highly praised him without limit. When Kumrajva moved to Chang’an, Zhao also followed him there. Yao Xing placed Zhao, Sengrui and other monks in the Xiaoyao pavilion, where they assisted in the examination and editing of the Buddhist treatises.

Zhao, being aware that the Sage [the Buddha] had passed on long ago, that the literature had come to take on numerous mixed interpretations, and that earlier translations of the texts had certain mistakes in them, regularly consulted with Kumrajva and greatly increased his comprehension. Therefore, following the translation of the Pancavimshatisahsrik prajnpramit Stra (Twenty-Five Thousand Stanza Perfection of Wisdom Stra), Zhao wrote the treatise entitled Prajn Is Without Dichotomizing Knowledge in over two thousand words. Upon its completion, Zhao presented it to Kumrajva. After reading it, the master declared it to be beautiful and said to Zhao, “My explanations are on par with yours, but your wording and expression is far better!”

In time, the retired Lushan scholar Liu Yimin saw a copy of Zhao’s Prajn Is Without Dichotomizing Knowledge. He also praised it, saying, “I did not think that among your monks there would be another Bingshu.” In turn, Liu Yimin presented it to his superior, Huiyuan, who also cherished it. Huiyuan exclaimed that he had never seen another like it. Accordingly, the entire community opened and savored the treatise, passing it from one to another repeatedly.

Liu Yimin also composed a letter to Zhao.  Following this, Zhao wrote treatises on Non Absolute Emptiness, Things Do Not Shift and others. In addition, he commented on the Vimalakrtinirdesha Stra and composed numerous prefaces, all of which remain extant. Following the death of Kumrajva, Zhao reflected on his teacher’s untimely death and eternal departure, feeling his longing desires and hopes vanquished. At this time, Zhao wrote the treatise Nirvna Is Without Conceptualization.  This essay consists of ten explanations and nine arguments in approximately one thousand words. When the treatise was completed, Zhao presented it to his superior, Yao Xing….

Yao Xing’s response to Zhao’s work was very attentive to various details about the meaning and included praise for its completeness. He then ordered by decree that it be copied and distributed to all the members of his family. This action demonstrates how highly Zhao was regarded at this time. In the tenth year of the yixi period [c. 413-414 CE], Zhao died in Chang’an, having reached the autumn of his thirty first year. (Taishô shinsh daizokyô L; No. 2509; 365a-366b.1)

b. Other Accounts

A number of other accounts exist concerning the life of Sengzhao, though they rarely shed any new light on his work or activities. The Weishou [a collection of canonical texts] accords Sengzhao preeminence among the eight hundred or so scholars gathered at Chang’an: “Daorong and his fellows were of knowledge and learning all-pervasive, and Sengzhao was the greatest of them. When Kumrajva made a translation, Sengzhao would always take pen in hand and define the meanings of words. He annotated the Vimalakrtinirdesha Stra and also published several treatises. They all have subtle meaning, and scholars venerate them.” (Hurvitz 54)

While adding nothing substantively new, this version highlights Sengzhao’s importance as a liaison between the Indian Kumrajva and the Chinese language. All indications point to the foreign master’s reliance on Sengzhao’s ability to “translate” the Indian terminology into stylistically acceptable Chinese. The gong’an (meditation puzzle) collection known as the Biyen lu (Blue Cliff Records) contains a tale concerning Sengzhao’s death which by all accounts is apocryphal. Despite its spurious legend regarding Zhao’s demise, within the gongan commentary supplied by the Chan (“meditation”; Japanese Zen) master Yunmen, we find another reference to his life that provides some insight into his correspondence with Liu Yimin. According to the Biyen lu, Sengzhao not only took Kumrajva as his teacher, but “he also called upon the bodhisattva Buddhabhadra at the Temple of the Tile Coffin, who had come from India to transmit the mind-seal of the twenty-seventh Patriarch. Sengzhao then entered deeply into the inner sanctum.” (Cleary and Cleary 1977:401)

2. Works

In terms of literary output, Sengzhao’s major extant work is the Zhaolun. This text is a product of the formative years of the Chinese Mdhyamika tradition, and consists of a preface, introduction, four treatises and a set of correspondence between Sengzhao and Liu Yimin, a lay monk from the nearby Lushan monastery. The Zhaolun represents one of the earliest and most comprehensive examples of the embryonic thought of the Chinese Mdhyamika school.

In fact, it may be the only extensive compilation of early Chinese Mdhyamika treatises available. Not only do we possess most of the works ascribed to Sengzhao, but the extant texts are full-length, internally logical discourses. By comparing the preface, internal evidence and Sengzhao’s biography, the following order of composition emerges:

c. 405: Prajn Is Without Dichotomizing Knowledge
c. 409: Non-Absolute Emptiness
c. 410: Correspondence with Liu Yimin
c. 410-411: Things Do Not Shift
c. 412-413: Nirvna Is Without Conceptualization
c. 412-413: Introduction (if genuinely composed by Sengzhao, as tradition asserts)

In its completed form, as found in the Taishô shinsh daizokyô (Taishô XLV, No. 1858), the text is rearranged into the following order:

Things Do Not Shift
Non-Absolute Emptiness
Prajn Is Without Dichotomizing Knowledge
Correspondence with Liu Yimin

Nirvna Is Without Conceptualization

In addition, Sengzhao is credited with a commentary on the Vimalakrtinirdesha Stra, an obituary of Kumrajva, an afterword to the Saddharmapundrika Stra, and prefaces to four Mahyna texts: the Drghgama, the Shata Shstra, the Brahmajla Stra, and the Vimalakrtinirdesha Stra.

The Chan tradition also attributes another treatise to the hand of Sengzhao, the Baozang lun (Treasure Store Treatise) (Taishô XLV, No. 1857: 143b-150a), though most scholars regard the work as spurious. Another work, entitled On the Identity of the Buddha’s Two Bodies, has been attributed to Sengzhao; this essay, however, is lost and no corroborating evidence of its existence can be found, either in Sengzhao’s other work or that of later commentators.

In his writing, Sengzhao routinely employs the standard tools of Mdhyamika discourse (see Ngrjuna). Thus, we find Sengzhao engaging in dialectical arguments in which he resorts to the tetralemma (four-cornered negation) as a “solution.” According to this formula, any proposition x entails four logical possibilities:

  1. X is
  2. X is not
  3. X both is and is not
  4. X neither is nor is not

Two of his treatises (Prajn Is Without Dichotomizing Knowledge and Nirvna Is Without Conceptualization) follow the debate-like format of Ngrjuna’s Mulamadhyamakakrik (Verses on the Fundamentals of the Middle Way) [MMK]. In addition, Sengzhao became famous for his artful use of paradox, often reminiscent of the Daoist classic, Zhuangzi. This stylistic trait would make him a favorite of the later Chan school, which regarded Sengzhao as one of its unofficial patriarchs.

3. Background

a. Indian Mdhyamika

Mdhyamika, a philosophical development that arose within Mahyna Buddhism during the first few centuries CE, concentrates on breaking down the reliance on ordinary means of apprehending the world around us. While concepts and ideas are a necessary part of functioning within the world of conventional reality, our tendency to substantialize those concepts into metaphysical realities leads to behavior generating the basic problems of dis-ease (duhkha) and therefore becoming.

Indian Mdhyamika targets the mind’s natural disposition toward conceptualization, a tendency that both creates and fosters a false sense of duality ensuing between the perceiving subject and observed objects. By assigning distinctive names and characteristics to things, we unwittingly create a false dichotomy, particularly in terms of linguistic conventions. Ngrjuna (c. 150-250 CE) referred to this process as the proliferation of conceptual and verbal hair-splitting, or prapanca. He articulated the concept of “emptiness” (shnyat) – the view that neither subject nor object exist independently — as a soteriological device, a deconstructive tool to rid the mind of delusional prapanca. Defined in varying ways by Western scholars, prapanca refers to the mind’s natural tendency to both create elaborate networks of interrelated mental constructions and to cling to those constructs as real.

One who grasps the view that the Tathgata exists,
Having seized the Buddha,
Constructs conceptual fabrications [prapanca]
About one who has achieved nirvna.

Those who develop mental fabrications with regard to the Buddha,
Who has gone beyond all fabrications,
As a consequence of those cognitive fabrications,
Fail to see the Tathgata. (Garfield 1995:62)

These mental fabrications inevitably arise from the mind’s predilection for naming things. In trying to distinguish between things and their respective functions, we assign names as a means of identification. The process of naming itself involves the picking out of abstracted characteristics unique to an entity and declaring it to be the “essence” of the thing.

What human beings perceive as reality is nothing more than artificially manufactured distinctions between things which in turn re-combine into a sense of “I” and “it/them.” From the practical standpoint of everyday living and functioning within the confines of the mundane, these constructs are absolutely necessary. As conventional designations, however, their provisional descriptions have no bearing whatsoever on Ultimate Reality. When taken for the real, they become objects of clinging and therefore fuel for rebirth. Clinging to these fabrications both fuels the cycle of becoming and gives rise to quarrels and disputations.

Common people take their stand on their own points of view . . . and hence there arise all the contentions. Prapanca is the root of all contentions and prapanca arises from the mind. (Dazhi Dulun; Taishô XXV, No. 1509; 61a)

Dissensions abound as a result of the mind’s constant pursuit of what it mistakes for the real. Clinging to the ephemeral, the mind generates ignorance, following its own fantasies in contempt for the way things truly are.

As Ngrjuna goes to great pains to point out, his opponents and the common person continually misinterpret emptiness. One takes it to mean complete annihilationism while another understands it in a newly reified manner. In addressing his opponents’ contention that his emptiness leads to the utter destruction of the Buddhist doctrines of co-dependent origination, karma, the four noble truths and all conventional activity, Ngrjuna retorts:

You understand neither emptiness nor the reasons behind emptiness nor the meaning of emptiness. Therefore you create these problems for yourself. (MMK 24.7)

In his later commentary, Candrakrti (c. 600s CE) elaborates on this verse by connecting the opponents’ position to a misapprehension of the entire Mdhyamika program. Mdhyamika does not advocate a nihilistic position as alleged, nor does it take on ontological status within Ngrjuna’s philosophy. Rather, the purport of emptiness lies in its capacity as a soteriological device intended to calm the excesses of prapanca.

Emptiness is taught in order to calm conceptual diffusion completely; therefore, its purpose is the calming of all conceptual diffusion [prapanca]. (Huntington 1989:205)

Having pacified conceptualization and destroyed the proliferation of mental constructs, a state of equanimity is reached. No longer drawing artificial distinctions between things, no longer reifying the conventional, the one who grasps the real meaning of emptiness ceases apprehending mistaken perceptions of the self, and thereby realizes the ultimate soteriological goal of release.

When views of “I”and “mine” are extinguished, whether with respect to the inner or outer, the appropriator ceases. This having ceased, arising comes to an end.Activity and dis-ease having come to an end, there is nirvna. Activity and dis-ease arise out of conceptualization. Conceptualization arises out of conceptual hair-splitting [prapanca]. Conceptual hair-splitting ceases through emptiness. (MMK XVIII. 4-5)

b. Chinese Mdhyamika

Although Mdhyamika is known in Chinese as the Sanlun Zong (Three Treatise School), most scholars acknowledge that no such “school” existed until Jizang (549-623), who projected such a lineage back to the time of Sengzhao and the disciples of Kumrajva. The Sanlun Zong derives its name from its identification of three major texts as the focal point of study: the Zhonglun (Verses on the Fundamentals of the Middle Way) and Shi’er Menlun (Twelve Topic Treatise) by Ngrjuna (c. 150-250), and the Bailun (Hundred Treatises) by Aryadeva. In addition to these primary texts, the Chinese Mdhyamika concentrated on a number of secondary texts, as evidenced by the commentaries and prefaces to other Mahayanist texts, including the Vimalakrtinirdesha Stra, Bodhisattva dhyna and the Brahmajla Stra.

Chinese Mdhyamika emphasizes the ontological, epistemological and soteriological qualities of emptiness. From this perspective, the main problem facing the unenlightened revolves around their reliance on conceptualization or naming for their understanding and apprehension of the world. In discussing false views concerning the nature of nirvna, Sengzhao points out that “the way of nirvna cannot be understood by grasping at either existence or nonexistence…. These seemingly objective mental projections of existence and nonexistence are merely regions of vain hope.”

Sengzhao elaborates on this point using the concept of “the emptiness of emptiness” (shnyatshnyat) in his Commentary to the Vimalakrtinirdesha Stra:

Those things which are find their genesis in the mind; [those things] which originate in the mind arise from things. That region of affirmation and negation is a place of illusion. (Taishô XXXVIII, NO. 1775; 372c.17-26)

Thus, neither object nor subject exist independently. Mind depends upon the conventionally real and the conventionally real in turn depends upon the mind.

4. The Treatises

a. Overview

Each treatise begins with a basic statement of the problem as understood by Sengzhao. In every instance, the fallacious interpretation of either an object or doctrinal position is immediately linked to the discriminatory activity of prapanca. Understood both in the sense of verbal argumentation and conceptual hair-splitting, prapanca plays a critical role in Sengzhao’s philosophy of religion. While rarely addressing the issue of prapanca directly, he alludes to the question throughout the treatises. Bringing these activities to an end represents the heart of not only the individual treatises but also the text taken as a whole.

Sengzhao traces the genesis of mistaken apprehensions to the interplay and co-dependency of words, concepts and existent things. One without the others proves untenable. Built upon the matrix of observing the phenomenal world (whose mundane existence is never questioned by Sengzhao), ordinary perception functions by assigning a name to individual manifestations and then conceptualizing the conjunction of that name and phenomenon into a self-existent entity with distinctive own-marks. Once the concept has been created and an appropriate name assigned, knowledge of that object is generated. With the presumed knowledge of the thing in hand, the unenlightened believe that they have grasped reality and therefore attained soteriological release.

Sengzhao relentlessly undermines the conventional practice of naming and conceptualizing, believing that the process lead to the delusions and contentions plaguing his day. While never concerned with language as such, he at the same time recognizes the fact that the continuous inter-generational usage of words establishes a common perception that the things so named and discussed possess discrete own-being. Sengzhao certainly does not believe that from the standpoint of the ordinary person this is a well-thought-out “philosophical” system. On the contrary, he continually bemoans the fact that most people simply do not take the time to reflect upon their everyday assumptions.

By opposing the worldly [perception], our words appear insipid and flavorless, which then prevents the common person from deciding between either accepting or rejecting [the correct perspective]. The inferior person simply washes their hands of it and forgets about these matters. . . . It is indeed grievous to me that people’s affections have been led astray for so long, that the truth lies in front of them and yet they remain unaware of its existence. (Things Do Not Shift)

Truth is under our feet, in front of our eyes and yet we lack either the ability or will to apprehend reality. While displaying a sense of compassion for the ordinary person, Sengzhao at the same time roundly criticizes those who argue and dispute over the nature of reality. Those philosophers and religious practitioners who embark on the spiritual journey but get waylaid by mind games and conceptual elaboration are held accountable for their misapprehensions. Sengzhao immediately takes the contentious, the quarrelsome and the polemical to task in the introductory remarks of each treatise. This practice serves as one indication of his primary objective in dismantling the propagation of conceptual and verbal hair-splitting.

b. Things Do Not Shift

Accordingly, the first treatise begins with Sengzhao’s characterization of the commonplace perception of reality. Life, death, the seasons and all things seemingly rotate and change position in a continuous round of movement. In actual fact, however, no motion exists because the concept of motion presupposes a separation and distinction between things which does not ultimately obtain. Motion and its presumed opposite, rest, are nothing more than one and the same thing from the perspective of absolute truth (paramrthasatya).

Those who remain deceived, however, cannot comprehend their concurrence, giving rise to “quarrels and the drawing of distinctions. [Thus], the ancient pathways are overrun by lovers of difference.” The multiplication of conceptual distinctions and the resulting attachments to those differences generate a multitude of arguments among the unenlightened, hopelessly complicating the apprehension of the truth. If we neglect presenting the correct perspective, we merely “allow deceptive views about the nature of things to arise and then are unable to recover [the truth].” Sengzhao clearly has prapanca in mind when he criticized the lovers of difference, even though he never explicitly mentions it by name.

c. Non Absolute Emptiness

Similarly, Non-Absolute Emptiness begins with an eloquent description of the relationship between the enlightened sage’s wisdom and emptiness Apprehending the truth concerning the nature of emptiness, the sage engages the world while at the same time remaining unattached to its snares. Through his enlightened mind, he comprehends the absolute unity of all things in their suchness and deals with them accordingly. By way of contrast, the masses cannot possibly penetrate to the truth due to their reliance on ordinary understanding. As a result, numerous arguments arose concerning the nature of emptiness.

Conversations today all end up disagreeing when they arrive at the fundamentals of emptiness. Because they insist on disagreeing in order to come to some type of agreement, how will they ever settle anything? Hence, in their public quarrels they are unable to arrive at an understanding.

After describing three such misinterpretations of emptiness, Sengzhao underscores his contention that delusion arises through the compounding of things and names. Talk has done nothing but lead the masses to misapprehension and confusion, diverting them from the truth concerning the actual nature of things. Sengzhao therefore alludes to the co-dependent relationship between phenomenal things, naming, thought and reification.

A thing is a thing with reference to things, and so you might call it a thing; however, a thing which is a thing with reference to things is not [truly] a thing, even though we call it [a thing]. Hence, things are not identical with their names, which [do not] complete the thing’s actuality; names are not identical with the thing and are therefore incapable of leading one to the Ultimate.

The correct apprehension of the true nature of things lies completely outside of the morass of words and conceptualizations. Again, Sengzhao is not taking an anti-linguistic stance as such; he does not argue that language constitutes the root of all evil. However, he recognizes that we form our perceptions of the world based on the mind’s tendency to discriminate, distinguish and assign names to things presumed to possess own-being. His acknowledgement of language’s relative importance is reflected in the fact that despite its problems, he “cannot remain silent . . . [and f]or the time being . . . will utilize words . . . [in an attempt] to elucidate” the meaning of emptiness.

In the end, false conceptualizations are done away with and the arbitrariness of names established. Similes and metaphors function only to dislodge the mind from its discriminatory activity. For this reason, the sage engages the world of the phenomenal while remaining detached and identifies with the essential unity of the ultimate and mundane.

d. Prajn Is Without Dichotomizing Knowledge

Prajn (wisdom) is likewise undifferentiated from the One True Ultimate. With correct perception, the emptiness and subtlety of enlightened wisdom represents the culmination of all three vehicles. In ultimacy, neither distinction nor contradiction exists between the paths. Once again, however, “contentious arguments have recently led to confusion and differentiated theories” over the nature of prajn. The proliferation of prapanca has generated speculation that wisdom operates through discriminatory and dichotomizing knowledge. Therefore, Sengzhao feels compelled to dispel the falsehoods and illuminate the correct viewpoint.

After an introductory survey chronicling prajn’s arrival in China, the third treatise opens its substantive argument by depicting sagely wisdom as “subtle, its mysteries profound and [infinite depths] difficult to plumb. Markless and without conceptualization, it cannot be apprehended through either words or symbols.” In attempting to define it or use words to illustrate its nature, we inevitably dissect and create differentiations in regard to the sage’s mind and its functioning. Nevertheless, Sengzhao once again feels that he has no choice but to use words in discussing the matter.

e. Correspondence with Liu Yimin

Unfortunately, having committed description to the inadequacies of language, difficulties and new contentions arise when Sengzhao’s treatise arrives at Lushan. In his correspondence with Sengzhao, Liu Yimin, following his salutary remarks, acknowledges that while erudite, Sengzhao’s consignment of insight to the vagaries of language has produced disagreement and contention within the assembly.

To resign such a subtle principle to mere words is indeed dangerous; those who sing out in this manner find few who can comprehend. Those who cannot cut themselves off from clinging to manifested words and symbols will not grasp the meaning . . . [therefore] I wish to tell you of the doubts which your lofty treatise has raised in those seeking out differences in the mind of the sage.

Sengzhao responds by chastising Liu Yimin and his fellows for fixating on the mere form of words. Looking to the finger as though it were the moon, the scholar-monks at Lushan have equated the discriminative nature of concepts and words with the non-dual functioning of the sage’s mind:

Those participating in the discussions have become fixated on mere words. “In your investigation of the great space you search out the corners.” True understanding again lies outside the parameters of speech and conceptualization. You true gentlemen trained in the profound should know this teaching and understand.

One should abandon the search for the mere traces of truth and embrace the meaning behind the words. “Once one sets his mind to think about it, he begins to err; even more so if one attempts to use words.” Sengzhao advises the learned monks to desist from their reliance on the mundane perspective in favor of the non-dual apprehension of the enlightened.

f. Nirvna Is Without Conceptualization

Finally, in the case of Nirvna is Without Conceptualization, Sengzhao again defends orthodox teachings against those who would constrain the goal of final release to words and concepts. Misunderstanding the basic import of nirvna, the deluded believe it to be a substantive state, one to which they can attain while escaping the phenomenal world. Subtle and mysterious, the expansive, infinite void is unapproachable by the ordinary modes of sight and hearing, and therefore incomprehensible for the banal multitudes.

While the masses lack the capability to apprehend the nuances of nirvna, the philosophically minded have engaged in fruitless disputations which in the end have turned them against the very truth they sought. Inasmuch as they “care only for the words” describing the indescribable, they are “unable to comprehend superior thinking.” Hence, the purpose behind this treatise was to “silence the heretical discussions concerning that vast space.”

For those tied to words, the “one who does not name/conceptualize” [wu ming] proceeds to disabuse them of their views. As Sengzhao insists at the outset, while nirvna is unnameable and non-conceptual,

it is [nevertheless] spoken of as either having or lacking a remainder. These words surely only refer to the different signs of its emergence and remaining. They are simply false thought constructions applied to their corresponding manifestations.

Unattainable through either words or conceptualizations, nirvna consistently eludes reification. Seeking it by means of the worldly reduces the philosopher to stupidity, the rhetorician to silence and the materialists to despair. Accordingly,

the Buddha practiced silence while at Magadha; Vimalakrti refused to speak at Vaishli; Subhti taught the doctrine of no speech and Sakra, King of the Devas, heard nothing and yet it rained flowers.

Only when understood through the non-conceptualizing, non-grasping and non-discriminatory faculty of perfected wisdom does the soteriological take on its true character.

g. The Treatises as a Whole

Another important key to understanding Sengzhao’s thought lies in recognizing the pattern established between the Treatises and the logic inherent in their arrangement, a logic which ties the separate treatises together into a coherent demonstration of the path toward enlightenment. While never explicitly identified within the text itself, this design effectively discloses the logic of religious illumination and soteriological awakening. In following the development of the text itself, we can approximate Sengzhao’s vision concerning the path to enlightenment.

Through the emptying of emptiness, the text progressively moves the reader along a systematic presentation of the mutual relationships which ensue between the objects of cognition [Things Do Not Shift and Non-Absolute Emptiness], their subject [Prajn Is Without Dichotomous Knowing and The Correspondence with LiuYimin] and the ultimate result of correct perception into the nature of that relationship [Nirvna Is Without Conceptualization].

In following the text’s design, the reader is successively led through four interrelated steps:

  1. The realization that things are devoid of an intrinsic self and therefore empty;
  2. That the emptiness of things is not in itself an absolute to be grasped by the conceptualizing mind, in spite of the fact that it represents the ultimate perspective concerning the nature of all things;
  3. Although without graspable, and therefore obtainable, characteristics, emptiness can nevertheless be realized through the medium of perfect wisdom, representing the subject of a knowledge that goes beyond conceptualization and the subject/object duality;
  4. Inasmuch as wisdom illuminates emptiness, its knowing through non-knowing serves as the effective cause for the illumination of the non-conceptual, unnameable effect of the beginningless and endless nirvna.

As reflected within the text and already noted, Sengzhao and the early Chinese Buddhists recognize that conceptualization represents the principal obstacle facing the unenlightened. Fundamentally tied to the conception of an independently existing self, human beings consistently engage the world from the perspective of the ego, viewing the inner self as subject and all other things as objects. Granting existence to both self and others, we naturally create a disjuncture that results in clinging to some things while simultaneously rejecting others, unavoidably fueling the continued round of becoming. Breaking the cycle, for the Mdhyamika, begins with dislodging the mind’s attachment to logically absurd distinctions and its creation of erroneous oppositional categories such as existent/nonexistent, subject/object, nirvna/samsra.

In the final analysis, Mdhyamika sets out to demonstrate the logical absurdity of the cognitive process’ internal structure and the way it expresses itself verbally. In terms of the twelve links in the chain of becoming:

The root of cyclic existence is action.
Therefore the wise one does not act….
With the cessation of ignorance Action will not arise.
The cessation of ignorance occurs through Meditation and wisdom. (MMK XXVI.10-11)

To bring the proliferation of mental fabrications to an end is to put a stop to self-centered action and the refueling of samsra (the cycle of rebirth and suffering). Therefore, the mind represents the principal obstacle to full enlightenment while simultaneously possessing the greatest potential for attaining final release. Ngrjuna cites the Buddha in defense of his assertion that “the power of mind is greatest. By practicing the perfection of wisdom, [an aspirant] can shatter the great mound into tiny particles. . . . Insofar as the mind possesses none of the four qualities [form, scent, taste and density], its power is the greatest.” (Dazhi dulun 299c.5) Kumrajva likewise points to the mind as the root of human troubles and advocates a transcendence of all discursive thought.

[The Dazhi dulun] says that dissociation from all verbalism and quenching all workings of thought is termed the real-mark of all the dharmas. The real-mark of the dharmas is conventionally termed suchness, dharma-nature, and reality-limit. In this [suchness] even the not-existent-and-not-inexistent cannot be found, much less the existent and the inexistent. It is only because of fantasy-conceptions that each one has difficulties about existence and inexistence. If you will conform to the cessation-mark of the Buddha’s Dharma, then you will have no discursive fictions [prapanca]. If you figment fictions about existence and inexistence, then you depart from the Buddha’s Dharma. (Robinson 1978:184-185)

Sengzhao’s primary concern as a Mdhyamikan, therefore, revolves around the mind’s proclivity for naming and absolutizing. A natural operation of the “knowing” faculty, conceptualization functions through the cause and effect relationship of “knowing” arising as an effect generated by the “known” acting as cause. The known therefore function as the objects of knowledge’s knowing and so long as the objects are considered real or substantive, “knowing” represents the proper avenue for realizing the real. Activity and suffering arise as a result of conceptualization, which itself arises from mental fabrications located within the discriminative mind. Bringing to cessation the activity of the knowing mind represents the starting point for the self-realization of reality.

As Nishitani Keiji describes it, religion itself constitutes the “real self-awareness of reality,” by which he means that

our ability to perceive reality means that reality realizes (actualizes) itself in us; that this in turn is the only way that we can realize (appropriate through understanding) the fact that reality is so realizing itself in us; and that in so doing the self-realization of reality itself takes place. (Nishitani 1982:5)

In the end, Sengzhao and the Zhaolun take the reader full circle. Just as the mundane object of knowledge (things) is inherently empty, so too is the ultimate goal toward which things are striving. Unified in their emptiness, each is completely fulfilled and established in their home-ground. The sage has awakened to the wondrous mystery of self-realization, locating reality right where he stands. By following the design of the unified text, the reader can also attain to the attainable as Sengzhao gradually guides us through a thorough-going analysis of the factors of existence and core teachings of the Mdhyamika school.

Beginning with the establishment of the provisional nature of the myriad things and their inherent emptiness, Sengzhao systematically dismantles delusional conceptions concerning emptiness, wisdom and nirvna. In each case, the reliance on mental fabrications and reification of the inherently empty are shown to be logically inconsistent and therefore wrong-headed views about the nature of things as they truly are. Realizing through the power of wisdom and employment of skillful means that emptiness constitutes the true nature of all things, created as well as uncreated, the aspirant attains to the knowledge that ultimate reality is not an absolute lying outside the bounds of the phenomenal, but rather the absolute within the phenomenal. Immanent and yet inaccessible to the ordinary mind, only prajnpramit can bridge the chasm separating the common person from nirvna. Its use, however, within the context of and following the pattern established by the Zhaolun, will eventually end with the realization that

the one who follows after the Genuine becomes the same as the Genuine, while those who go after illusion become the same as illusion . . . [and] liberation exists in the midst of non-liberation.

5. References and Further Reading

  • Chang, Chung-yuan. “Nirvna is Nameless.” Journal of Chinese Philosophy 1 (1974): 247-274.
  • Cheng, Hsueh-li. “Zen and San-lun Mdhyamika Thought: Exploring the Theoretical Foundation of Zen Teachings and Practices.” Religious Studies 15 (1979): 343-363.
  • Cheng, Hsueh-li. “Motion and Rest in the Middle Treatises.” Journal of Chinese Philosophy 7 (1980): 229-244.
  • Cheng, Hsueh-li. “Truth and Logic in San-lun Mdhyamika Buddhism.” International Philosophical Quarterly 21 (1981): 261-276.
  • Cheng, Hsueh-li. Empty Logic: Mdhyamika Buddhism from Chinese Sources. New York: Philosophical Library, 1984; reprint ed., Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass, 1991.
  • Cleary, Thomas, and J.C. Cleary, trans. The Blue Cliff Records. Boulder, CO: Shambala, 1978.
  • Garfield, Jay L., trans. The Fundamental Wisdom of the Middle Way: Ngrjuna’s Mulamadhyamakakrik. New York: Oxford University Press, 1995.
  • Huntington, C. W. The Emptiness of Emptiness: An Introduction to Early Indian Mdhyamika. Honolulu: University of Hawaii Press, 1989.
  • Hurvitz, Leon, trans. “Wei Shou, Treatise on Buddhism and Taoism.” In Yun-kang: The Buddhist Cave Temples of the Fifth Centruy A.D. in North China, Vol. 16 (supplement), 25-103. Kyoto: Kyoto University, Institute of Humanistic Studies, 1956.
  • Ichimura, Shohei. “A Study on the Mdhyamika Method of Refutation and its Influence on Buddhist Logic.” Journal of the International Association of Buddhist Studies 4.1 (1981): 87-95.
  • Ichimura, Shohei. “A Determining Factor that Differentiated Indian and Chinese Mdhyamika Methods of Dialectic as Reductio-ad-absurdum and Paradoxical Argument Respectively.” Journal of Indian and Buddhist Studies 33 (March, 1985): 841-834.
  • Ichimura, Shohei. “On the Dialectical Meaning of Instantiation in terms of Maya-Drstanta in the Indian and Chinese Mdhyamikas.” Journal of Indian and Buddhist Studies 36.2 (March, 1988): 977-971.
  • Ichimura, Shohei. “On the Paradoxical Method of the Chinese Mdhyamika: Seng-chao and the Chao-lun Treatise.” Journal of Chinese Philosophy 19 (1992): 51-71.
  • Liebenthal, Walter. The Chao Lun: The Treatises of Seng-Chao. 2nd rev. ed. Hong Kong: Hong Kong University Press, 1968.
  • Liu, Ming-wood. “Seng-chao and the Mdhyamika Way of Refutation.” Journal of Chinese Philosophy 14 (1987): 97-110.
  • Liu, Ming-wood. Mdhyamaka Thought in China. Sinica Leidensia, Vol. XXX. Leiden: E.J. Brill, 1994.
  • Nishitani, Keiji. Religion and Nothingness. Trans. Jan Van Bragt. Berkeley: University of California Press, 1982.
  • Robinson, Richard H. “Mysticism and Logic in Seng-chao’s Thought.” Philosophy East and West 8.3-4 (1958-1959): 99-120.
  • Robinson, Richard H. Early Mdhyamika in India and China. New York: Samuel Weiser, 1965; reprint ed., Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass, 1978.
  • Sharf, Robert. Coming to Terms with Chinese Buddhism: A Reading of the Treasure Store Treatise. Honolulu: University of Hawaii, 2001.
  • Tsukamoto Zenry. A History of Early Chinese Buddhism: From Its Introduction to the Death of Hui-yüan. 2 vols. Trans. Leon Hurvitz. Tokyo, New York, San Francisco: Kodansha International, 1985.

Author Information

Jeffrey Dippmann
Central Washington University

Last updated: September 13, 2004 | Originally published: