Experiences of all kinds have a distinctive character, which marks them out as intrinsically different from states of consciousness such as thinking. A plausible view is that the difference should be accounted for by the fact that, in having an experience, the subject is somehow immediately aware of a range of phenomenal qualities. For example, in seeing, grasping and tasting an apple, the subject may be aware of a red and green spherical shape, a certain feeling of smoothness to touch, and a sweet sensation. Such phenomenal qualities are also immediately present in hallucinations. According to the sense-data theory, phenomenal qualities belong to items called “sense-data.” In having a perceptual experience the subject is directly aware of, or acquainted with, a sense-datum, even if the experience is illusory or hallucinatory. The sense-datum is an object immediately present in experience. It has the qualities it appears to have.
A controversial issue is whether sense-data have real, concrete existence. Depending upon the version of the sense-data theory adopted, sense-data may or may not be identical with aspects of external physical objects; they may or may not be entities that exist privately in the subject’s mind. Usually, however, sense-data are interpreted to be distinct from the external physical objects we perceive. The leading view, in so far as the notion is appealed to in current philosophy, is that an awareness of (or acquaintance with) sense-data somehow mediates the subject’s perception of mind-independent physical objects. The sense-datum is the bearer of the phenomenal qualities that the subject is immediately aware of.
Knowledge of sense-data has often been taken to be the foundation upon which all other knowledge of the world is based. For a variety of different reasons that will be explored below, the notion of sense-data is now widely held to give rise to a number of difficult, if not insurmountable, problems.
Table of Contents
- Motivations for Introducing Sense-Data
- The Precise Characterization of Sense-Data
- The Origins and Early Developments of the Idea of Sense-Data
- The Objections to Sense-Data
- The Deeper Issues Involved in the Idea of Sense-Data
- Responses to the Underlying Tensions
- Critical Realism
- References and Further Reading
Sense-data were originally introduced in order to account for a number of puzzling perceptual phenomena. Before we reflect upon the matter, we are inclined to take perception to be direct and straightforward. If I see an apple in front of me in broad daylight, the natural assumption is that the very apple I see is immediately present in my experience. In normal circumstances an object appears as it really is. I believe that the properties I am aware of in my experience, such as the roughly spherical shape, and red and green color, belong to the apple in front of me. There are, however, two main lines of argument that suggest matters are not quite as straightforward as common sense assumes:
The first general type of argument emphasizes epistemological considerations, and focuses on questions about whether our perceptually based claims about the world can be properly justified, and whether, through experience, we can arrive at any knowledge of the world that is beyond doubt. If our goal is to arrive at certain knowledge about the nature of the real world, then one suggestion, in line with empiricist views, is that we should begin with what is immediately given in experience. There are, however, difficulties attaching to the view that our perceptual experiences provide us with knowledge of a mind-independent physical world. It is suggested by advocates of sense-data (and others) that claims about the world that are based upon experience cannot be certain. The reason is that experience is not always a reliable guide to how things really are. Various perceptual phenomena raise prima facie puzzles about how our experiences can give us genuine knowledge of a mind-independent reality.
In perceptual illusions, by definition, some physical object is perceived, but the way an object appears to the perceiving subject is not how it really is. Thus in certain lighting conditions a red object can appear green; a straight stick, half immersed in water, will appear crooked; the whistle of an approaching train sounds a higher pitch than it really is. In hallucinations, there is no object at all present that is relevant to how things appear to a subject: someone who has taken drugs may seem to see a strange animal, when there are no animals present in the vicinity. In double vision, an object appears to be situated in more than one location relative to the subject. In most of these cases we are not usually deceived as to how things really are. However, the fact remains that in such cases things appear differently from the way they really are. These two puzzle cases—illusions and hallucinations–were often assumed to raise epistemological issues, about how we come to have knowledge about the world, and about whether we are justified in the perceptual judgments we make about the physical objects in our surroundings.
One motive, therefore, for introducing the notion of sense-data, involves the epistemic claim that there is a certainty attaching to propositions about experience, which propositions about the physical world are thought to lack. Under the influence of “the argument from illusion” (discussed further below in section 3), some writers argued that the phenomenal qualities that appear immediately to the subject in experience belong to items that are distinct from physical objects. These items are termed sense-data. Propositions about the sense-data immediately present in experience are supposed to have a certainty that other empirical propositions lack.
A second line of thought suggests that the fundamental problems connected with perceptual experience are metaphysical, and concern the proper analysis of what perceptual consciousness involves, and how our perceptual experiences are related to the physical objects and events that we perceive. Reflection upon common sense, and, in particular, upon scientific extensions of common-sense knowledge, raises complex issues concerning the relation between our experiences and the objective world we perceive. When we reflect upon perceptual experience from an external point of view, and think about what is going on when another person is perceiving, then it is natural to conceive of the process of perception as involving a series of distinct, causally related events. In considering a subject of some experiment on vision in a laboratory, we may be lead to distinguish between the fact that an object X is situated in front of the subject, and the inner experience E that the subject has, as a result of looking in the direction of X. This external perspective on perceptual experiences can suggest the thought that perception involves a number of stages, linking what is situated outside the subject by a causal chain of neurophysiological events to the culminating experience E, which perhaps supervenes on the subject’s brain state. We can combine this thought with the idea that an experience of exactly the same type could have been caused in an abnormal manner, without the object X being present – the subject could have had a hallucinatory experience of the same type, supervening upon the same kind of proximal brain state, but triggered by a quite different distal cause, such as, for example, the ingestion of a drug.
This way of considering perception, called by Valberg “The problematic reasoning,” suggests that what a person is immediately consciously aware of in experiencing an object is something logically distinct from that object (Valberg, 1992, ch. 1; see also Robinson, 1994, ch. 6; but compare Martin, 2004). This reasoning is not dependent upon any particular detailed set of scientific theories about perception. It arises at a very general level. But, as Locke appreciated (1690, Book II, Chapter 8), taken in connection with more specific scientific arguments about the intrinsic nature of objects, it can invite the further thought that the properties which the sciences attribute to physical things are very different in kind from the properties we are aware of in experience. For, it might be argued, the properties that science attributes to objects are either basically spatial in nature, or involve special forces and fields (such as electromagnetic phenomena) that we do not observe directly; hence they are distinct from many of the phenomenal qualities that we are immediately aware of. Finally, science tells us that there is a time-lag between the moment of the event at the start of the perceptual chain, when information about the state of a physical object is transmitted to the subject, and the event comprised by the subject experiencing that object. I can, in some sense, see a distant star, even though that star may have ceased to exist before I was born. Thus a second motive for introducing sense-data appeals to the alleged distinction between experiences and the physical objects we perceive. Experiences, on this view, are to be analyzed in terms of the immediate awareness of sense-data.
Both the above lines of thought are supported by some of the phenomenological considerations that relate to our first-person, subjective point of view. The claim that all sense-data belong to the same class of entities, and should collectively be distinguished from physical objects, is based in part upon the supposed fact that experiences of different kinds share a degree of intrinsic resemblance. It is possible for cases of veridical perception, perceptual illusion, and hallucination all to share a subjective similarity. From the standpoint of the subject, such situations are, at least on some occasions, phenomenologically indistinguishable from each other. So, for example, if a person is aware of something red and round, and it seems to them that they are seeing an apple, it is possible that they are actually seeing an apple, or that they are suffering from some illusion, either of a green apple, or of some other object; or they may simply be hallucinating an apple. There may therefore be no physical object situated in the subject’s environment possessing the properties that the subject seems to see. Nevertheless, it seems that the properties of redness and roundness are in some way immediately present to the subject’s experience, in a manner different from belief. On the sense-data view, the experienced properties of visual redness and roundness are attributed to an existing item, a sense-datum, of which the subject is immediately aware, irrespective of whether there exists some matching physical object in the surrounding environment. The postulation of sense-data as items in common to the various kinds of experiences that we can have, whatever their status, explains their subjective similarity.
Considerations such as these, although not always explicitly formulated, nor always clearly distinguished, have prompted the introduction of the notion of “sense-data.” The general idea is that we need first to get clear about precisely what is present in immediate experience whenever we perceive a physical object. We should analyze experience itself, before any assumptions about reality are brought into play.
Sense-data can be characterized as the immediate objects of the acts of sensory awareness that occur both in normal perception, and also in related phenomena such as illusion and hallucination. The central idea is that whenever I have an experience in which I perceive, or seem to perceive, a physical object, there is something immediately present to my consciousness. This “something” is a distinct object, a sense-datum that I am aware of, which actually has the qualities it appears to have. There is a mental act of awareness that involves a relation to a distinct object (Moore, 1903 and 1913). This act of awareness is sometimes also called an act of “acquaintance” or an act of “apprehension”. Sense-data entities, although often interpreted as non-physical, have real concrete existence; they are not like imaginary objects, such as unicorns, nor like abstract objects, such as propositions.
Suppose, for example, I see, in the ordinary sense of the term, a red apple in normal daylight. Traditionally it has been held that there is a small range of sensible qualities belonging to physical objects that I am aware of immediately, without drawing any inferences (Berkeley, 1713, First Dialogue). Thus, for example, it is held that in seeing the apple, I am immediately aware of its color and shape; in hearing a bell, I am immediately aware of a certain volume, pitch and timbre (or tonal quality) which lead me to believe that I am hearing a bell. Other such sensible qualities include tastes, odors and tangible qualities.
According to the sense-data view, these sensible qualities are in fact phenomenal qualities that belong to the sense-data somehow immediately present to conscious experience. Thus in seeing the apple, I am in fact immediately aware of a visual sense-datum of a certain roughly round shape and red color, which may or may not be identical with some entity in the surrounding world. If I hallucinate a ringing noise in my ear, there exists some sense-datum, a sound that I am immediately aware of. Sense-data can be characterized by a set of determinate qualities belonging to different quality spaces. Visual sense-data thus have color, and also spatial properties, of shape, position, and perhaps also of depth. Auditory sense-data have pitch, volume and timbre, and so on.
There has never been a single universally accepted account of what sense-data are supposed to be; rather, there are a number of closely related views, unified by a core conception. This core conception of a sense-datum is the idea of an object having real existence, which is related to the subject’s consciousness. By virtue of this relation the subject becomes aware that certain qualities are immediately present. This means that sense-data have the following basic characteristics:
|(a)||Sense-data have real existence – they are not like the intentional objects of thoughts and other propositional attitudes; that is, they are concrete (as opposed to abstract) items, and the manner of their existence takes a different form from the existence of the content of a person’s thought;|
|(b)||The subject’s act of awareness involves a unique and primitive kind of relation to the sense-datum: this relation is not one that can be further analyzed;|
|(c)||The sense-datum is an object that is distinct from the act of awareness of it;|
|(d)||Sense-data have the properties that they appear to have;|
|(e)||The act of awareness of a sense-datum is a kind of knowing, although it does not involve knowledge of a propositional kind;|
In addition, sense-data have often been claimed to have the following characteristics:
|(f)||Sense-data have determinate properties; for example, if a sense-datum is red, it will have a particular shade of red;|
|(g)||Sense-data are (usually) understood as private to each subject;|
|(h)||Sense-data are (usually) understood to be distinct from the physical objects we perceive.|
Of these, perhaps the most important – and problematic – claim is (e), the idea that being aware of a sense-datum involves some kind of knowledge of facts about the sense-datum (see Sellars, 1956, Part I). Sense-data were originally introduced as the “direct objects” of such acts of awareness as occur in perception and related experiences. Talk of “objects,” it should be noted, is ambiguous. In the sense intended, sense-data are entities that have real existence, of a non-abstract form. This means that sense-data are not like the objects of mental attitudes such as desire, belief, and fear. Such mental attitudes or states are said to have intentional objects, and in so far as the state is concerned, need not be about objects that actually exist. If I am hungry, and desire an apple, and believe incorrectly that there is an apple in the fridge, then although no physical apple exists in the relevant sense, my states are described in terms of what they represent, or are about. The apple, which I falsely believe to exist, in fact lacks real existence, and has only what is called “intentional in-existence,” by virtue of my representing it in my mistaken belief (see Brentano, 1874). But if I see or hallucinate an apple, then according to the sense-data view there is an actual red object of some kind – a sense-datum – that has real existence.
The acts by which the subject is related to sense-data are therefore not representational in the way that thoughts are. They do not have a structure analogous to that of purely intentional states such as desire and belief. So the sense-data theory holds that when the subject has a visual (auditory, and so forth) sensation, there is some real two-term relation of awareness or acquaintance that connects the presented sense-datum to the subject’s mind. The sense-datum is not an abstract object in the way that a proposition is. Nevertheless, this act of awareness is supposed to be, at the same time, a form of direct knowledge of the sense-datum object. It involves some kind of understanding on the subject’s part. Knowledge of the sense-datum is not inferred from any prior conscious state.
Although acts of awareness are mental events in the subject’s mind, the actual sense-datum itself is not a mental item in the way that a pain might be held to be something mental. According to the original formulations of the view, a sense-datum is distinct from the subject’s act of mind, and the subject only becomes aware of it by entering into the unique relation of awareness to it. The sense-datum is therefore not necessarily connected to the subject’s mind: in theory, the sense-datum could exist independently of the subject being aware of it (see below in section 3). Nevertheless, since the awareness of a sense-datum is supposed to be in some sense “immediate,” statements about sense-data have been variously claimed to be indubitable, infallible and incorrigible; there is, however, no settled view as to the status of such claims.
The classical conception of sense-data fits naturally with foundationalist theories of knowledge. Firstly, sense-data can play a role as the entities a subject has some kind of awareness of before arriving at beliefs about anything else: knowledge of sense-data is supposedly antecedent to knowledge of the physical world, and constitutes the justification for beliefs about the existence of physical things. Secondly, sense-data can, on this view, play a role in the empiricist explanation of how, in general, words acquire the meanings they have – the idea being that either words stand directly for properties of sense-data, or can be defined by reference to such words.
The expression “data of the senses” and its cognates gained currency towards the end of the nineteenth century, particularly in the work of William James (see, for example, James, 1897). The concept of sense-data was refined in the work of Bertrand Russell, and G. E. Moore, prominent amongst the philosophers of this period who appealed to the idea. The view harkens back to the theory of sensory ideas or impressions put forward in the work of empiricist philosophers such as Locke, Berkeley, and Hume. However, Moore’s seminal paper, “The Refutation of Idealism” (1903), which introduced the act-object model of sensing, may be seen as the origin of the essential features of the modern sense-data view. The notion was extensively appealed to in metaphysical and epistemological discussions throughout the first half of the twentieth century, for example in the work of Russell (1912 and 1918), Broad (1925), and Price (1932), and particularly in the works of Ayer (1940, 1956) and other positivistically inclined philosophers.
Since a sense-datum is logically independent of the act of awareness whereby the subject is conscious of it, it follows that sense-data can, in theory, exist outside of consciousness, without any subject being acquainted with them. The general class to which sense-data belong are known as Sensibilia or Sensibles. A sensible becomes a sense-datum by entering into a relation of awareness (or acquaintance) with the mind of a subject. This initial characterization leaves open the precise relation that holds between sense-data and physical objects. The category of sense-data, according to the original formulations of writers such as Russell, Moore and Price, is therefore introduced in an ontologically neutral way (see in particular Moore, 1913; Price, 1932; see also Bermudez, 2000; though compare Broad, 1925).
The answer to the question, “Do sense-data exist?” is therefore complex. Strictly speaking, the answer comprises two stages. In formal terms, if the act-object analysis of experience is correct, it follows from the fact that experiences occur that there are such things as sense-data. Sense-data are the objects, whatever their nature, that are immediately present in experience. Thus, originally, the term sense-data was introduced as a quasi-technical term to help clarify exactly what experience involves, so as to enable us to explore the various puzzling phenomena mentioned above. According to this original conception of sense-data, it is therefore an open question whether sense-data can be identified with physical objects, or their parts (for example, for visual sense-data, the facing surfaces). More usually, however, the question “Do sense-data exist?” is interpreted to mean, “In normal perception, are we aware of sense-data entities that are distinct from mind-independent physical objects?” Given the facts of illusion, and other kinds of perceptual error, it was held by most theorists that sense-data could not be directly identified with ordinary physical objects, conceived of according to common sense; nor, for the same reason, could they be identified with parts of ordinary objects (such as facing surfaces, and so forth).
For many early advocates of the concept, including both Moore and Russell, sense-data were indeed understood to be distinct from physical objects. This treatment of sense-data was bound up with an acceptance of the argument from illusion.
The argument from illusion can be briefly summarized as follows: supposedly, what I am aware of immediately is just how things appear to me. When I see a red physical object that seems green (perhaps because of unusual lighting conditions), some entity exists in the situation that actually is green; it is this green item that is immediately present to my consciousness. Because of the difference in their properties, it would seem to follow that we cannot identify the presented green entity with the red physical object. So what I am immediately aware of is some different entity, a sense-datum, and not a physical object. The existence of such sense-data entities can then be appealed to in order to account for the similarity between veridical and hallucinatory experiences.
A number of replies have been developed to the argument from illusion, and it was debated at great length during the twentieth century (and indeed the argument itself goes back at least as far as Berkeley). A proper appraisal is outside the scope of the present discussion (see in particular Ayer, 1940 and 1967; Austin, 1962; and, for a recent clear and detailed discussion, Smith, 2002). More recently, as noted in Section 1 above, some writers have concentrated upon the causal argument for the introduction of sense-data: this argument suggests that since hallucinatory experiences are in principle subjectively indistinguishable from veridical experiences, all experiences must involve an immediate awareness of entities that belong to the same common kind. There must be a “highest common factor” shared by all experiences. Since I could have a given type of experience – say, of seeming to see a red ball – while hallucinating when no such physical object is present in my surroundings, the common factor cannot include an external physical object. The common factor is therefore interpreted as an experience involving an awareness of sense-data, a special class of entities that are distinct from all external physical objects. For such reasons it can be suggested that in some way the awareness of sense-data is either equivalent to, or supervenes upon, the subject’s brain states alone. Even in veridical perception the subject immediately experiences sense-data that are distinct from the distal object perceived (Grice, 1961; Valberg, 1992; and Robinson, 1994).
If sense-data form a homogenous class of entities, and it is held that they can never be identified with the ordinary physical objects outside the subject’s body, then the question arises as to how in fact sense-data are related to the physical objects that we assume make up the external world. According to the Causal Theory of Perception (sometimes called the “Representative Theory,” or “Indirect Realism”) sense-data are caused by the physical objects that in some sense we perceive, perhaps indirectly, in our local surroundings. When I see an apple, that apple causes me to be immediately aware of a sense-datum of a red and green round shape, a sense-datum that roughly “corresponds” to the facing surface of the real physical apple. Some writers have objected to the Causal Theory on epistemic grounds. It has sometimes been claimed that physical objects are made unknowable on the causal account, or that demonstrative reference to physical objects would not be possible if the theory was correct (for discussion see Price, 1932; Armstrong, 1961; and Bermudez, 2000; but for replies to this criticism compare Grice, 1961, and Jackson, 1977).
Another possibility, explored particularly by Russell, was the metaphysical thesis that sense-data might be equated with the ultimate constituents of the world. If sense-data can be understood in this way, then both ordinary common-sense objects, and hallucinatory images, might be constructed from them; and possibly even the self might be a logical construction out of such entities. Under the influence of the theory developed by William James known as “Neutral Monism,” Russell analyzes a physical object such as a chair as a series of classes of sense-data; the self is also analyzed in a parallel way, as a distinct series of classes of sense-data, some of which include the sense-data that make up the chair (Russell, 1918, Lecture viii). (What this view means, very roughly, is that sense-data are taken to be the basic constituents of the world. Statements about selves, and about physical objects, are supposed to be definable in terms of statements about sense-data, in much the same way that it might be held that statements about nations might be defined in terms of statements about lands and inhabitants.)
Other writers put forward the related theory of phenomenalism, a view which was first developed in detail by John Stuart Mill, although it was in fact briefly canvassed by Berkeley (1710, sec 3). According to phenomenalism, physical objects are thought of as constructions out of actual and possible sense-data. That is, a statement asserting the existence of a given particular physical object, such as an apple in front of me, is supposed to be analyzable in terms of statements about the sense-data experiences I am currently having of the apple, or that I would have if I were to reach out and pick it up. To say that there is an apple unperceived in the fridge is to say something like: “If I were to open the door of the fridge and if my eyes were open, etc, I would have sense-data of a reddish, apple-like shape, and so forth.” The idea is that any statement that on the surface appears to be about a physical object can, by analogous methods, be translated into a set of statements which refer only to actual and possible sense-data, and do not refer to physical objects. But how to fill out the phenomenalist analysis in a more detail, so as to avoid any circularity (and to remove any appeal to the “et ceteras”) becomes problematic: in the example briefly sketched above, the analysis of the unperceived apple makes reference to the fridge door, and also to my own bodily states, and hence is incomplete (for a discussion see Chisholm, 1957; Urmson, 1956).
A different, though related approach to the question, put forward in various forms by Ayer, held that there was no genuine problem about the ontological status of sense-data and their relation to physical objects. We should instead regard the issue as a question of finding the most useful convention for discussing the various facts relating to perceptual phenomena. According to this view, acceptance of the sense-data theory amounts to a decision to employ a certain terminology, without deep consequences for metaphysics and epistemology. Provided suitable adjustments were made elsewhere in one’s system, any theory of perception could be adopted. Alternative theories “are, in fact what we should call alternative languages” (Ayer, 1940; similar ideas were mooted by Paul, 1936). Ayer’s own preferred language was in fact very close to the phenomenalist analysis sketched above.
The idea of sense-data came under attack from three general directions: (i) from phenomenologically based criticisms, drawing upon some of the findings of Gestalt psychology (for example, Merleau-Ponty, 1945; Firth, 1949/50); (ii) from anti-foundationalist views emanating from the philosophy of science, which denied a clear-cut distinction between observation and theory (for example, Hanson, 1958), and (iii) from the standpoint of ordinary language philosophy and epistemology (for example, in the powerful critique presented by Austin, 1962). As a result of these combined attacks, in the second half of the twentieth century the notion fell into disuse, despite some careful subsequent defences of the idea (see, for example: Ayer, 1967; Sprigge, 1970; and Jackson, 1977). Nevertheless, although explicit appeal to the notion has now largely been abandoned, the core conception still exerts a powerful influence upon our ways of thinking about perception in particular and epistemology in general.
Objections to the view that sense-data exist in a form that is different from the existence of ordinary physical objects have been advanced on a number grounds. These objections fall into three broad categories.
There is a central phenomenological objection to the idea of sense-data, which can be formulated in various ways. The basic contention is that the postulation of sense-data entities runs counter to ordinary perceptual experience. My immediate experience, when in the normal case I look around me, consists in the awareness of “full-bodied physical objects” (Merleau-Ponty, 1945; Firth, 1949; see also the discussion in Austin, 1962). First-person perceptual judgments are not mediated; I am not aware of making inferences from a subjective awareness of sense-data to the objective judgments I form about physical objects.
Perceptual experience is indeterminate. If I briefly see a speckled hen, I see that it has some speckles, but I am not aware of it as having a definite number of speckles. According to the sense-data view, the sense-datum of the hen I am aware of necessarily has the properties it appears to have. Hence the sense-datum of the hen has an indeterminate number of speckles. Yet if what I am aware of when I see the hen is a visual shape, an actual existing speckled sense-datum, then surely it must have a determinate number of speckles; this seems to lead to the contradiction in the properties that we attribute to the sense-datum (Barnes, 1944; but compare Jackson, 1977).
There are no clear-cut identity conditions for sense-data, and hence no principled grounds for answering such questions as, how many visual sense-data are present in my visual field? How long do they last? To this objection the sense-data theorist might well reply that in this respect sense-data are not logically worse off than many other kinds of entity; the identity conditions of ordinary physical objects are similarly not clear-cut (Jackson, 1977).
A further problem consists in saying where sense-data exist. Are they in some private space of which only the subject can be aware? Or do they exist in physical space? If the former, we need to explain how private subjective spaces are related to a common public space. If the latter, then we need to provide some account of how the properties of sense-data relate to those of the physical objects which are situated at the same location (Barnes, 1944).
Upholding the sense-data theory has sometimes been held to entail an acceptance of the idea of a “Private Language,” a view that Wittgenstein argued to be incoherent. Wittgenstein’s views on this question are not easy to interpret, and a full assessment of them is outside of the scope of this article. He was prepared to accept the existence of inner states and processes, provided they were connected with outer criteria (Wittgenstein, 1953, remark 580, and footnote to 149). Other passages (such as 1953, remarks 398-411) suggest that the real target of his criticism is the “act-object” model of experience. If Wittgenstein’s ideas are accepted, this would appear to show the incoherence any foundationalist conception of sense-data, in which knowledge of sense-data precedes, and serves as the basis for other forms of knowledge (see also Sellars, 1956 and 1963).
Perhaps the most fundamental of the objections to the coherence of the notion of sense-data concerns the unique “act-object” relation that is supposed to link the sense-datum to the subject’s consciousness. Crucially, the nature of this relation is left unexplained. Attempts to explain the relation, it is claimed, lead to a regress (Ryle, 1949, ch. 7; Kirk, 1994). This objection is discussed more fully below, in section 5c.
There is a general worry, originating in the work of Descartes and Locke, that the acceptance of entities equivalent to sense-data, when these are interpreted as distinct from physical objects, leads to problems in the theory of knowledge. If we are only aware of sense-data, and not of the physical objects themselves, how can we be sure that the properties of physical objects resemble those that appear to us? How can we even be sure that physical objects do exist? Isn’t the sense-data theorist saddled with a serious and insoluble sceptical problem about the external world? The acceptance of sense-data, it is argued, leads inevitably to idealism or scepticism. Such criticisms have been widely advanced, but it is not at all clear how cogent they are. On any theory of perception problems about the relation between appearance and reality can be raised; they do not attach only to the sense-data view (for some discussion, see: Armstrong, 1961; Jackson, 1977; Robinson, 1994; M. Williams, 1996).
Advocates of sense-data have produced many responses to these specific objections to sense-data. But no adequate assessment is possible without a proper examination of the underlying features of the original sense-datum theory, which give rise to the various difficulties listed. All the objections above trace back to deeper tensions arising from three central claims that form part of the original conception of sense-data. These are first summarized, before being subjected to a closer examination:
Claim 1: Sense-data form a homogenous class of entities, whose members can in principle exist independently of acts of awareness:
Claim 2: The awareness of a sense-datum is a sui generis act of awareness, involving a two-term real relation between an act of mind and a particular existent:
Claim 3: The awareness of a sense-datum is a form of sensory experience that somehow provides the subject directly with knowledge of facts about the sense-datum:
These three features of the sense-datum theory will be examined in turn.
Do all sense-data, defined merely as the objects of immediate awareness in veridical, illusory and hallucinatory experiences, belong to the same ontological category? This question leads to a number of further questions: How are sense-data related to physical objects? Are some of the sense-data that occur in ordinary veridical perception identical with the ordinary physical objects we perceive, or are they in all cases distinct from them? Can sense-data have properties of which the subject is not aware?
Assuming that we can make sense of the idea of acts of awareness, and that the formal notion of sense-data as the objects of such acts can be given a clear meaning, the precise ontological status of sense-data is a further issue, a matter of some debate. It should not be assumed without further argument that they constitute a homogenous class, and that, for example, the type of sense-datum present in a hallucination is of the same type as that present in the veridical experience of an external physical object. As we have noted, in the original formulations of the concept, sense-data are initially introduced in a neutral way – the idea being that their exact ontological status is a matter to be investigated. As a consequence of the adoption of the act-object conception of awareness, sense-data are held to be, in an important way, distinct from the subject’s mind. To the extent that a sense-datum is present to experience, and the subject is aware of that sense-datum as having a property F, it follows that the sense-datum must have that property F; but arguably it is possible that the sense-datum also has some other property G of which the subject is not aware (Moore, 1918; Ayer 1945; and Jackson, 1977). It is therefore possible that, in veridical perception, what the subject is immediately aware of is a sense-datum that is in fact identical with a physical object, whereas in hallucinations the sense-data present are non-physical items (Bermudez, 2000).
How can the nature of the relation involved between the act of awareness and the sense-datum be further characterized? How is the intrinsic nature of the subject’s experience (in so far as this involves the very act itself) related to the properties possessed by the existing sense-datum object? Should the sense-datum present in experience be understood as a particular entity, distinct from the act of awareness (or acquaintance), or should it be analyzed as an aspect of the character of the act?
One of the most serious objections raised against the whole notion of sense-data is that the nature of the relation between the subject’s conscious act of awareness and the sense-datum object is obscure, and cannot be coherently explicated. If the relation is modeled upon perceiving, then the view leads to an infinite regress. For suppose we try to analyze the situation where S sees some physical object X by the postulation of an additional entity, a sense-datum Y, such that in seeing X, S is directly aware of the sense-datum Y; suppose further, that the relation of direct awareness of a sense-datum is explained as similar to the relation of seeing an object; then by a like argument, in order to explain how S can be aware of the sense-datum Y, it seems that we must postulate a third entity Z, in order to account for the relation of S to Y, and so on ad infinitum. Of course, this regress can be blocked by denying that “awareness” (or “acquaintance”) is to be understood by analogy to perceiving, but this then leaves the nature of the awareness relation unexplained; all that can be said is that the relation of awareness is unanalyzable (Ryle, 1949; Kirk, 1994).
The problem here is exacerbated by the fact that such acts of awareness also have a peculiar metaphysical character that distinguishes them in general from other kinds of acts. Although the act is supposed to involve a two-term relation connecting two particulars, it also functions as a unique kind of “bridge” or link between consciousness and external items supposedly distinct from the mind. But it is hard to make sense of the claim that act and object are distinct entities. The act of awareness mysteriously “conveys” the phenomenal qualities of the object over to the conscious mind of the subject, making them present on the mental side of the relation, in the subject’s experience. It is not clear how any relation could play this role.
Connected with these problems is the issue of the status in the subject’s consciousness of the alleged acts of awareness. Moore himself drew attention to the fact that when I try to focus upon my act of awareness, all that I am aware of is the object of that act; I am not in any direct way conscious of the act itself. The act of awareness is supposed to be “transparent” or “diaphanous”: it is not something that is present in consciousness, when the subject is aware of its object. Introspection is of no help here, for even when I introspect I cannot discern anything other than the object I am aware of in having an act, the sense-datum. For example, when I see the oval petal of a blue flower, I am, supposedly, directly aware of a blue, oval shaped sense-datum. All that closer introspection of my consciousness reveals is just the very same blue oval shape that was there in the first place. So what grounds are there for saying that acts take place, acts that are distinct from their objects?
The act-object conception of the awareness of sense-data is also connected with a fundamental tension in the notion, concerning the extent to which the subject becomes aware of all and only the properties of the sense-datum. The tension is between the idea that the sense-datum has just those properties of which the subject is immediately aware of in being aware of the sense-datum, and the idea that there are further properties that belong to the sense-datum independently of whether the subject is aware of them. This tension leads to contradictory claims about the status of sense-data. Thus Russell held that sense-data are private to the subject (1914); more consistently, Moore held that it was an open question whether sense-data were private – this was not a feature of sense-data that followed automatically from the definition of the notion (1918). One attempt to avoid these various difficulties is the adverbial analysis of experience, discussed below in section 6b.
In what way does an act of awareness, whereby a sense-datum entity is experienced, involve knowledge of the particular sense-datum that is present? How is the phenomenal (or sensory) aspect of experience related to the employment of concepts when the subject attends to the sense-datum and is aware of it as belonging to a certain kind?
Arguably the most fundamental difficulty arising from the notion of sense-data is the extent, and manner, in which concepts are involved in the awareness of a sense-datum. As Sellars pointed out, in many writings on sense-data there was an equivocation between treating the awareness of sense-data as, (i) an extensional non-epistemic relation between the mind and an independent existing entity, or alternatively, (ii) as a form of knowing (see, in particular, Sellars, 1956). On the former view, being aware of a sense-datum is an extensional relation; the subject is related by awareness to a real entity that has concrete (as opposed to abstract) existence. On this view, being aware of a sense-datum is not a form of knowledge; it is more like a state of raw, unconceptualized sensation. The emphasis is simply upon the qualitative nature of phenomenal experience. But, on the alternative interpretation, the awareness of sense-data as a treated as a cognitive state or process, in which the mind attends to and grasps what is immediately before it, in a manner that somehow involves a classification into kinds. On this later epistemic view, the awareness of a sense-datum seems to require the exercise of concepts of at least a low-level kind.
Russell was happy to classify the direct awareness relation of the mind to a particular existing object as knowledge. This form of knowledge was not considered by Russell to be propositional, although it did involve attention (Russell, 1914). However, if the view is taken that all knowing involves classification, and hence the use of concepts, the issue is not so clear, as C. I. Lewis pointed out in presenting an alternative to the sense-data account, a neo-Kantian dual-component view of experience (Lewis, 1929). If the fact that something seems red to me is accounted for by my having knowledge by awareness of a red visual sense-datum, this suggests that I am aware of it as red, and this seems to require that I have the concept of redness. Equally, for a subject to attend to a particular entity suggests that the subject is able to single out that entity out by virtue of being aware of certain of its properties, which seems again to require the use of sortal concepts, so that the subject can conceive of the object as a unity.
According to Wilfrid Sellars (1956, Part I), the classical sense-data theorists’ conception of awareness (or acquaintance) is an amalgam of two different lines of thought: first, that there is some phenomenal or sensory aspect that distinguishes states of perceiving or seeming to perceive from states of merely believing or thinking, and second, that there are non-inferential knowings, knowings not based immediately on any particular prior beliefs, which operate as the foundation or evidence for all other empirical claims. In order to begin to clarify the distinct issues involved, Sellars holds that we need to distinguish more clearly between (a) the phenomenal or sensory aspects presented in experience, and (b) the concepts (perhaps of a low-level sort), inclinations to form beliefs, and other intentional aspects of experience.
These points about the distinction between the phenomenal and conceptual aspects of experience are connected with the interpretation of the awareness of a sense-datum as a two-place relation between act and object, albeit an act of a non-intentional kind connecting two existing relata. In some manner knowledge originates in, and is intimately tied up with the conceptual aspects of perceptual experiences. Having a perceptual experience usually leads to a “perceptual thought,” an intentional state. Yet this fact does not necessarily imply that the phenomenal aspect of perceptual experience should itself be analyzed on the model of intentional acts, such as thoughts about states of affairs. Many of the objections listed above, particularly those pertaining to the internal coherence of the notion, stem from the conflation of sensing and knowing – a “mongrel” conception, as Sellars describes it, in which phenomenal consciousness is equated directly with conceptual consciousness (Sellars, 1956, Part I).
A related issue is the problem of how the term “immediately” is to be understood in attempts to explicate the notion of sense-data. The term is sometimes understood in a psychological sense, as connected with how things appear from a subjective point of view. The idea is that sense-data may be viewed as “immediate objects” of perception, in the sense that awareness of them is not inferred from any belief, and that sense-data, as defined, have a fixed small set of qualities. But then it can be objected that the sense-data view is simply false to experience: what I am usually immediately aware of when I look at an apple is just the apple itself, and not a simply a patch of color with a certain shape (Heidegger, 1968; Firth, 1949, 1950; Valberg, 1993). It is the notion of there being an apple in front of me that springs immediately to my mind when I see it – my mind is occupied with concepts relating to the physical object framework. Discerning the actual complex pattern of color and shape given to me in experience is something that requires special training and attention. Similar criticisms affect the closely related attempts to introduce the notion of sense-data by appeal to ideas such as certainty or indubitability (Price, 1932).
If the awareness of sense-data in itself is not a conceptual or propositional state, the question of inference or otherwise does not arise. A perceptual belief about the kind of object experienced would simply be causally related to a prior state of phenomenal consciousness. So, for example, it might be claimed that the non-conceptual awareness of a sense-datum prompts the subject to form a thought about the kinds of properties they are experiencing. If, alternatively, awareness is construed as propositional in nature, then this seems to undermine the original conception of sense-data as accounting for the distinctive phenomenal, or sensory, aspects of experience.
Many of the major subsequent developments in the philosophical treatment of perceptual experience can be seen as attempts to grapple with the tensions in the original notions of sense-data. Different lines of thought have been developed, according to which particular problem has been considered most pressing. There are four important approaches to the question of how perceptual experience should be analyzed that are particularly worthy of note.
In recent times a number of philosophers have rejected the homogeneity assumption. They argue that there is no single common type of presented entity in veridical, illusory and hallucinatory experiences. A claim of the form: “It looks to subject S as if there is an F present…” can be made true by virtue of two quite different situations. The objects that perceiving subjects are immediately acquainted with in normal veridical perception are just the very physical objects that common sense tells us exist. There are no other entities involved as perceptual intermediaries. In other kinds of case, such as hallucinations, and possibly also illusions, there may be non-physical entities present in consciousness that are in some sense qualitatively similar to physical objects, but this subjective fact does not mean that there is a deeper similarity at the ontological level. In refusing to allow any role for perceptual intermediaries in the normal case, this view amounts to the general theory of perception known as Direct Realism: veridical perception is understood to comprise a direct relation of awareness between a conscious subject and an object or feature of the external physical world. The perceptual experience of a physical object is a “simple relation” holding between subject and object (see, for example, Barnes 1940; Dretske, 1969; and Campbell, 2002). In virtue of its denial of a “highest common factor” shared by different kinds of experiences (see above, section 3d), Direct Realism has also been described as a form of “Disjunctivism,” although this latter term can have other connotations in connection with theories of perception (see Snowdon, 1980; and also Martin, 2002).
Direct Realism involves a rejection of the Causal Theory of Perception, where the latter theory is understood as attempting to reductively analyze perceiving into separate components, involving an experience that is logically distinct from (though causally related to) the object perceived. The Direct Realist view, however, still encounters the remaining two problems for the sense-datum theory highlighted above. In particular, clarification is required of nature of the non-causal simple relation of awareness that holds in the normal perceptual case. How does an external physical object, by virtue of causally connecting with the subject’s sensory systems, come to stand in a relation to the subject’s consciousness, in such a manner that the perceiver is made immediately aware of phenomenal qualities belonging to that object? In the absence of a positive account, the simple perceiving relation remains obscure, and the grounds for introducing it are unclear (Coates, 1998 and 2007). A further problem for this view is to make sense of the phenomenal or sensory similarity between the entities that occur in hallucinations and the objects that we are aware of in illusions and ordinary perception. We need to account for the fact that the sense-data which occur in hallucinations have phenomenal qualities that resemble those which occur in the direct perception of the sensible properties of physical objects. This problem becomes the more acute, to the extent that a scientific conception of objects and their properties is accepted.
In an attempt to avoid the difficulty in providing a satisfactory explication of the nature of the awareness relation, it has been argued that appearances should be should be construed “adverbially” as states of the perceiving subject, rather than as involving a two-place relation (Ducasse, 1952; Chisholm, 1957). According to this view, it is more perspicuous to analyze certain types of statements, statements apparently about sense-datum particular entities and their properties, as implicit claims about the manner in which a subject experiences or senses. The relational interpretation of appearances should be abandoned.
According to this account, the awareness of an appearance of a certain kind should be modeled on the awareness of pains – pains are not distinct from experience, they are properties of experience. Whereas Moore held that, in seeing a red rose, the subject is acquainted with a red sense-datum that is distinct from the subject’s act of consciousness, on the adverbial view the sensation of red is construed as a state of the subject’s consciousness.
So a claim such as:
(a) S is aware of a red visual sense-datum
is to be analyzed by:
(b) S visually senses redly.
The idea is that (b) reveals more perspicuously the underlying logical form of the original claim (a).
As sketched out in this simple model, however, the proposed analysis is clearly defective. For we need to account for the way that more complex patterns of appearances are to be analyzed.
(c) S seems to see one object that is red and round and another distinct object that is blue and square.
For the sense-data theorist, there would be two sense-data involved, corresponding to the two objects apparently seen, with analogous properties; thus (c) would be analyzed along the lines of:
(d) S is aware of one sense-datum x that is red and round, and another sense-datum y that is blue and square.
But the simple adverbial view is unable to solve the problem of what “binds” the apparent properties together in the complex appearance presented to the subject. The only analysis forthcoming is:
(e) S visually senses redly and roundly and bluely and squarely
yet analysis (e) fails to distinguish between the initial appearance (c) above, and the quite different overall appearance, where the links between the properties are changed:
(f) S seems to see one object which is red and square and another object that is blue and round
Hence the adverbial view must at a minimum allow a subdivision of the contents of the subject’s mind into distinct states of sensing (Jackson, 1977; see also W. Sellars, 1982). So (c) now becomes analyzed as involving a state1 of sensing redly and roundly, and a distinct state 2 of sensing bluely and squarely. State 1 and state 2 should be construed as different aspects of a single subject, or as co-constituents in the subject’s mind. However, in whatever precise form the adverbial view is developed, it still leaves unresolved the issue of the way in which concepts are involved in perceptual experience.
One other important development that took place towards the end of the twentieth century concerned what has become known variously as the representationalist view of experience, or as the intentional view (or intentionalism). This amounts to interpreting experience as a unitary representational state; seeing, hearing, etc, are fully intentional states whose structures in some way parallel that of thinking and desiring. The acts of awareness or sensing are interpreted no longer as involving relations to non-abstract existing entities, but are instead understood as involving special attitudes towards states of affairs that may or may not exist.
One extreme reductive version of this view was put forward by D. Armstrong (1961), who tried to analyze perceiving purely in terms of the acquisition of beliefs and inclinations to believe. An alternative non-reductive version was advanced originally by Anscombe (1965), and has been taken up in various forms subsequently by a number of writers. On this version, the phenomenal content of perceptual experience is distinguished from the intentional content of thoughts and beliefs, but is still understood to be intrinsically representational. For Anscombe, and others who adopt this view, experiences represent facts in a special sensory manner. A question such as, “What did the subject see?” can be interpreted either extensionally, as asking about the actual physical object seen – the material object – or intensionaly, as concerned with the way in which things looked to the subject. When we describe how things look to the subject, we characterize the content of the perceptual experience by reference to the subject’s viewpoint, and such descriptions need not be true of the material object, which is physically present in front of the perceiver. So the descriptions involved give the intentional object of sensation, but need not refer to any actual existing item. The intentional object of sensation has no more reality than the fictional object of thought that is involved in my thought about “Zeus.” Something like this intentionalist interpretation of experience has been associated with an alternative form of Disjunctivism (McDowell, 1982, 1986 and 1998; Snowdon, 1980; Harman, 1990, and many other authors).
A major problem for this view is to give a satisfactory account of the difference between the content of an experience such as: “seeming to see that there is something white nearby,” and the parallel thought: “thinking that there is something white nearby,” which has the same intentional content, describable in identical terms. I can seem to see that there is something white in front of me, and I can think that there is something white in front of me; when I compare the two states, I am subjectively aware that there is a vivid difference in my consciousness, even though I am representing the same states of affairs. If experiences and thoughts can have completely matching contents, there must be some further, independent feature of my consciousness in virtue of which they differ. It is not clear whether the representational view really does justice to the way in which experiences involve phenomenal or sensory qualities actually present in consciousness.
Some writers claim that the representational content of experience is non-conceptual, meaning that the subject need not exercise the concepts necessary to characterize the experiences they have (Tye, 1995 and 2000). There is an important ambiguity here in the term “non-conceptual.” This can be understood in something like functional terms, as relating to the way such states guide primitive or semi-automatic actions in creatures lacking fully conceptual states – in which case a nonconceptual state can be distinct from the phenomenal character of experience, and cannot help to explain the nature of the later. Alternatively, “non-conceptual” can be understood as relating to phenomenal consciousness, the feature that makes the difference between mere thought and experience. But then it is of no help simply to be told that this feature is representational in a nonconceptual sense – we are still stuck with the problem that the representational contents of experience and thought can in some cases match, and what has to be explained is the nature of the difference between them. We require an account of the difference between the way that perceptual content represents and mere thought represents. It is arguable that the difference between them involves some intrinsic phenomenal aspect of consciousness, something actually present in experience that has more reality than a merely fictional object like “Zeus.” As Geach notes, sensations have formal as well as representational properties (Geach, 1957, section 28). It is not clear that the parallel between perceptual experience and thought has been successfully made out on the intentionalist view (compare also Martin 2002).
A final possibility that has been canvassed is some form of dual-component analysis of perceptual consciousness, which attempts to do justice to both the phenomenal (or sensory) aspects, and also the conceptual aspects involved in experience. Perceptual experience is analyzed as involving two quite different components: an intentional component involving the representation of the subject’s surrounding environment through the exercise of classificatory concepts (perhaps of a low-level kind), and a further non-intentional and non-conceptual phenomenal state, in virtue of which phenomenal qualities are made present in the subject’s experience. Although the phenomenal non-conceptual component is not understood as intrinsically representational in the way that a thought is, it can still be treated as in a weak sense representational; that is, the different aspects of the phenomenal component of experience can still be described as carrying informational content about those features of the environment that normally cause them to arise in the subject’s experience, and are thus identified by reference to physical states of affairs.
A dual component view can take many different forms. Indeed, acceptance of it is implicit on some versions of direct and naïve realism. But of course it can also be combined with versions of the Causal Theory of Perception, in which the subject’s whole experience is held to be in an important sense distinct from the object perceived. One leading exponent of this view was Wilfrid Sellars, who developed the Critical Realist view originally put forward by the group that included his father Roy Wood Sellars, G. Santayana, and A. O. Lovejoy (for the original statement of Critical Realism, see Drake (ed.), 1920). Sense-data are re-interpreted as phenomenal or sensory states of the subject; but this aspect is no longer analyzed as having an act-object form. Sense-data awareness is replaced by a type of one-place sensing state, a constituent or aspect of the subject’s mind, and such awareness does not involve a real relation between an act and a distinct object. This sensing (or phenomenal) state causally prompts a perceptual thought (or a “perceptual taking,” involving low level classification), which is an intentional state, directed on to objects in the external world. The experience as a whole – involving a phenomenal state, and also the exercise of concepts – is causally related to the physical object perceived (W. Sellars, 1956, 1977, 1982).
The distinctive feature of the critical realist account is the claim that the phenomenal aspect of experience guides perceptual thoughts directly about the objects perceived; importantly, such perceptual thoughts are not in normal cases of perception focused on the phenomenal state – they refer directly to the physical objects we think we see in our surroundings. In seeing an apple, I sense in a red and round manner, and this guides my perceptual thought that there is an apple in front of me. On this analysis of perception, the sense-data theorist is viewed as guilty of a psychological error, as well as a philosophical one: we do not form perceptual thoughts directly about our own subjective phenomenal states. Entities with some of the characteristics traditionally attributed to sense-data are held to exist in experience, but they should not to be identified with the objects of perception.
Sellars’ own view was originally formulated in the context of a complex overall account of the nature of language and the way in which we come to refer to mental states such as thought and sensing, and underwent important developments in later work. But an acceptance of something like the central Critical Realist thought can be seen in the work of many recent writers on perception (including, for example, Grice, 1961; Mackie, 1976; Millar 1991; and Lowe, 1992). One problem for the Critical Realist view consists in reconciling the duality of experience posited by the account with the phenomenological sense that there is a unity in experience. A second problem lies in showing how the subject’s perceptual judgments succeed in referring to objects that are not immediately present in consciousness.
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Last updated: June 6, 2007 | Originally published: June/6/2007
Categories: Mind & Cognitive Science