Among the many topics explored by the philosophy of sexuality are procreation, contraception, celibacy, marriage, adultery, casual sex, flirting, prostitution, homosexuality, masturbation, seduction, rape, sexual harassment, sadomasochism, pornography, bestiality, and pedophilia. What do all these things have in common? All are related in various ways to the vast domain of human sexuality. That is, they are related, on the one hand, to the human desires and activities that involve the search for and attainment of sexual pleasure or satisfaction and, on the other hand, to the human desires and activities that involve the creation of new human beings. For it is a natural feature of human beings that certain sorts of behaviors and certain bodily organs are and can be employed either for pleasure or for reproduction, or for both.
The philosophy of sexuality explores these topics both conceptually and normatively. Conceptual analysis is carried out in the philosophy of sexuality in order to clarify the fundamental notions of sexual desire and sexual activity. Conceptual analysis is also carried out in attempting to arrive at satisfactory definitions of adultery, prostitution, rape, pornography, and so forth. Conceptual analysis (for example: what are the distinctive features of a desire that make it sexual desire instead of something else? In what ways does seduction differ from nonviolent rape?) is often difficult and seemingly picky, but proves rewarding in unanticipated and surprising ways.
Normative philosophy of sexuality inquires about the value of sexual activity and sexual pleasure and of the various forms they take. Thus the philosophy of sexuality is concerned with the perennial questions of sexual morality and constitutes a large branch of applied ethics. Normative philosophy of sexuality investigates what contribution is made to the good or virtuous life by sexuality, and tries to determine what moral obligations we have to refrain from performing certain sexual acts and what moral permissions we have to engage in others.
Some philosophers of sexuality carry out conceptual analysis and the study of sexual ethics separately. They believe that it is one thing to define a sexual phenomenon (such as rape or adultery) and quite another thing to evaluate it. Other philosophers of sexuality believe that a robust distinction between defining a sexual phenomenon and arriving at moral evaluations of it cannot be made, that analyses of sexual concepts and moral evaluations of sexual acts influence each other. Whether there actually is a tidy distinction between values and morals, on the one hand, and natural, social, or conceptual facts, on the other hand, is one of those fascinating, endlessly debated issues in philosophy, and is not limited to the philosophy of sexuality.
Our moral evaluations of sexual activity are bound to be affected by what we view the nature of the sexual impulse, or of sexual desire, to be in human beings. In this regard there is a deep divide between those philosophers that we might call the metaphysical sexual optimists and those we might call the metaphysical sexual pessimists.
The pessimists in the philosophy of sexuality, such as St. Augustine, Immanuel Kant, and, sometimes, Sigmund Freud, perceive the sexual impulse and acting on it to be something nearly always, if not necessarily, unbefitting the dignity of the human person; they see the essence and the results of the drive to be incompatible with more significant and lofty goals and aspirations of human existence; they fear that the power and demands of the sexual impulse make it a danger to harmonious civilized life; and they find in sexuality a severe threat not only to our proper relations with, and our moral treatment of, other persons, but also equally a threat to our own humanity.
On the other side of the divide are the metaphysical sexual optimists (Plato, in some of his works, sometimes Sigmund Freud, Bertrand Russell, and many contemporary philosophers) who perceive nothing especially obnoxious in the sexual impulse. They view human sexuality as just another and mostly innocuous dimension of our existence as embodied or animal-like creatures; they judge that sexuality, which in some measure has been given to us by evolution, cannot but be conducive to our well-being without detracting from our intellectual propensities; and they praise rather than fear the power of an impulse that can lift us to various high forms of happiness.
The particular sort of metaphysics of sex one believes will influence one’s subsequent judgments about the value and role of sexuality in the good or virtuous life and about what sexual activities are morally wrong and which ones are morally permissible. Let’s explore some of these implications.
An extended version of metaphysical pessimism might make the following claims: In virtue of the nature of sexual desire, a person who sexually desires another person objectifies that other person, both before and during sexual activity. Sex, says Kant, “makes of the loved person an Object of appetite. . . . Taken by itself it is a degradation of human nature” (Lectures on Ethics, p. 163). Certain types of manipulation and deception seem required prior to engaging in sex with another person, or are so common as to appear part of the nature of the sexual experience. As Bernard Baumrim makes the point, “sexual interaction is essentially manipulative—physically, psychologically, emotionally, and even intellectually” (“Sexual Immorality Delineated,” p. 300). We go out of our way, for example, to make ourselves look more attractive and desirable to the other person than we really are, and we go to great lengths to conceal our defects. And when one person sexually desires another, the other person’s body, his or her lips, thighs, toes, and buttocks are desired as the arousing parts they are, distinct from the person. The other’s genitals, too, are the object of our attention: “sexuality is not an inclination which one human being has for another as such, but is an inclination for the sex of another. . . . [O]nly her sex is the object of his desires” (Kant, Lectures, p. 164).
Further, the sexual act itself is peculiar, with its uncontrollable arousal, involuntary jerkings, and its yearning to master and consume the other person’s body. During the act, a person both loses control of himself and loses regard for the humanity of the other. Our sexuality is a threat to the other’s personhood; but the one who is in the grip of desire is also on the verge of losing his or her personhood. The one who desires depends on the whims of another person to gain satisfaction, and becomes as a result a jellyfish, susceptible to the demands and manipulations of the other: “In desire you are compromised in the eyes of the object of desire, since you have displayed that you have designs which are vulnerable to his intentions” (Roger Scruton, Sexual Desire, p. 82). A person who proposes an irresistible sexual offer to another person may be exploiting someone made weak by sexual desire (see Virginia Held, “Coercion and Coercive Offers,” p. 58).
Moreover, a person who gives in to another’s sexual desire makes a tool of himself or herself. “For the natural use that one sex makes of the other’s sexual organs is enjoyment, for which one gives oneself up to the other. In this act a human being makes himself into a thing, which conflicts with the right of humanity in his own person” (Kant, Metaphysics of Morals, p. 62). Those engaged in sexual activity make themselves willingly into objects for each other merely for the sake of sexual pleasure. Hence both persons are reduced to the animal level. “If . . . a man wishes to satisfy his desire, and a woman hers, they stimulate each other’s desire; their inclinations meet, but their object is not human nature but sex, and each of them dishonours the human nature of the other. They make of humanity an instrument for the satisfaction of their lusts and inclinations, and dishonour it by placing it on a level with animal nature” (Kant, Lectures, p. 164).
Finally, due to the insistent nature of the sexual impulse, once things get going it is often hard to stop them in their tracks, and as a result we often end up doing things sexually that we had never planned or wanted to do. Sexual desire is also powerfully inelastic, one of the passions most likely to challenge reason, compelling us to seek satisfaction even when doing so involves dark-alley gropings, microbiologically filthy acts, slinking around the White House, or getting married impetuously.
Given such a pessimistic metaphysics of human sexuality, one might well conclude that acting on the sexual impulse is always morally wrong. That might, indeed, be precisely the right conclusion to draw, even if it implies the end of Homo sapiens. (This doomsday result is also implied by St. Paul’s praising, in 1 Corinthians 7, sexual celibacy as the ideal spiritual state.) More frequently, however, the pessimistic metaphysicians of sexuality conclude that sexual activity is morally permissible only within marriage (of the lifelong, monogamous, heterosexual sort) and only for the purpose of procreation. Regarding the bodily activities that both lead to procreation and produce sexual pleasure, it is their procreative potential that is singularly significant and bestows value on these activities; seeking pleasure is an impediment to morally virtuous sexuality, and is something that should not be undertaken deliberately or for its own sake. Sexual pleasure at most has instrumental value, in inducing us to engage in an act that has procreation as its primary purpose. Such views are common among Christian thinkers, for example, St. Augustine: “A man turns to good use the evil of concupiscence, and is not overcome by it, when he bridles and restrains its rage . . . and never relaxes his hold upon it except when intent on offspring, and then controls and applies it to the carnal generation of children . . . , not to the subjection of the spirit to the flesh in a sordid servitude” (On Marriage and Concupiscence, bk. 1, ch. 9).
Metaphysical sexual optimists suppose that sexuality is a bonding mechanism that naturally and happily joins people together both sexually and nonsexually. Sexual activity involves pleasing the self and the other at the same time, and these exchanges of pleasure generate both gratitude and affection, which in turn are bound to deepen human relationships and make them more emotionally substantial. Further, and this is the most important point, sexual pleasure is, for a metaphysical optimist, a valuable thing in its own right, something to be cherished and promoted because it has intrinsic and not merely instrumental value. Hence the pursuit of sexual pleasure does not require much intricate justification; sexual activity surely need not be confined to marriage or directed at procreation. The good and virtuous life, while including much else, can also include a wide variety and extent of sexual relations. (See Russell Vannoy’s spirited defense of the value of sexual activity for its own sake, in Sex Without Love.)
Irving Singer is a contemporary philosopher of sexuality who expresses well one form of metaphysical optimism: “For though sexual interest resembles an appetite in some respects, it differs from hunger or thirst in being an interpersonal sensitivity, one that enables us to delight in the mind and character of other persons as well as in their flesh. Though at times people may be used as sexual objects and cast aside once their utility has been exhausted, this is no[t] . . . definitive of sexual desire. . . . By awakening us to the living presence of someone else, sexuality can enable us to treat this other being as just the person he or she happens to be. . . . There is nothing in the nature of sexuality as such that necessarily . . . reduces persons to things. On the contrary, sex may be seen as an instinctual agency by which persons respond to one another through their bodies” (The Nature of Love, vol. 2, p. 382. See also Jean Hampton, “Defining Wrong and Defining Rape”).
Pausanias, in Plato’s Symposium (181a-3, 183e, 184d), asserts that sexuality in itself is neither good nor bad. He recognizes, as a result, that there can be morally bad and morally good sexual activity, and proposes a corresponding distinction between what he calls “vulgar” eros and “heavenly” eros. A person who has vulgar eros is one who experiences promiscuous sexual desire, has a lust that can be satisfied by any partner, and selfishly seeks only for himself or herself the pleasures of sexual activity. By contrast, a person who has heavenly eros experiences a sexual desire that attaches to a particular person; he or she is as much interested in the other person’s personality and well-being as he or she is concerned to have physical contact with and sexual satisfaction by means of the other person. A similar distinction between sexuality per se and eros is described by C. S. Lewis in his The Four Loves (chapter 5), and it is perhaps what Allan Bloom has in mind when he writes, “Animals have sex and human beings have eros, and no accurate science [or philosophy] is possible without making this distinction” (Love and Friendship, p. 19).
The divide between metaphysical optimists and metaphysical pessimists might, then, be put this way: metaphysical pessimists think that sexuality, unless it is rigorously constrained by social norms that have become internalized, will tend to be governed by vulgar eros, while metaphysical optimists think that sexuality, by itself, does not lead to or become vulgar, that by its nature it can easily be and often is heavenly. (See the entry, Philosophy of Love.)
Of course, we can and often do evaluate sexual activity morally: we inquire whether a sexual act—either a particular occurrence of a sexual act (the act we are doing or want to do right now) or a type of sexual act (say, all instances of homosexual fellatio)—is morally good or morally bad. More specifically, we evaluate, or judge, sexual acts to be morally obligatory, morally permissible, morally supererogatory, or morally wrong. For example: a spouse might have a moral obligation to engage in sex with the other spouse; it might be morally permissible for married couples to employ contraception while engaging in coitus; one person’s agreeing to have sexual relations with another person when the former has no sexual desire of his or her own but does want to please the latter might be an act of supererogation; and rape and incest are commonly thought to be morally wrong.
Note that if a specific type of sexual act is morally wrong (say, homosexual fellatio), then every instance of that type of act will be morally wrong. However, from the fact that the particular sexual act we are now doing or contemplate doing is morally wrong, it does not follow that any specific type of act is morally wrong; the sexual act that we are contemplating might be wrong for lots of different reasons having nothing to do with the type of sexual act that it is. For example, suppose we are engaging in heterosexual coitus (or anything else), and that this particular act is wrong because it is adulterous. The wrongfulness of our sexual activity does not imply that heterosexual coitus in general (or anything else), as a type of sexual act, is morally wrong. In some cases, of course, a particular sexual act will be wrong for several reasons: not only is it wrong because it is of a specific type (say, it is an instance of homosexual fellatio), but it is also wrong because at least one of the participants is married to someone else (it is wrong also because it is adulterous).
We can also evaluate sexual activity (again, either a particular occurrence of a sexual act or a specific type of sexual activity) nonmorally: nonmorally “good” sex is sexual activity that provides pleasure to the participants or is physically or emotionally satisfying, while nonmorally “bad” sex is unexciting, tedious, boring, unenjoyable, or even unpleasant. An analogy will clarify the difference between morally evaluating something as good or bad and nonmorally evaluating it as good or bad. This radio on my desk is a good radio, in the nonmoral sense, because it does for me what I expect from a radio: it consistently provides clear tones. If, instead, the radio hissed and cackled most of the time, it would be a bad radio, nonmorally-speaking, and it would be senseless for me to blame the radio for its faults and threaten it with a trip to hell if it did not improve its behavior. Similarly, sexual activity can be nonmorally good if it provides for us what we expect sexual activity to provide, which is usually sexual pleasure, and this fact has no necessary moral implications..
It is not difficult to see that the fact that a sexual activity is perfectly nonmorally good, by abundantly satisfying both persons, does not mean by itself that the act is morally good: some adulterous sexual activity might well be very pleasing to the participants, yet be morally wrong. Further, the fact that a sexual activity is nonmorally bad, that is, does not produce pleasure for the persons engaged in it, does not by itself mean that the act is morally bad. Unpleasant sexual activity might occur between persons who have little experience engaging in sexual activity (they do not yet know how to do sexual things, or have not yet learned what their likes and dislikes are), but their failure to provide pleasure for each other does not mean by itself that they perform morally wrongful acts.
Thus the moral evaluation of sexual activity is a distinct enterprise from the nonmoral evaluation of sexual activity, even if there do remain important connections between them. For example, the fact that a sexual act provides pleasure to both participants, and is thereby nonmorally good, might be taken as a strong, but only prima facie good, reason for thinking that the act is morally good or at least has some degree of moral value. Indeed, utilitarians such as Jeremy Bentham and even John Stuart Mill might claim that, in general, the nonmoral goodness of sexual activity goes a long way toward justifying it. Another example: if one person never attempts to provide sexual pleasure to his or her partner, but selfishly insists on experiencing only his or her own pleasure, then that person’s contribution to their sexual activity is morally suspicious or objectionable. But that judgment rests not simply on the fact that he or she did not provide pleasure for the other person, that is, on the fact that the sexual activity was for the other person nonmorally bad. The moral judgment rests, more precisely, on his or her motives for not providing any pleasure, for not making the experience nonmorally good for the other person.
It is one thing to point out that as evaluative categories, moral goodness/badness is quite distinct from nonmoral goodness/badness. It is another thing to wonder, nonetheless, about the emotional or psychological connections between the moral quality of sexual activity and its nonmoral quality. Perhaps morally good sexual activity tends also to be the most satisfying sexual activity, in the nonmoral sense. Whether that is true likely depends on what we mean by “morally good” sexuality and on certain features of human moral psychology. What would our lives be like, if there were always a neat correspondence between the moral quality of a sexual act and its nonmoral quality? I am not sure what such a human sexual world would be like. But examples that violate such a neat correspondence are at the present time, in this world, easy to come by. A sexual act might be both morally and nonmorally good: consider the exciting and joyful sexual activity of a newly-married couple. But a sexual act might be morally good and nonmorally bad: consider the routine sexual acts of this couple after they have been married for ten years. A sexual act might be morally bad yet nonmorally good: one spouse in that couple, married for ten years, commits adultery with another married person and finds their sexual activity to be extraordinarily satisfying. And, finally, a sexual act might be both morally and nonmorally bad: the adulterous couple get tired of each other, eventually no longer experiencing the excitement they once knew. A world in which there was little or no discrepancy between the moral and the nonmoral quality of sexual activity might be a better world than ours, or it might be worse. I would refrain from making such a judgment unless I were pretty sure what the moral goodness and badness of sexual activity amounted to in the first place, and until I knew a lot more about human psychology. Sometimes that a sexual activity is acknowledged to be morally wrong contributes all by itself to its being nonmorally good.
Whether a particular sexual act or a specific type of sexual act provides sexual pleasure is not the only factor in judging its nonmoral quality: pragmatic and prudential considerations also figure into whether a sexual act, all things considered, has a preponderance of nonmoral goodness. Many sexual activities can be physically or psychologically risky, dangerous, or harmful. Anal coitus, for example, whether carried out by a heterosexual couple or by two gay males, can damage delicate tissues and is a mechanism for the potential transmission of various HIV viruses (as is heterosexual genital intercourse). Thus in evaluating whether a sexual act will be overall nonmorally good or bad, not only its anticipated pleasure or satisfaction must be counted, but also all sorts of negative (undesired) side effects: whether the sexual act is likely to damage the body, as in some sadomasochistic acts, or transmit any one of a number of venereal diseases, or result in an unwanted pregnancy, or even whether one might feel regret, anger, or guilt afterwards as a result of having engaged in a sexual act with this person, or in this location, or under these conditions, or of a specific type. Indeed, all these pragmatic and prudential factors also figure into the moral evaluation of sexual activity: intentionally causing unwanted pain or discomfort to one’s partner, or not taking adequate precautions against the possibility of pregnancy, or not informing one’s partner of a suspected case of genital infection (but see David Mayo’s provocative dissent, in “An Obligation to Warn of HIV Infection?”), can be morally wrong. Thus, depending on what particular moral principles about sexuality one embraces, the various ingredients that constitute the nonmoral quality of sexual acts can influence one’s moral judgments.
In addition to inquiring about the moral and nonmoral quality of a given sexual act or a type of sexual activity, we can also ask whether the act or type is natural or unnatural (that is, perverted). Natural sexual acts, to provide merely a broad definition, are those acts that either flow naturally from human sexual nature, or at least do not frustrate or counteract sexual tendencies that flow naturally from human sexual desire. An account of what is natural in human sexual desire and activity is part of a philosophical account of human nature in general, what we might call philosophical anthropology, which is a rather large undertaking.
Note that evaluating a particular sexual act or a specific type of sexual activity as being natural or unnatural can very well be distinct from evaluating the act or type either as being morally good or bad or as being nonmorally good or bad. Suppose we assume, for the sake of discussion only, that heterosexual coitus is a natural human sexual activity and that homosexual fellatio is unnatural, or a sexual perversion. Even so, it would not follow from these judgments alone that all heterosexual coitus is morally good (some of it might be adulterous, or rape) or that all homosexual fellatio is morally wrong (some of it, engaged in by consenting adults in the privacy of their homes, might be morally permissible). Further, from the fact that heterosexual coitus is natural, it does not follow that acts of heterosexual coitus will be nonmorally good, that is, pleasurable; nor does it follow from the fact that homosexual fellatio is perverted that it does not or cannot produce sexual pleasure for those people who engage in it. Of course, both natural and unnatural sexual acts can be medically or psychologically risky or dangerous. There is no reason to assume that natural sexual acts are in general more safe than unnatural sexual acts; for example, unprotected heterosexual intercourse is likely more dangerous, in several ways, than mutual homosexual masturbation.
Since there are no necessary connections between, on the one hand, evaluating a particular sexual act or a specific type of sexual activity as being natural or unnatural and, on the other hand, evaluating its moral and nonmoral quality, why would we wonder whether a sexual act or a type of sex was natural or perverted? One reason is simply that understanding what is natural and unnatural in human sexuality helps complete our picture of human nature in general, and allows us to understand our species more fully. With such deliberations, the self-reflection about humanity and the human condition that is the heart of philosophy becomes more complete. A second reason is that an account of the difference between the natural and the perverted in human sexuality might be useful for psychology, especially if we assume that a desire or tendency to engage in perverted sexual activities is a sign or symptom of an underlying mental or psychological pathology.
Finally (a third reason), even though natural sexual activity is not on that score alone morally good and unnatural sexual activity is not necessarily morally wrong, it is still possible to argue that whether a particular sexual act or a specific type of sexuality is natural or unnatural does influence, to a greater or lesser extent, whether the act is morally good or morally bad. Just as whether a sexual act is nonmorally good, that is, produces pleasure for the participants, may be a factor, sometimes an important one, in our evaluating the act morally, whether a sexual act or type of sexual expression is natural or unnatural may also play a role, sometimes a large one, in deciding whether the act is morally good or bad.
A comparison between the sexual philosophy of the medieval Catholic theologian St. Thomas Aquinas and that of the contemporary secular philosophy Thomas Nagel is in this regard instructive. Both Aquinas and Nagel can be understood as assuming that what is unnatural in human sexuality is perverted, and that what is unnatural or perverted in human sexuality is simply that which does not conform with or is inconsistent with natural human sexuality. But beyond these general areas of agreement, there are deep differences between Aquinas and Nagel.
Based upon a comparison of the sexuality of humans and the sexuality of lower animals (mammals, in particular), Aquinas concludes that what is natural in human sexuality is the impulse to engage in heterosexual coitus. Heterosexual coitus is the mechanism designed by the Christian God to insure the preservation of animal species, including humans, and hence engaging in this activity is the primary natural expression of human sexual nature. Further, this God designed each of the parts of the human body to carry out specific functions, and on Aquinas’s view God designed the male penis to implant sperm into the female’s vagina for the purpose of effecting procreation. It follows, for Aquinas, that depositing the sperm elsewhere than inside a human female’s vagina is unnatural: it is a violation of God’s design, contrary to the nature of things as established by God. For this reason alone, on Aquinas’s view, such activities are immoral, a grave offense to the sagacious plan of the Almighty.
Sexual intercourse with lower animals (bestiality), sexual activity with members of one’s own sex (homosexuality), and masturbation, for Aquinas, are unnatural sexual acts and are immoral exactly for that reason. If they are committed intentionally, according to one’s will, they deliberately disrupt the natural order of the world as created by God and which God commanded to be respected. (See Summa Theologiae, vol. 43, 2a2ae, qq. 153-154.) In none of these activities is there any possibility of procreation, and the sexual and other organs are used, or misused, for purposes other than that for which they were designed. Although Aquinas does not say so explicitly, but only hints in this direction, it follows from his philosophy of sexuality that fellatio, even when engaged in by heterosexuals, is also perverted and morally wrong. At least in those cases in which orgasm occurs by means of this act, the sperm is not being placed where it should be placed and procreation is therefore not possible. If the penis entering the vagina is the paradigmatic natural act, then any other combination of anatomical connections will be unnatural and hence immoral; for example, the penis, mouth, or fingers entering the anus. Note that Aquinas’s criterion of the natural, that the sexual act must be procreative in form, and hence must involve a penis inserted into a vagina, makes no mention of human psychology. Aquinas’s line of thought yields an anatomical criterion of natural and perverted sex that refers only to bodily organs and what they might accomplish physiologically and to where they are, or are not, put in relation to each other.
Thomas Nagel denies Aquinas’s central presupposition, that in order to discover what is natural in human sexuality we should emphasize what humans and lower animals have in common. Applying this formula, Aquinas concluded that the purpose of sexual activity and the sexual organs in humans was procreation, as it is in the lower animals. Everything else in Aquinas’s sexual philosophy follows more-or-less logically from this. Nagel, by contrast, argues that to discover what is distinctive about the natural human sexuality, and hence derivatively what is unnatural or perverted, we should focus, instead, on what humans and lower animals do not have in common. We should emphasize the ways in which humans are different from animals, the ways in which humans and their sexuality are special. Thus Nagel argues that sexual perversion in humans should be understood as a psychological phenomenon rather than, as in Aquinas’s treatment, in anatomical and physiological terms. For it is human psychology that makes us quite different from other animals, and hence an account of natural human sexuality must acknowledge the uniqueness of human psychology.
Nagel proposes that sexual interactions in which each person responds with sexual arousal to noticing the sexual arousal of the other person exhibit the psychology that is natural to human sexuality. In such an encounter, each person becomes aware of himself or herself and the other person as both the subject and the object of their joint sexual experiences. Perverted sexual encounters or events would be those in which this mutual recognition of arousal is absent, and in which a person remains fully a subject of the sexual experience or fully an object. Perversion, then, is a departure from or a truncation of a psychologically “complete” pattern of arousal and consciousness. (See Nagel’s “Sexual Perversion,” pp. 15-17.) Nothing in Nagel’s psychological account of the natural and the perverted refers to bodily organs or physiological processes. That is, for a sexual encounter to be natural, it need not be procreative in form, as long as the requisite psychology of mutual recognition is present. Whether a sexual activity is natural or perverted does not depend, on Nagel’s view, on what organs are used or where they are put, but only on the character of the psychology of the sexual encounter. Thus Nagel disagrees with Aquinas that homosexual activities, as a specific type of sexual act, are unnatural or perverted, for homosexual fellatio and anal intercourse may very well be accompanied by the mutual recognition of and response to the other’s sexual arousal.
It is illuminating to compare what the views of Aquinas and Nagel imply about fetishism, that is, the usually male practice of masturbating while fondling women’s shoes or undergarments. Aquinas and Nagel agree that such activities are unnatural and perverted, but they disagree about the grounds of that evaluation. For Aquinas, masturbating while fondling shoes or undergarments is unnatural because the sperm is not deposited where it should be, and the act thereby has no procreative potential. For Nagel, masturbatory fetishism is perverted for a quite different reason: in this activity, there is no possibility of one persons’ noticing and being aroused by the arousal of another person. The arousal of the fetishist is, from the perspective of natural human psychology, defective. Note, in this example, one more difference between Aquinas and Nagel: Aquinas would judge the sexual activity of the fetishist to be immoral precisely because it is perverted (it violates a natural pattern established by God), while Nagel would not conclude that it must be morally wrong—after all, a fetishistic sexual act might be carried out quite harmlessly—even if it does indicate that something is suspicious about the fetishist’s psychology. The move historically and socially away from a Thomistic moralistic account of sexual perversion toward an amoral psychological account such as Nagel’s is representative of a more widespread trend: the gradual replacement of moral or religious judgments, about all sorts of deviant behavior, by medical or psychiatric judgments and interventions. (See Alan Soble, Sexual Investigations, chapter 4.)
A different kind of disagreement with Aquinas is registered by Christine Gudorf, a Christian theologian who otherwise has a lot in common with Aquinas. Gudorf agrees that the study of human anatomy and physiology yields insights into God’s plan and design, and that human sexual behavior should conform with God’s creative intentions. That is, Gudorf’s philosophy is squarely within the Thomistic Natural Law tradition. But Gudorf argues that if we take a careful look at the anatomy and physiology of the female sexual organs, and especially the clitoris, instead of focusing exclusively on the male’s penis (which is what Aquinas did), quite different conclusions about God’s plan and design emerge and hence Christian sexual ethics turns out to be less restrictive. In particular, Gudorf claims that the female’s clitoris is an organ whose only purpose is the production of sexual pleasure and, unlike the mixed or dual functionality of the penis, has no connection with procreation. Gudorf concludes that the existence of the clitoris in the female body suggests that God intended that the purpose of sexual activity was as much for sexual pleasure for its own sake as it was for procreation. Therefore, according to Gudorf, pleasurable sexual activity apart from procreation does not violate God’s design, is not unnatural, and hence is not necessarily morally wrong, as long as it occurs in the context of a monogamous marriage (Sex, Body, and Pleasure, p. 65). Today we are not as confident as Aquinas was that God’s plan can be discovered by a straightforward examination of human and animal bodies; but such healthy skepticism about our ability to discern the intentions of God from facts of the natural world would seem to apply to Gudorf’s proposal as well.
The ethics of sexual behavior, as a branch of applied ethics, is no more and no less contentious than the ethics of anything else that is usually included within the area of applied ethics. Think, for example, of the notorious debates over euthanasia, capital punishment, abortion, and our treatment of lower animals for food, clothing, entertainment, and in medical research. So it should come as no surprise than even though a discussion of sexual ethics might well result in the removal of some confusions and a clarification of the issues, no final answers to questions about the morality of sexual activity are likely to be forthcoming from the philosophy of sexuality. As far as I can tell by surveying the literature on sexual ethics, there are at least three major topics that have received much discussion by philosophers of sexuality and which provide arenas for continual debate.
We have already encountered one debate: the dispute between a Thomistic Natural Law approach to sexual morality and a more liberal, secular outlook that denies that there is a tight connection between what is unnatural in human sexuality and what is immoral. The secular liberal philosopher emphasizes the values of autonomous choice, self-determination, and pleasure in arriving at moral judgments about sexual behavior, in contrast to the Thomistic tradition that justifies a more restrictive sexual ethics by invoking a divinely imposed scheme to which human action must conform. For a secular liberal philosopher of sexuality, the paradigmatically morally wrong sexual act is rape, in which one person forces himself or herself upon another or uses threats to coerce the other to engage in sexual activity. By contrast, for the liberal, anything done voluntarily between two or more people is generally morally permissible. For the secular liberal, then, a sexual act would be morally wrong if it were dishonest, coercive, or manipulative, and Natural Law theory would agree, except to add that the act’s merely being unnatural is another, independent reason for condemning it morally. Kant, for example, held that “Onanism . . . is abuse of the sexual faculty. . . . By it man sets aside his person and degrades himself below the level of animals. . . . Intercourse between sexus homogenii . . . too is contrary to the ends of humanity”(Lectures, p. 170). The sexual liberal, however, usually finds nothing morally wrong or nonmorally bad about either masturbation or homosexual sexual activity. These activities might be unnatural, and perhaps in some ways prudentially unwise, but in many if not most cases they can be carried out without harm being done either to the participants or to anyone else.
Natural Law is alive and well today among philosophers of sex, even if the details do not match Aquinas’s original version. For example, the contemporary philosopher John Finnis argues that there are morally worthless sexual acts in which “one’s body is treated as instrumental for the securing of the experiential satisfaction of the conscious self” (see “Is Homosexual Conduct Wrong?”). For example, in masturbating or in being anally sodomized, the body is just a tool of sexual satisfaction and, as a result, the person undergoes “disintegration.” “One’s choosing self [becomes] the quasi-slave of the experiencing self which is demanding gratification.” The worthlessness and disintegration attaching to masturbation and sodomy actually attach, for Finnis, to “all extramarital sexual gratification.” This is because only in married, heterosexual coitus do the persons’ “reproductive organs . . . make them a biological . . . unit.” Finnis begins his argument with the metaphysically pessimistic intuition that sexual activity involves treating human bodies and persons instrumentally, and he concludes with the thought that sexual activity in marriage—in particular, genital intercourse—avoids disintegrity because only in this case, as intended by God’s plan, does the couple attain a state of genuine unity: “the orgasmic union of the reproductive organs of husband and wife really unites them biologically.” (See also Finnis’s essay “Law, Morality, and ‘Sexual Orientation’.”)
Another debate is about whether, when there is no harm done to third parties to be concerned about, the fact that two people engage in a sexual act voluntarily, with their own free and informed consent, is sufficient for satisfying the demands of sexual morality. Of course, those in the Natural Law tradition deny that consent is sufficient, since on their view willingly engaging in unnatural sexual acts is morally wrong, but they are not alone in reducing the moral significance of consent. Sexual activity between two persons might be harmful to one or both participants, and a moral paternalist or perfectionist would claim that it is wrong for one person to harm another person, or for the latter to allow the former to engage in this harmful behavior, even when both persons provide free and informed consent to their joint activity. Consent in this case is not sufficient, and as a result some forms of sadomasochistic sexuality turn out to be morally wrong. The denial of the sufficiency of consent is also frequently presupposed by those philosophers who claim that only in a committed relationship is sexual activity between two people morally permissible. The free and informed consent of both parties may be a necessary condition for the morality of their sexual activity, but without the presence of some other ingredient (love, marriage, devotion, and the like) their sexual activity remains mere mutual use or objectification and hence morally objectionable.
In casual sex, for example, two persons are merely using each other for their own sexual pleasure; even when genuinely consensual, these mutual sexual uses do not yield a virtuous sexual act. Kant and Karol Wojtyla (Pope John Paul II) take this position: willingly allowing oneself to be used sexually by another makes an object of oneself. For Kant, sexual activity avoids treating a person merely as a means only in marriage, since here both persons have surrendered their bodies and souls to each other and have achieved a subtle metaphysical unity (Lectures, p. 167). For Wojtyla, “only love can preclude the use of one person by another” (Love and Responsibility, p. 30), since love is a unification of persons resulting from a mutual gift of their selves. Note, however, that the thought that a unifying love is the ingredient that justifies sexual activity (beyond consent) has an interesting and ironic implication: gay and lesbian sexual relations would seem to be permissible if they occur within loving, monogamous homosexual marriages (a position defended by the theologians Patricia Jung and Ralph Smith, in Heterosexism). At this point in the argument, defenders of the view that sexual activity is justifiable only in marriage commonly appeal to Natural Law to rule out homosexual marriage.
On another view of these matters, the fact that sexual activity is carried out voluntarily by all persons involved means, assuming that no harm to third parties exists, that the sexual activity is morally permissible. In defending such a view of the sufficiency of consent, Thomas Mappes writes that “respect for persons entails that each of us recognize the rightful authority of other persons (as rational beings) to conduct their individual lives as they see fit” (“Sexual Morality and the Concept of Using Another Person,” p. 204). Allowing the other person’s consent to control when the other may engage in sexual activity with me is to respect that person by taking his or her autonomy, his or her ability to reason and make choices, seriously, while not to allow the other to make the decision about when to engage in sexual activity with me is disrespectfully paternalistic. If the other person’s consent is taken as sufficient, that shows that I respect his or her choice of ends, or that even if I do not approve of his or her particular choice of ends, at least I show respect for his or her ends-making capability. According to such a view of the power of consent, there can be no moral objection in principle to casual sexual activity, to sexual activity with strangers, or to promiscuity, as long as the persons involved in the activity genuinely agree to engage in their chosen sexual activities.
If Mappes’s free and informed consent criterion of the morality of sexual activity is correct, we would still have to address several difficult questions. How specific must consent be? When one person agrees vaguely, and in the heat of the moment, with another person, “yes, let’s have sex,” the speaker has not necessarily consented to every type of sexual caress or coital position the second person might have in mind. And how explicit must consent be? Can consent be reliably implied by involuntarily behavior (moans, for example), and do nonverbal cues (erection, lubrication) decisively show that another person has consented to sex? Some philosophers insist that consent must be exceedingly specific as to the sexual acts to be carried out, and some would permit only explicit verbal consent, denying that body language by itself can do an adequate job of expressing the participant’s desires and intentions. (See Alan Soble, “Antioch’s ‘Sexual Offense Policy’.”)
Note also that not all philosophers agree with Mappes and others that fully voluntary consent is always necessary for sexual activity to be morally permissible. Jeffrie Murphy, for example, has raised some doubts (“Some Ruminations on Women, Violence, and the Criminal Law,” p. 218):
“Have sex with me or I will find another girlfriend” strikes me (assuming normal circumstances) as a morally permissible threat, and “Have sex with me and I will marry you” strikes me (assuming the offer is genuine) as a morally permissible offer. . . . We negotiate our way through most of life with schemes of threats and offers . . . and I see no reason why the realm of sexuality should be utterly insulated from this very normal way of being human.
Murphy implies that some threats are coercive and thereby undermine the voluntary nature of the participation in sexual activity of one of the persons, but, he adds, these types of threats are not always morally wrong. Alternatively, we might say that in the cases Murphy describes, the threats and offers do not constitute coercion at all and that they present no obstacle to fully voluntary participation. (See Alan Wertheimer, “Consent and Sexual Relations.”) If so, Murphy’s cases do not establish that voluntary consent is not always required for sexual activity to be morally right.
As suggested by Murphy’s examples, another debate concerns the meaning and application of the concept “voluntary.” Whether consent is only necessary for the morality of sexual activity, or also sufficient, any moral principle that relies on consent to make moral distinctions among sexual events presupposes a clear understanding of the “voluntary” aspect of consent. It is safe to say that participation in sexual activity ought not to be physically forced upon one person by another. But this obvious truth leaves matters wide open. Onora O’Neill, for example, thinks that casual sex is morally wrong because the consent it purportedly involves is not likely to be sufficiently voluntary, in light of subtle pressures people commonly put on each other to engage in sexual activity (see “Between Consenting Adults”).
One moral ideal is that genuinely consensual participation in sexual activity requires not a hint of coercion or pressure of any sort. Because engaging in sexual activity can be risky or dangerous in many ways, physically, psychologically, and metaphysically, we would like to be sure, according to this moral ideal, that anyone who engages in sexual activity does so perfectly voluntarily. Some philosophers have argued that this ideal can be realized only when there is substantial economic and social equality between the persons involved in a given sexual encounter. For example, a society that exhibits disparities in the incomes or wealth of its various members is one in which some people will be exposed to economic coercion. If some groups of people (women and members of ethnic minorities, in particular) have less economic and social power than others, members of these groups will be therefore exposed to sexual coercion in particular, among other kinds. One immediate application of this thought is that prostitution, which to many sexual liberals is a business bargain made by a provider of sexual services and a client and is largely characterized by adequately free and informed consent, may be morally wrong, if the economic situation of the prostitute acts as a kind of pressure that negates the voluntary nature of his or her participation. Further, women with children who are economically dependent on their husbands may find themselves in the position of having to engage in sexual activity whether they want to or not, for fear of being abandoned; these women, too, may not be engaging in sexual activity fully voluntarily. The woman who allows herself to be nagged into sex by her husband worries that if she says “no” too often, she will suffer economically, if not also physically and psychologically.
The view that the presence of any kind of pressure at all is coercive, negates the voluntary nature of participation in sexual activity, and hence is morally objectionable has been expressed by Charlene Muehlenhard and Jennifer Schrag (see their “Nonviolent Sexual Coercion”). They list, among other things, “status coercion” (when women are coerced into sexual activity or marriage by a man’s occupation) and “discrimination against lesbians” (which discrimination compels women into having sexual relationships only with men) as forms of coercion that undermine the voluntary nature of participation by women in sexual activity with men. But depending on the kind of case we have in mind, it might be more accurate to say either that some pressures are not coercive and do not appreciably undermine voluntariness, or that some pressures are coercive but are nevertheless not morally objectionable. Is it always true that the presence of any kind of pressure put on one person by another amounts to coercion that negates the voluntary nature of consent, so that subsequent sexual activity is morally wrong?
Conceptual philosophy of sexuality is concerned to analyze and to clarify concepts that are central in this area of philosophy: sexual activity, sexual desire, sexual sensation, sexual perversion, and others. It also attempts to define less abstract concepts, such as prostitution, pornography, and rape. I would like to illustrate the conceptual philosophy of sexuality by focusing on one particular concept, that of “sexual activity,” and explore in what ways it is related to another central concept, that of “sexual pleasure.” One lesson to be learned here is that conceptual philosophy of sexuality can be just as difficult and contentious as normative philosophy of sexuality, and that as a result firm conceptual conclusions are hard to come by.
According to a notorious study published in 1999 in the Journal of the American Medical Association (“Would You Say You ‘Had Sex’ If . . . ?” by Stephanie Sanders and June Reinisch), a large percent of undergraduate college students, about 60%, do not think that engaging in oral sex (fellatio and cunnilingus) is “having sex.” This finding is at first glance very surprising, but it is not difficult to comprehend sympathetically. To be sure, as philosophers we easily conclude that oral sex is a specific type of sexual activity. But “sexual activity” is a technical concept, while “having sex” is an ordinary language concept, which refers primarily to heterosexual intercourse. Thus when Monica Lewinsky told her confidant Linda Tripp that she did not “have sex” with William Jefferson Clinton, she was not necessarily self-deceived, lying, or pulling a fast one. She was merely relying on the ordinary language definition or criterion of “having sex,” which is not identical to the philosopher’s concept of “sexual activity,” does not always include oral sex, and usually requires genital intercourse.
Another conclusion might be drawn from the JAMA survey. If we assume that heterosexual coitus by and large, or in many cases, produces more pleasure for the participants than does oral sex, or at least that in heterosexual intercourse there is greater mutuality of sexual pleasure than in one-directional oral sex, and this is why ordinary thought tends to discount the ontological significance of oral sex, then perhaps we can use this to fashion a philosophical account of “sexual activity” that is at once consistent with ordinary thought.
In common thought, whether a sexual act is nonmorally good or bad is often associated with whether it is judged to be a sexual act at all. Sometimes we derive little or no pleasure from a sexual act (say, we are primarily giving pleasure to another person, or we are even selling it to the other person), and we think that even though the other person had a sexual experience, we didn’t. Or the other person did try to provide us with sexual pleasure but failed miserably, whether from ignorance of technique or sheer sexual crudity. In such a case it would not be implausible to say that we did not undergo a sexual experience and so did not engage in a sexual act. If Ms. Lewinsky’s performing oral sex on President Clinton was done only for his sake, for his sexual pleasure, and she did it out of consideration for his needs and not hers, then perhaps she did not herself, after all, engage in a sexual act.
Robert Gray is one philosopher who has taken up this line of ordinary thought and has argued that “sexual activity” should be analyzed in terms of the production of sexual pleasure. He asserts that “any activity might become a sexual activity” if sexual pleasure is derived from it, and “no activity is a sexual activity unless sexual pleasure is derived from it” (“Sex and Sexual Perversion,” p. 61). Perhaps Gray is right, since we tend to think that holding hands is a sexual activity when sexual pleasure is produced by doing so, but otherwise holding hands is not very sexual. A handshake is normally not a sexual act, and usually does not yield sexual pleasure; but two lovers caressing each other’s fingers is both a sexual act and produces sexual pleasure for them.
There is another reason for taking seriously the idea that sexual activities are exactly those that produce sexual pleasure. What is it about a sexually perverted activity that makes it sexual? The act is unnatural, we might say, because it has no connection with one common purpose of sexual activity, that is, procreation. But the only thing that would seem to make the act a sexual perversion is that it does, on a fairly reliable basis, nonetheless produce sexual pleasure. Undergarment fetishism is a sexual perversion, and not merely, say, a “fabric” perversion, because it involves sexual pleasure. Similarly, what is it about homosexual sexual activities that makes them sexual? All such acts are nonprocreative, yet they share something very important in common with procreative heterosexual activities: they produce sexual pleasure, and the same sort of sexual pleasure.
Suppose I were to ask you, “How many sexual partners have you had during the last five years”? If you were on your toes, you would ask me, before answering, “What counts as a sexual partner?” (Maybe you are suspicious of my question because you had read Greta Christina’s essay on this topic, “Are We Having Sex Now or What?”) At this point I should give you an adequate analysis of “sexual activity,” and tell you to count anyone with whom you engaged in sexual activity according to this definition. What I should definitely not do is to tell you to count only those people with whom you had a pleasing or satisfactory sexual experience, forgetting about, and hence not counting, those partners with whom you had nonmorally bad sex. But if we accept Gray’s analysis of sexual activity, that sexual acts are exactly those and only those that produce sexual pleasure, I should of course urge you not to count, over those five years, anyone with whom you had a nonmorally bad sexual experience. You will end up reporting to me fewer sexual partners than you in fact had. Maybe that will make you feel better.
The general point is this. If “sexual activity” is logically dependent on “sexual pleasure,” if sexual pleasure is thereby the criterion of sexual activity itself, then sexual pleasure cannot be the gauge of the nonmoral quality of sexual activities. That is, this analysis of “sexual activity” in terms of “sexual pleasure” conflates what it is for an act to be a sexual activity with what it is for an act to be a nonmorally good sexual activity. On such an analysis, procreative sexual activities, when the penis is placed into the vagina, would be sexual activities only when they produce sexual pleasure, and not when they are as sensually boring as a handshake. Further, the victim of a rape, who has not experienced nonmorally good sex, cannot claim that he or she was forced to engage in sexual activity, even if the act compelled on him or her was intercourse or fellatio.
I would prefer to say that the couple who have lost sexual interest in each other, and who engage in routine sexual activities from which they derive no pleasure, are still performing a sexual act. But we are forbidden, by Gray’s proposed analysis, from saying that they engage in nonmorally bad sexual activity, for on his view they have not engaged in any sexual activity at all. Rather, we could say at most that they tried to engage in sexual activity but failed to do so. It may be a sad fact about our sexual world that we can engage in sexual activity and not derive any or much pleasure from it, but that fact should not give us reason for refusing to call these unsatisfactory events “sexual.”
U. S. A.
Last updated: May 10, 2009 | Originally published: