Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy

The Third Earl of Shaftesbury (1671-1713)

ShaftesburyAnthony Ashley Cooper, the Third Earl of Shaftesbury (1671-1713) was an English philosopher who profoundly influenced 18th century thought in Britain, France, and Germany.  As a part of an important social circle of English Freethinkers along with early deists such as John Toland, Matthew Tindal, and Anthony Collins, Shaftesbury’s work had a significant influence on French deists such as Voltaire and Rousseau.  He also corresponded with some of the most important thinkers of his day, including Locke, Leibniz, and Bayle.  Shaftesbury was most influential in the history of English language philosophy through his concept of the moral sense which heavily influenced Hutcheson, Butler, Hume, and Adam Smith; and Shaftesbury was influential in Germany through his concept of enthusiasm which recovered (intuitive) reason from mere (discursive) reasoning and influenced the Romantic idea of the creative imagination as found in German thinkers such as Lessing, Mendelssohn, Goethe, Herder, and Schiller.

Although Shaftesbury was enormously influential in the 18th century, his prestige declined in the 20th century, primarily due to the rise of analytic philosophy which defined philosophy such that Shaftesbury’s work seemed more like literature or rhetoric than proper philosophy. Those trained in analytic philosophy continue to have trouble reading Shaftesbury, largely because he self-consciously rejects systematic philosophy and focuses more on rhetoric and literary persuasion than providing numbered premises.  Shaftesbury is interested as much in moral formation as he is in moral theorizing, though his work does contain some, albeit intentionally veiled, discussion of theoretical concerns.

As Shaftesbury saw it, Hobbes had set the agenda of British moral philosophy (a search for the grounding of universal moral principles), and Locke had established its method (empiricism).  Shaftesbury’s important contribution was to focus that agenda by showing what a satisfactory response to Hobbes might look like but without giving up too much of Locke’s method.  Shaftesbury showed the British moralists that if we think of moral goodness as analogous to beauty, then (even within a broadly empiricist framework) it is still possible for moral goodness to be non-arbitrarily grounded in objective features of the world and for the moral agent to be attracted to virtue for its own sake, not merely out of self-interest.

In his most influential works, Shaftesbury thinks of moral judgment as self-reflection. First we have motives, and then we reflect on those motives resulting in a feeling of moral approval or condemnation. The process is the same when evaluating other agents:  we reflect on their motives and feel approval or condemnation.  In Shaftesbury’s aesthetic language, the state of having the morally correct motives is the state of being “morally beautiful,” and the state of approving the morally correct motives upon reflection is the state of having “good moral taste.” Shaftesbury argues that the morally correct motives which constitute moral beauty turn out to be those motives which are aimed at the good of one’s society as a whole.  This good is understood teleologically.  Furthermore Shaftesbury argues that both the ability to know the good of one’s society and the reflective approval of the motivation toward this good are innate capacities which must nevertheless be developed by proper socialization.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Works
  3. Aims and Methods
  4. Major Themes
    1. Moral Realism
    2. Moral Beauty
    3. Moral Sense
    4. Personal Identity
  5. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Texts
    2. Secondary Texts

1. Life

Shaftesbury was part of an important political family.  Shaftesbury’s grandfather, the First Earl of Shaftesbury (1621-1683), was an influential and controversial Whig politician.  The Whigs were the party in favor of the supremacy of parliament over the monarchy in England.  The opposing party, the Tories, supported the monarchy and also tended to support a hierarchical state-sponsored religion, either Anglicanism or Roman Catholicism.  The Whigs favored freedom of religion, supporting religious “Dissenters,” at first Puritans, Calvinists, Quakers, etc., and later Deists.  In 1679 the First Earl of Shaftesbury introduced a bill into Parliament attempting to exclude King Charles II’s brother James (later King James II) from the throne because James was Roman Catholic.  The bill failed, and the First Earl was eventually charged with treason and fled to Holland where he died in exile.

Shaftesbury was very close to his grandfather and revered the memory of the First Earl.  Because Shaftesbury’s father had an unidentified degenerative illness, Shaftesbury was raised in the household of the First Earl from the age of four.  After the First Earl’s disgrace, Shaftesbury made it one of his life’s goals to rehabilitate his family’s reputation. Though his votes in Parliament occasionally sided with the Tories, Shaftesbury always stayed true to the political principles of his grandfather, consistently fighting for religious tolerance and a balance of powers at both the national and international level (see Voitle, p. 73; cf. p. 414).

John Locke (1632-1704) was a close friend of the First Earl and an advisor to the family for years to come after the First Earl’s death.  Locke was the personal physician and general advisor to the First Earl.  He supervised the childhood medical care of Shaftesbury’s father, the Second Earl (1652-1699). He also helped find a wife for the Second Earl and he cared for her during  her pregnancy  with the Third Earl.  Most significantly for our purposes, Locke supervised the Third Earl’s education.  He personally chose Shaftesbury’s governess Elizabeth Birch and designed a curriculum for her to follow in her instruction of the child.  This experience was, presumably, the basis for Locke’s later work Thoughts Concerning Education.  Under Birch’s tutelage, Shaftesbury received a strong education in the Classics and became fluent in Greek and Latin by the age of eleven.  Locke continued to check on Shaftesbury’s progress over the years.  After the First Earl’s death when Shaftesbury was twelve years old, he attended Winchester College, a secondary school which at the time was dominated by Tory sentiment. Shaftesbury felt persecuted by his peers on account of the First Earl’s political reputation.

In 1687, at the age of 16, Shaftesbury began his two-year “Grand Tour” of Europe, a customary part of a British nobleman’s education during the period.  After an extended stay in Paris, Shaftesbury spent most of his tour in Italy where, based on his diary, he focused his attention on art and architecture.  He was especially interested in ruins from the classical Roman period.  The first stop on his tour, however, was Holland where Shaftesbury spent several months visiting John Locke.

After returning from his Grand Tour in 1689, Shaftesbury took over managing much of the family estates and interests from his bedridden father.  Shaftesbury also had to supervise the education of his brothers and the marriages of his sisters; oversee the family finances and investments; govern the family lands, a job which included adjudicating disputes among the tenants; and, in 1695, take his place as a member of Parliament in the House of Commons.  Locke served as a primary advisor to the young Shaftesbury as he found his footing in these new duties, though Shaftesbury did not always follow Locke’s advice.  Shaftesbury had many philosophical conversations with Locke, some of which are preserved in correspondence. During this time, Shaftesbury wrote his first philosophical works, An Inquiry Concerning Virtue or Merit and the “Preface” to his edition of Whichcote’s sermons.

The smoky, polluted air of London did not agree with Shaftesbury, and he developed what would become a life-long and eventually fatal respiratory disease. Shaftesbury was diagnosed with a form of asthma, though Voitle suggests that the evidence points toward tuberculosis (Voitle, p. 226).  In 1698, due to his health, he retired from public life and spent a year in Holland where he met important thinkers of the day including Pierre Bayle (1647-1706), who became a close friend, despite their philosophical disagreements.

While in retirement he also began keeping his philosophical journal, which he labeled Askemata (Greek: exercises), posthumously published under the title of Philosophical Regimen.  The Askemata reveals Shaftesbury as a disciple of the ancient Stoics, especially Epictetus and Marcus Aurelius.

After the death of his father, Shaftesbury inherited the title of Earl and felt obligated to return to Parliament in 1700 (this time in the House of Lords).  Yet his health continued to worsen, and he gradually spent more and more time in retirement, during which time he prepared his philosophical works for publication.  By the time his collected works appeared in 1711 as Characteristics of Men, Manners, Opinions, Times, Shaftesbury’s health was so poor he decided to move to Italy in search of a more hospitable climate. There he continued to write. He prepared a revised second edition of the Characteristics, reading the work aloud to see how it sounded and making changes mostly in style and grammar.  He also added important illustrations, an allegorical headpiece for each treatise.  Finally, he began a sequel to the Characteristics to be titled Second Characters. The warm, sulphurous air off the Bay of Naples did help Shaftesbury’s health, but not enough.  He died in 1714 without finishing his work.

2. Works

Shaftesbury’s first publication was a collection of sermons written by Cambridge Platonist Benjamin Whichcote.  His introduction to that volume praised Whichcote for maintaining the goodness of human nature and the existence of a natural impulse toward benevolence. This was in contrast to most other 17th century divines who followed secular thinkers in holding that self-interest is the only motive to action and were therefore required to ground moral motivation in the rewards and punishments of the afterlife.

Shaftesbury’s major work Characteristics of Men, Manners, Opinions, Times (first edition published 1711) is an anthology of five previously published essays, sometimes with substantial revisions: An Inquiry Concerning Virtue or Merit (1699); A Letter Concerning Enthusiasm (1708); Sensus Communis, An Essay on the Freedom of Wit and Humor (1709); The Moralists, A Philosophical Rhapsody (1709); and Soliloquy, or Advice to an Author (1710). Along with these earlier works, Shaftesbury appended five new chapters of Miscellaneous Reflections roughly corresponding to the five essays which attempt to bring some coherence to the collection by commenting on and qualifying Shaftesbury’s earlier views.

His other published philosophical works include A Notion of the Historical Draught or Tablature of the Judgment Hercules and A Letter Concerning Design, originally a set of instructions for a painting Shaftesbury had commissioned and a letter commenting on those instructions, both written in 1712.  Shaftesbury planned to include these works in a projected sequel to the Characteristics called Second Characters, but he died before the project could be completed.  The Notion was subsequently included in the posthumous 1714 edition of the Characteristics, while the Letter Concerning Design was also added in the 1732 edition.  These two late works were included, along with some of Shaftesbury’s unfinished works (including a dialogue called The Picture of Cebes and a treatise to be entitled Plastics, an Epistolary Excursion in the Original Progress and Power of Designatory Art), in Benjamin Rand’s attempted reconstruction of Second Characters, published in 1914.

Finally, we have some of Shaftesbury’s correspondence and private journals (the Askemata), albeit in an unreliable transcription reordered and edited by Rand, published in 1900 under the title The Life, Unpublished Letters, and Philosophical Regimen of Anthony, Earl of Shaftesbury

3. Aims and Methods

Shaftesbury is primarily known in the history of philosophy for two things.  To moral philosophers he is known as the father of moral sense theory in British moralism; and to philosophers of art, he is known as “the first great aesthetician that England produced” (Cassirer 1953, 166) whose work was seminal for the German Romantics. But neither of these is what Shaftesbury himself thought was most important about his work.  Shaftesbury was not simply working out an epistemology of ethics or an account of aesthetic experience.  He did examine both of these issues, but his more direct interest was in transforming British moral inquiry by synthesizing ethics and aesthetics.

To use Shaftesbury’s own terms, the chief aim of his work is to introduce the concepts of “moral beauty” and “moral taste” to eighteenth  century British society.  In the final chapter of the Characteristics Shaftesbury sums up his overall project: “It has been the main scope and principal end of these volumes to assert the reality of a beauty and charm in moral as well as natural subjects, and to demonstrate the reasonableness of a proportionate taste and determinate choice in life and manners” (Miscellaneous Reflections V.iii, 466). Earlier he claims he is “intent chiefly on this single point, to discover how we may to best advantage form within ourselves what in the polite world is called a relish or good taste” (Miscellaneous Reflections III.i, 404).  Therefore Shaftesbury’s goal is to show that not every preference is equally appropriate to human nature and that there is such a thing as “good taste” in art and morality.

Shaftesbury’s writing style is intrinsically related to his philosophical goals.  Since Shaftesbury’s major audience was genteel or “polite” society, he often writes in a playfully oblique and ironic rhetorical style.  He uses elaborate analogies and metaphors to entertain and disarm his readers but not necessarily to carry any great philosophical weight (the most significant and easily misunderstood being the famous analogy of moral judgment with sensation). Therefore modern readers must always keep in mind the looseness and lack of analytic rigor with which Shaftesbury approaches his material.  He is trying to provide powerful suggestions aimed at forming his readers’ moral sentiments rather than to give detailed arguments to establish a theoretical system.  In other words, Shaftesbury wants to help his readers actually develop good moral taste, not merely to theorize about it.

4. Major Themes

a. Moral Realism

Shaftesbury did not see himself as inventing a new synthesis of aesthetics and ethics.  Rather, he thought he was protecting a classical synthesis.  And Shaftesbury thought the primary threat to the classical notions of moral beauty and moral taste came from the empiricist philosophy of Hobbes and Locke.

The four elements of Hobbes’s view to which Shaftesbury objected were empiricism, mechanism, voluntarism, and egoism.  Empiricism rejected innate ideas of morality.  Instead, moral principles were understood as a result of subjective emotions whereas classical moral philosophy saw moral principles as deriving from the human being’s objective teleology.  The modern mechanistic physics, however, rejected natural teleology.  If there was to be a set of universal moral principles, it could not be grounded on universal human nature, but it must be, as voluntarism asserts, grounded on a sovereign will (either God’s or the human government’s) expressed in positive law.

Shaftesbury believed Hobbes had reduced morality to self-interest, and it is to this Hobbesian “skepticism” that Shaftesbury is responding.  But Shaftesbury also had another, more personal target.  As a child Shaftesbury had been tutored by John Locke, a personal advisor of  his grandfather.  But as  Shaftesbury grew up, he came to reject the moral skepticism he thought followed from Locke’s empiricism and voluntaristic divine command theory. According to Shaftesbury, many of those who rejected Hobbes’s political philosophy, including the “free writers” (read: deists) and Locke, nevertheless went “in the self-same tract” as Hobbes’s philosophy.  Shaftesbury goes on to argue that Locke was in fact more dangerous than Hobbes or the Deists because, unlike them, Locke had the reputation of “sincerity as a most zealous ‘Christian’ and believer” and was thus able to make the nominalist position attractive to a wide audience.  And it was Locke who had succeeded in convincing many of the British moralists to give up the idea of goodness as natural rather than as socially constructed.

It was Mr. Locke that struck the home blow: for Mr. Hobbes’s character and base slavish principles in government took off the poison of his philosophy. ’Twas Mr. Locke that struck at all fundamentals, threw all order and virtue out of the world, and made the very ideas of these (which are the same as those of God) “unnatural,” and without foundation in our minds. (Rand 1900, p. 403)

Hence it was against Locke that Shaftesbury thought morality most needed to be defended.

What bothered Shaftesbury and many of his contemporaries about Hobbes and Locke were the empiricists’ apparent rejection of the “reality” of virtue. In his dialogue The Moralists, Shaftesbury has the character Philocles distinguish two ways modern religious philosophers defended the link between religion and morality: “Some of them hold zealously for virtue, and are realists in the point. Others, one may say, are only nominal moralists by making virtue nothing in itself, a creature of will only or a mere name of fashion” (The Moralists, II.2, p. 262, my emphasis).  Later in the dialogue, the character Theocles says that the author of “a certain fair Inquiry” (i.e., Shaftesbury’s own Inquiry Concerning Virtue and Merit) argued against a specifically religious basis for ethics:

For being, in respect of virtue, what you lately called a realist, he endeavours to show that it is really something in itself and in the nature of things, not arbitrary or factitious (if I may so speak), not constituted from without or dependent on custom, fancy or will, not even on the supreme will itself, which can no way govern it but, being necessarily good, is governed by it and ever uniform with it. (The Moralists, II.3, p. 266-7)

Here a “realist” about virtue is someone who holds the view that morality is “in the nature of things.”  On this scheme, then, moral realism is opposed not only to relativism (the view that morality is constituted by “custom”) and subjectivism (the view that morality is constituted by an individual’s “fancy”) but also to voluntarism (the view that morality is constituted by the “will” of a sovereign, whether Locke’s God or Hobbes’s Leviathan).  So, according to Shaftesbury, to give morality a subjective basis in individual self-interest (even if one then attempted to construct on this subjective basis a set of objective and universal moral laws), rather than an objective basis in some intrinsic feature of character or action, is to deny the reality of moral distinctions, a position synonymous in the early modern mind with moral skepticism. Conversely, to call morality “real” was to commit oneself to what Shaftesbury’s predecessor Ralph Cudworth called “eternal and immutable” principles of morality.

b. Moral Beauty

Throughout the Characteristics, Shaftesbury argues that moral beauty is a “beauty of the sentiments, the grace of actions, the turn of characters, and the proportions of a human mind” (Sensus Communis IV.ii, p. 62).  In general, for Shaftesbury, beauty is a matter of harmonious proportion or “numbers.” The “beauties of the human soul,” then, are “the harmony and numbers of an inward kind” (Sensus Communis IV.ii, p. 63).  They are an “inward anatomy” of soul which, like the outward anatomy of the body, must be brought into the “order or symmetry” that is constitutive of beauty and health (Inquiry 2.I.ii, p. 194).

For Shaftesbury, the concept of moral beauty is not merely a metaphorical comparison between ethics and aesthetics.  Rather beauty and goodness are “one and the same” (The Moralists III.ii, p. 320) such that moral or mental beauty turns out to be more fundamental than physical beauty.  Beauty, Shaftesbury argues, is primarily a property of souls or minds, not of bodies at all: “the beautifying not the beautified, is the really beautiful” (Moralists III.ii, p. 322).   When we judge a body to be beautiful we are really judging the act of designing and creating the body to be beautiful.  Shaftesbury argues for this conclusion by pointing out that when we say a statue is beautiful, we aren’t admiring the “matter” (the marble or bronze or whatever) but the “art and design” which Shaftesbury calls “the form or forming power.”

Yet terms like “design” and “form” can be either nouns or verbs.  That is, we can speak either of the form of an object or the act of forming the object.  Shaftesbury concludes, “Here therefore is double beauty. For here is both the form, the effect of mind, and mind itself.” (Moralists III.ii, p. 323)  He calls the passive objects “dead forms … which bear a fashion and are formed, whether by man or nature, but have no forming power, no action or intelligence,” and he calls the active subjects variously “living forms,” “forming forms,” or “the forms which form, that is, which have intelligence, action and operation.”

Thus Shaftesbury distinguishes two distinct “degrees or orders of beauty” before going on to argue for a third order of beauty “which forms not only such as we call mere forms but even the forms which form” (Moralists III.ii, p. 323-4). Hence we have these three orders of beauty:  first the dead forms, second the forming forms, and third the “supreme and sovereign beauty.” If the first order of beauty is the form of the object in the sense of the object’s design, then the second order of beauty is the active mental subject capable of creating this sort of intelligent design. In other words, the second order of beauty is the human mind itself which, through its intelligent creativity, imposes ordered design on the matter.  But, while the mind is a forming power which gives form to the body, at the same time the mind has its own form which is given to it by its participation in the divine Mind, “the principle, source, and fountain of all beauty” (Moralists III.ii, p. 324). Thus the three forms or orders of beauty seem to be natural beauty, moral beauty, and the beauty of God.

Following ancient Stoicism, Shaftesbury thinks of the world as a unified organism infused by the immanent living “soul” or “mind” of God without which even the natural world would be dead and hence could not be beautiful.  God (“the universal and sovereign Genius”) is a “uniting principle” which makes individual parts of nature into a system, a living organism directed to a teleological end (Moralists III.i, p. 301). Nature, then, is not simply a “mere body, a mass of modified matter,” but is a rationally structured “whole” which constitutes a “self” or mind whose body is the world (Moralists III.i, p. 302-3).

The teleological element of this view is emphasized when Shaftesbury describes his vision of an ever-widening system of interconnectedness.  Shaftesbury starts with the concept of an ordered system:  “Whatever things have order, the same have unity of design and concur in one, are parts constituent of one whole or are, in themselves, entire systems” (The Moralists II.iv, p. 274).  In other words, the concept of order is teleological: a system has order insofar as its parts are aimed at a single end.  Organisms and artifacts are examples of this sort of system: “Such is a tree with all its branches, an animal with all its members, and edifice with all its exterior and interior ornaments” (ibid.).  Just as the parts of a human artifact, such as a piece of architecture, are designed so as to form a unified whole, the parts of a plant or animal are also interconnected in such a way as to form a complete system.   Thus something forms a system if its parts are not “independent but all apparently united … according to one simple, consistent and uniform design” (ibid.).  For example, this sort of “mutual dependency of things” can be seen “in any dissected animal, plant or flower where [even] he who is no anatomist nor versed in natural history sees that the many parts have a relation to the whole, for thus much even a slight view affords” (The Moralists II.iv, p. 275).

But individual organisms are only relatively self-sufficient.  Their parts are internally united, but at the same time organisms are externally united to other organisms.  As Shaftesbury puts it in the Inquiry:

If therefore, in the structure of this or any other animal, there be anything which points beyond himself and by which he is plainly discovered to have relation to some other being or nature besides his own, then will this animal undoubtedly be esteemed a part of some other system. (Inquiry I.ii.2, p. 168).

So, for example, human organisms, especially as infants, are “helpless, weak, and infirm” and are thus inherently (“purposely, and not by accident”) “rational and sociable” such that humanity “can no otherwise increase or subsist than in that social intercourse and community which is his natural state” (The Moralists II.iv, p. 283). Likewise the human species is dependent on other species of plants and animals for their survival just as, for example, “to the existence of the spider that of the fly is absolutely necessary,” showing that each individual species is “in general, a part only of some other system,” namely “the system of all animals” (Inquiry I.ii.2, p. 168).

Thus human organisms form a system called a community.  Likewise, all human communities form the human species (“the system of his kind”), which fits into a certain ecosystem of the planet Earth, which has its ordered place in the universe as a whole.  Thus Shaftesbury concludes, “all things in this world are united” (The Moralists II.iv, p. 274).

For Shaftesbury, this cosmic order has moral implications.  If man is an ordered system of parts, then “there must be somewhere a last or ultimate end in man” (Regimen, p. 48).  Because human beings have instinctive “dispositions of mind such as plainly refer to a species and society, and to the enjoyment of converse, mutual alliance, and friendship, then is the end of man society” (Regimen, p. 48-9; cf. the similar argument at Inquiry II.i, p. 167).

The virtues (things such as “integrity, justice, faith” etc.) are those character traits which allow us to live in society with other humans thereby fulfilling our “end.”  Therefore the virtues are “part of a man, as he is a man” (Regimen, p. 50) – they allow us to be fully human and to “live according to nature” (Regimen p. 52).

In this way, the natural order grounds the normativity of individual moral beauty.  Following classical Platonic and Stoic sources Shaftesbury holds that everything else is beautiful to the degree that it works in harmony with the supreme beauty of providential design (The Moralists II.iii, p. 277).  Thus there is a “nature upon which the world depends, and … every genius else must be subordinate to that one good genius” (Moralists III.i, p. 300).

While the supreme beauty can serve as a standard to ground the particular choices of particular minds, it is not a subjectively chosen standard.  It is the objective ordering of the universe. For Shaftesbury beauty in general is a proper ordering between the parts of something according to the universal natural rules of harmony and proportion.  Therefore a viewer’s subjective failure to judge the proper objective value of this ordering does not diminish its value.  This value is a “symmetry and proportion founded still in nature” (Soliloquy III.iii, p. 157-8).  And when “we are reconciled to the goodly order of the universe” by developing beautiful souls “we harmonize with nature and live in friendship with God and man” (Moralists III.iii, p. 334). It is this harmonious relationship to the natural order that Shaftesbury calls moral beauty.

In summary, beauty, whether of a body or a soul, is grounded in an objective standard of order – namely the mind of God as expressed in the natural order.  At the highest level this order is the “supreme beauty” of God which guides God’s own creation of the natural order and which we in turn imitate when we bring order to our bodies, souls, or artworks.

c. Moral Sense

In his essay Sensus Communis, Shaftesbury argues for an understanding of “common sense” as a sense of the common good (Sensus Communis III.1-2, 48-53). Shaftesbury finds a predecessor in the Roman tradition which followed Marcus Aurelius’s coining of the term koinonoemosune to describe the same sort of sense of the common good (Sensus Communis III.1, 48n19).  This notion of the common good recalls the distinction between one’s “private good” and one’s “real good” which Shaftesbury draws in his essay An Inquiry Concerning Virtue or Merit. The private good or “self-interest” is the “end” or “interest” which is “right” for an individual of one’s species and toward which the natural affections point when they are not “ill.”  And the real good or “virtue” is the end in which one’s private good harmonizes with the common good of one’s species as a whole (Inquiry I.II.1, p. 167).  Note that pursuing one’s private good is not necessarily selfish.  In fact, for Shaftesbury, pursuing one’s private good is necessary, natural, and therefore good (insofar as it does not conflict with the public good).  “Selfishness” is not just any regard for one’s private good, but an “immoderate” one which is “inconsistent with the interest of the species or public” (Inquiry I.II.2, p. 170).

Shaftesbury emphasizes the importance of one’s relation to society when he says that a creature is “nowise” good (that is, neither “privately” nor “really” good) if it is naturally part of a “system” but is either detached from the system or harms that system (Inquiry I.II.1, p. 168).  Recall, as discussed above, that a human’s most immediate “system” is society. In this way the sensus communis becomes a necessary component in Shaftesbury’s ethics.  On Shaftesbury’s view, for any action to be considered good, the agent must be moved to action by an affection for the good of the system: one can only be “supposed good when the good or ill of the system to which he has relation is the immediate object of some passion or affection moving him” (Inquiry I.II.1, p. 169).  According to Shaftesbury, then, we could not have an affection toward the common good if we didn’t somehow represent the common good to ourselves.  And it is the sensus communis which allows us to do that. Shaftesbury is clear that it is not enough that our actions be in fact aimed at the common good though still inwardly motivated by self-interest: “as soon as he has come to have any affection towards what is morally good and can like or affect such good for its own sake, as good and amiable in itself, then is he in some degree good and virtuous, and not till then” (Inquiry I.iii.3, p. 188).  To be virtuous, an action must be aimed at the common good because we recognize that it is the common good and have an affection toward it as such.  Thus a truly virtuous and good creature is “one as by the natural temper or bent of his affections is carried primarily and immediately, and not secondarily and accidentally, to good and against ill” (Inquiry I.ii.2, 171).  Shaftesbury thinks this affection toward the good of one’s species is natural and common to every member of the species.  Thus a virtuous action “ought by right” to have as its “real motive” the natural affection for one’s species.

Being motivated by an affection toward the common good is, however, only a necessary, not a sufficient, condition for being virtuous. While anything can be good under Shaftesbury’s definition, only a human being can be virtuous.  This is because virtue requires a “reflected sense” (that is, the ability to reflect on what is good and right) which requires a high degree of reason.  Shaftesbury says:

But to proceed from what is esteemed mere goodness and lies within the reach and capacity of all sensible creatures, to that which is called virtue or merit and is allowed to man only: In a creature capable of forming general notions of things, not only the outward beings which offer themselves to the sense are the objects of affection, but the very actions themselves and the affections of pity, kindness, gratitude and their contraries, being brought into the mind by reflection, become objects. So that, by means of this reflected sense, there arises another kind of affection towards those very affections themselves, which have been already felt and have now become the subject of a new liking or dislike. (Inquiry I.ii.3, p. 172)

The view seems to be that the sensus communis shows us what is good for our species and we naturally “approve” of that good and have an “affection” towards it, thereby motivating us to act.  Those actions are individually good which are motivated by an affection toward the good of the whole. Then our “reflected sense” gives us a “new affection” towards the motives which result in good actions.   On the next page Shaftesbury refers to this “reflected sense” as a “sense of right and wrong” which he defines as “a sentiment or judgment of what is done through just, equal and good affection or the contrary” (Inquiry I.ii.3, p. 173).  The notion of the moral sentiments, as Shaftesbury employs it, presupposes the existence of the sensus communis.  A properly functioning person is already motivated by the right affections as represented by the sensus communis, and then our moral sentiment (our “sense of right and wrong”) confirms that those are in fact the right motivations by giving us a higher-order “feeling,” “affection,” or “sentiment” of which actions are done by the right affections. In other words, moral sentiment is a second-order affection toward the “right” first-order affections. Note that, while Shaftesbury also talks as if not only first-order affections but also actions, tempers, etc., can be the objects of the moral affection, it must be remembered that for Shaftesbury no action or temper is truly good or virtuous unless it is motivated by affection for the common good.  In sum, after the sensus communis determines the moral action and motivates us to pursue it as good, then moral sentiment approves of what the common sense tells us via a feeling of affection and thereby motivates us to pursue it as virtuous.

It is important to notice here that, while Shaftesbury refers to our moral sentiments as our “conscience” and even as our “sense of right and wrong,” he is not trying to establish a “moral sense” as a distinct mental “faculty” for receiving moral ideas.  As D.D. Raphael notes, “the casual application of the word ‘sense’ to the moral faculty is hardly more significant in Shaftesbury than it is in Samuel Clarke, who was a severe rationalist” (The Moral Sense, p. 16). We talk of a “sense of purpose,” a “sense of urgency,” a “sense of adventure,” a “sense of humor,” etc.   Sometimes we even speak of morally relevant “senses” such as a “sense of decency,” a “sense of shame,” a “sense of duty,” etc.  But we don’t mean to suggest that any of these “senses” ought to be thought of as analogous to the physical senses or that they are special mental faculties metaphysically distinct from our ordinary mental faculties.  Likewise, Shaftesbury’s use of the phrase “sense of right and wrong” is simply a figure of speech.  He thought we used our ordinary faculties of thinking, feeling, and desiring to make moral judgments.

Shaftesbury sometimes seems to suggest that moral judgment is instinctive, yet this is not his considered view. For example, in the dialogue titled The Moralists, A Philosophical Rhapsody, Shaftesbury seems to advance the claim that our sense of beauty is innate: “Nothing surely is more strongly imprinted on our minds or more closely interwoven with our souls than the idea or sense of order and proportion” (The Moralists II.4, p. 273-4).   In this context, Shaftesbury is specifically talking about natural beauty, but, as we have seen above, moral beauty is a function of one’s relationship to the natural order.  Shaftesbury notes that we can easily tell the difference between a structure created by an architect and a mere “heap of sand and stones” and claims that “this difference is immediately perceived by a plain internal sensation.”  The source of this sensation seems to be the common sense.  In the Sensus Communis essay, Shaftesbury argues that true beauty in art requires the artist to submit the “particulars” of the artwork “to the general design” and make “all things subservient to that which is principal” (Sensus Communis IV.3, p. 66), adding that “common sense (according to just philosophy) judges of those works which want the justness of a whole and show their author, however curious and exact in particulars, to be in the main a very bungler” (Sensus Communis IV.3, p. 67). Hence it is the common sense (or “sense of beauty” as he calls it in The Moralists) which discerns “order and proportion” so that taste can approve or disapprove of them.

Now, Shaftesbury seems to think this ability of common sense to detect beauty is innate.  When we perceive an object or action we immediately (“straight”) distinguish the beautiful from the ugly (The Moralists III.2, p. 326),  Similarly, he says in the Inquiry that the mind “cannot be without .. nor can it withhold” judgments of moral taste, and he compares the functioning of the moral faculty to the functioning of a bodily organ:  “this affection of a creature towards the good of the species or common nature is as proper and natural to him as it is to any organ, part or member of an animal body, or mere vegetable, to work in its known course and regular way of growth” (Inquiry II.I.1, 192). But these statements are misleading in isolation.

By this point in The Moralists, Shaftesbury has already observed that taste requires cultivation: “How long before a true taste is gained! How many things shocking, how many offensive at first, which afterwards are known and acknowledge the highest beauties! For it is not instantly we acquire the sense by which these beauties are discoverable” (The Moralists III. 2, p. 320).  Shaftesbury also says (following the Cambridge Platonists) that the affection for and knowledge of the good can be lost by vice: “contrary habit and custom (a second nature) is able to displace” even the most natural instincts (Inquiry I.III.1, 179).  Likewise in the Miscellaneous Reflections, Shaftesbury writes that “a legitimate and just taste can neither be begotten, made, conceived or produced without the antecedent labour and pains of criticism” (Miscellany III.2, p. 408).

If anything about the sensus communis or moral taste is innate, it is the potential to develop good taste.  Everyone is born with these faculties.  But everyone must be educated in how to use them.  Moral taste is a natural faculty but it is also a cultivated faculty.  Elsewhere Shafesbury argues that though “good rustics who have been bred remote from the formed societies of men” might have been “so happily formed by nature herself that, with the greatest simplicity or rudeness of education, they have still something of a natural grace and comliness in their action,” it is nevertheless “undeniable, however, that the perfection of grace and comliness of action and behavior can be found only among the people of a liberal education” since such perfection requires knowledge of “those particular rules of art which philosophy alone exhibits” (Soliloquy I.3 p. 85-7). So virtue must be cultivated like good taste in art or wine.  Only then can one act “from his nature, in a manner necessarily and without reflection” (Sensus Communis IV.1, p. 60).

In summary, our moral sense is a not a special instinctive faculty, but an innate potential to approve of certain actions that must be activated by good education in society. Once we have been trained in the art of sociable conversation, our moral sense will inevitably approve of those actions which are motivated by the teleological good of society as a whole.

d. Personal Identity

In his essay Soliloquy Shaftesbury describes moral reasoning through the mechanism of conscience as requiring the agent to partition herself into multiple voices (or “selves”) in order to engage in fruitful internal discussion on the model of a Socratic dialogue.  Soliloquy, he says, is a kind of “self-dissection” in which an individual “becomes two distinct persons” in order to “be his own subject” of advice and edification (Soliloquy I.i, p. 72).  He calls “this method of soliloquy” an “art” or “regimen” which is “practiced” by “all great wits,” especially by “the poet and philosopher” and even “the orator” (Soliloquy I.i, p. 73).

Here soliloquy means something like the examination of conscience.  The point of dividing oneself into two dialogue partners is to achieve the kind of consensus that results from rational discussion (Soliloquy I.ii, p. 77).  We reflect within ourselves and notice that we are of two minds about something (we “discover a certain duplicity of soul”).  Then we discuss the issue with ourselves until we bring the two views into dialectical agreement.  In this way we achieve integrity and self-unity within our mind (we “make us agree with ourselves and be of a piece within”).  In aesthetic terms, we are trying to bring our soul into harmony with itself.

For Shaftesbury, the purpose of soliloquy is not only self-creation, but also preparation for public discourse.  It is significant that the full title of the essay is Soliloquy, or Advice to an Author, an “author” being one who “publishes” (makes public) his “meditations” (private thoughts). Shaftesbury’s advice is that we test our thoughts by the method of soliloquy before we presume to share them: “so that, unless the party has been used to play the critic thoroughly upon himself, he will hardly be found proof against the criticisms of others” (Soliloquy I.i, p. 76).  What is significant here is that public edification is the assumed goal of philosophical thinking.

However, prior to public discourse, we must endeavor to construct a coherent self through the method of soliloquy.  “Our thoughts,” says Shaftesbury, “have generally such an obscure implicit language that it is the hardest thing in the world to make them speak out distinctly. For this reason, the right method is to give them voice and accent” (Soliloquy I.ii, p. 78).  By the method of giving voice to our thoughts here, Shaftesbury has in mind the “meditations, occasional reflections, solitary thoughts or other such exercises as come under the notion of this self-discoursing practice” (Soliloquy I.i, p. 74) that make up his own private notebooks which he labeled Askemata (exercises or “regimen”). In his Regimen Shaftesbury applies the practice of dialectical reasoning to his own inner life via the method of soliloquy.

For Shaftesbury, the result of achieving harmony of soul is the construction of a unified “self.”  “It is the known province of philosophy,” Shaftesbury writes, “to teach us ourselves, keep us the self-same person and to regulate our governing fancies, passions and humors as to make us comprehensible to ourselves” (Soliloquy III.i, p. 127).   With regard to the question of the self, Shaftesbury ridicules that “which stands for philosophy in some famous schools,” saying it cannot generate “manners or understanding” because “It pretends indeed some relation to manners as being definitive of the natures, essences and properties of spirits” (Soliloquy III.i, p. 128).   In other words, scholastic philosophy confuses an accidental property (a “relationship”) of the self with an essential one.  It does this by “defining ‘material’ and ‘immaterial substances’ and distinguishing their properties and modes” as if this were “the right manner of proceeding in the discovery of our own natures” (Soliloquy III.i, p. 129-130).  This focus on the metaphysics of “modes and substances” is, however, “beside the mark and reaches nothing we can truly call our interest or concern.”  It does not tell us who we really are (Soliloquy III.i, p. 130).  The scholastics make the same mistake as a person who attempts to understand the nature of a watch by asking “of what metal or what matter each part was composed” rather than “what the real use was of such an instrument or by what movements its end was best attained and its perfection acquired” (Soliloquy III.i, p. 131).  Likewise, the philosopher engaged in metaphysical speculation has “considered not the real operation or energy of his subject, nor contemplated the man as real man and as a human agent, but as a watch or common machine” (ibid).

Shaftesbury argues that true self-knowledge comes from the study of the passions. This is because I am my passions:  “These passions, according as they have the ascendancy in me and differ in proportion with one another, affect my character and make me different with respect to myself and others” (Soliloquy III.i, p. 132).  My character or self is a function of my passions, and that character is the real me, not the material (or immaterial) substance that my passions are made out of (or inhere in).  Were my “passions, affections, and opinions” to change radically enough, then I would become a different self, even if, contra Locke, I retained in my “memory the faint marks or tokens of former transactions” (Soliloquy III.i, p. 127).  This is because my passions are aimed at what I take to be my happiness (Soliloquy III.i, p 132).  And, as the teleological end of my life, my happiness is what makes me who I am.

True philosophy, then, is the kind of self-reflection which makes known to an agent what her passions are aimed at so that she can bring them into harmony with one another and thereby construct a coherent self.  Until I can understand my own passions (“ascertain my ideas”) and control them (“keep my opinion, liking and esteem of things the same” from moment to moment), I will remain “the same mystery to myself as ever” (Soliloquy III.i, p. 134), regardless of the truth of my metaphysical arguments.

The problem of an incoherent self arises primarily, in Shaftesbury’s view, when we define our lives in pursuit of pleasure.  Pleasure is not stable, since pleasure comes from a variety of sources and the pursuit of pleasure demands a constant search for new sources, for “when we follow pleasure merely, we are disgusted and change from one sort to another, condemning that at one time which at another we earnestly approve, and never judging equally of happiness while we follow passion and mere humor” (Soliloquy III.ii, p. 138).  What we need is a “rule of good” which can “control my fancy and fix it, if possible, on something which may hold good” (ibid).  This is what Shaftesbury finds in the “honest pleasure” of moral beauty, the honestum which is both attractive and right.

Only the “pleasure of society” is “constant” enough to ground a coherent self, enabling me to “bring my other pleasures to correspond and be friends with it” (Soliloquy III.ii, p. 139).  Thus, “when I employ my affection in friendly and social actions, I find I can sincerely enjoy myself” without risking the kind of self-dissolution which comes from pursuit of self-interested pleasures (Soliloquy III.ii, p. 138).  Shaftesbury argues the pleasure I receive from moral affection is derived via sympathy (“by communication, a receiving it, as it were, by reflection”) from your enjoyment of my actions (Inquiry II.ii.1, p. 204).  In the Inquiry Shaftesbury argues that human beings have natural affections for the good of society, and we cannot flourish as human beings unless we live in society and develop the virtues which allow us to live according to our nature.  Thus we are not fully human if we are cut off from a sympathetic relationship with a community. What Shaftesbury adds in Soliloquy is to draw out the implication that we can only construct a self-identity on the basis of sympathetic pleasure.  In this way we construct our identities out of our social interactions with others.

Thus Shaftesbury’s account of self-construction is essentially intersubjective and dialectical.  It involves at least soliloquy if not actual interpersonal dialogue.  Since it is often difficult to know what our true passions and opinions are, we need talk therapy (a “vocal looking-glass”) in the form of dialogue or soliloquy: “Our thoughts have generally such an obscure implicit language that it is the hardest thing in the world to make them speak out distinctly. For this reason, the right method is to give them voice and accent” (Soliloquy I.ii, p. 78).

Shaftesbury’s own dialogue The Moralists seems to be an example of this process since both characters in the dialogue present Shaftesburian viewpoints and help each other come to the truth (see Prince, p. 69). Indeed the assembled text of the Characteristics itself expresses this view through its literary structure.   The Moralists is explicitly a dialogue.  The treatise Soliloquy, or Advice to an Author, as its title implies, is an internal dialogue in which Shaftesbury is addressing himself.  The Miscellaneous Reflections on the Preceding Treatises and Other Critical Subjects, Shaftesbury’s self-commentary, written in the third-person, are in effect an extended soliloquy that can be read as a dialogue between Shaftesbury the literary critic and Shaftesbury the philosopher.  In this light we can see that even the (seemingly) ordinary philosophical treatise An Inquiry Concerning Virtue or Merit takes on a dialogical character.  Not only does the author of the Inquiry show up as a character in The Moralists (see II.3, p. 265), the Inquiry itself, when read in the overall context of the other more obviously dialogical works of the Characteristics and thus located amidst a series of overheard conversations, begins to read like an overheard scholastic-style philosophy lecture.

None of the individual treatises of the Characteristics is written unambiguously in Shaftesbury’s own voice. The character of “Shaftesbury,” the author of Characteristics of Men, Manners, Opinions, Times, emerges only as the harmonious unity of the other voices. In this way, the structure of Shaftesbury’s work as a whole is an embodiment of intersubjective reasoning.  The truth of Shaftesbury’s philosophy is the product of a (metaphorical) community of persons reasoning together through (simulated) interpersonal dialogue.  He is trying to achieve what he says Plato achieved in his Socratic dialogues: “they exhibited [real characters and manners] alive and set the countenances and complexions of men plainly in view. And by this means they not only taught us to know others, but, what was principal and of highest virtue in them, they taught us to know ourselves” (Soliloquy I.iii, p. 87).

5. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Texts

  • Shaftesbury, Anthony Ashley Cooper, Third Earl of. Characteristics of Men, Manners, Opinions, Times, ed. Lawrence E. Klein (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1999) [Cited by treatise title, part, section, and page number.]
  • Shaftesbury, Anthony Ashley Cooper, Third Earl of. The Life, Unpublished Letters, and Philosophical Regimen of Anthony, Earl of Shaftesbury, ed. Benjamin Rand (Macmillan, 1900)
  • Shaftesbury, Anthony Ashley Cooper, Third Earl of. Second Characters or the Language of Forms, ed. Benjamin Rand (Cambridge University Press, 1914)

b. Secondary Texts

  • Secondary Texts
  • Aldridge, A.O. “Shaftesbury and the Deist Manifesto” Transactions of the American Philosophical Society, new series 41:2 (June, 1951)
  • Bernstein, John Andrew. Shaftesbury, Rousseau and Kant: An Introduction to the Conflict between Aesthetic and Moral Values in Modern Thought (Rutherford: Fairlegh Dickinson, 1980)
  • Cassirer, Ernst. The Platonic Renaissance in England, trans. James P. Pettegrove. (Austin: University of Texas Press, 1953)
  • Darwall, Stephen. The British Moralists and the Internal ‘Ought’ (Cambridge University Press, 1995)
  • Den Uyl, Douglas J. “Shaftesbury and the Modern Problem of Virtue” Social Philosophy and Policy 15:1 (Winter 1998)
  • Gill, Michael. The British Moralists on Human Nature and the Birth of Secular Ethics (Cambridge, 2006)
  • Grean, Stanley. Shaftesbury’s Philosophy of Religion and Ethics (Ohio University Press, 1967)
  • Klein, Lawrence E. Shaftesbury and the Culture of Politeness: Moral Discourse and Cultural Politics in Early Eighteenth-Century England (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1994)
  • Lawrence E. Klein, ‘Cooper, Anthony Ashley, third earl of Shaftesbury (1671–1713)’, Oxford Dictionary of National Biography, Oxford University Press, 2004; online edn, Jan 2008,
  • Prince, Michael. Philosophical Dialogue in the British Enlightenment (Cambridge, 1996)
  • Raphael, D.D. The Moral Sense (Oxford University Press, 1947)
  • Rivers, Isabel. Reason, Grace, and Sentiment: A Study of the Language of Religion and Ethics in England, 1660-1780, Vol. II: Shaftesbury to Hume. (Cambridge University Press, 2000)
  • Schneewind, J.B. The Invention of Autonomy (Cambridge, 1998)
  • Voitle, Robert. The Third Earl of Shaftesbury, 1671-1713 (Louisiana State University Press, 1984)
  • Winkler, Kenneth P. “‘All is Revolution in Us’: Personal Identity in Shaftesbury and Hume” Hume Studies 26:1 (April, 2000)

Author Information

John McAteer
Houston Baptist University
U. S. A.

Last updated: July 29, 2011 | Originally published: