Al-Shahrastānī (d. A.H. 548 / C.E. 1153) was an influential historian of religions and a heresiographer. He was one of the pioneers in developing a scientific approach to the study of religions. Al-Shahrastānī’ distinguished himself by his desire to describe in the most objective way the universal religious history of humanity. He was wrongly recognized as an “Ash‘arite” theologian; this is why some scholars such as Muhammad Ridā Jalālī Nā’īnī, Muhammad Taqī Dānish-Pazhūh, Wilferd Madelung, Jean Jolivet, and Guy Monnot firmly believe that he was an Ismā‘īlī who was practicing taqiyya (religious dissimulation) since Ismā‘īlis were persecuted during that time. Very few things are known about al-Shahrastānī’s life. He was born in A.H. 479/ C.E. 1086 in the town of Shahristān (Republic of Turkmenistan) where he acquired his early traditional education. Later, he was sent to Nīshāpūr where he studied under different masters who were all disciples of the Ash‘arite theologian al-Juwaynī (d. A.H. 478 / C.E. 1085). At the age of 30, al-Shahrastānī went to Baghdad to pursue theological studies and taught for three years at the prestigious Ash‘arite school, the Nizāmiyya. Afterwards, he returned to Persia where he worked as Nā’ib (Deputy) of the chancellery for Sanjar, the Saljūq ruler of Khurāsān. At the end of his life, al-Shahrastānī went back to live in his native town.
During the ‘Abbasid Caliphate (A.H. 132/ C.E. 750 – A.H. 656/ C.E. 1258), the golden age of Islamic literature, many schools elaborated their major works of medieval Islamic thought. Shi‘ism has particularly influenced the destiny of Islam in the political and, even more so, the philosophical domain. Isma‘ilism belongs to the Shi‘ite mainstream of Islam. From the beginning, Islam was divided mainly into two groups: the Sunnites and the Shi‘ites. The Sunnites believe that Prophet Muhammad did not explicitly name a Successor after his death. The Shi‘ites affirm, on the contrary, that Muhammad explicitly designated ‘Ali as the first Imam (divine Guide) and his direct descendants as successors. According to Muslim tenets, Muhammad was the last Prophet, the one who closed the Prophetic cycle. The Shi‘ites maintain that humanity still needs a spiritual Guide, therefore the cycle of Prophecy must be succeeded by the cycle of Imama. The prerogative of the Imam is to give the right interpretation of the Qur’an and to gradually reveal its esoteric meaning.
Al-Shahrastani was certainly not an Ash’arite theologian, as has often been argued, even if he borrows some basic concepts shared commonly by various Muslim thinkers. Al-Shahrastani is a difficult person to evaluate because he juggled many different philosophical and theological vocabularies. He was a clever thinker, demonstrated by the intricacies of many traditions and the Shi‘ite notion of the Guide found in his thoughts. Al-Shahrastani had many reasons to speak somewhat allegorically. He was a very subtle author who often spoke indirectly by means of symbols. He preferred his own personal vocabulary to the traditional one. For this reason, his position is hard to determine. It may well be that ideological considerations led him to speak indirectly; he perhaps assumed those familiar with the symbols would be able to unravel his elusive ideas. For all these reasons, many scholars who have studied al-Shahrastani were misled concerning his religious identity. (For an extensive discussion of al-Shahrastānī’s identity as Ash‘arite or Ismā‘īlī, cf. Steigerwald, 1997: 298-307.)
The richness and originality of al-Shahrastani’s philosophical and theological thought is manifested in his major works. The Kitab al-Milal wa al-Nihal (The Book of Sects and Creeds), a monumental work, presents the doctrinal points of view of all the religions and philosophies which existed up to his time. The Nihayat al-aqdam fi ‘ilm al-kalam (The End of Steps in the Science of Theology) presents different theological discussions and shows the limits of Muslim theology (kalam). The Majlis is a discourse, written during the mature period of his life, delivered to a Twelver Shi‘ite audience. The Musara‘at al-Falasifa (The Struggle with Philosophers) criticizes Avicenna’s doctrines by emphasizing some peculiar Isma‘ili arguments on the division of beings. The Mafatih al-Asrar wa-masabih al-abrar (The Keys of the Mysteries and the Lamps of the Righteous) introduces the Qur’an and gives a complete commentary of the first two chapters of the Qur’an.
As opposed to Ash’arites, al-Shahrastani presents a gradation in the creation (khalq). He gives a definition of the Prophetic Impeccability (‘Isma) opposed to the Ash‘arite tradition, maintaining that it subsists in the Prophet as part of his real nature. As did al-Ghazzali, al-Shahrastani harshly criticizes Avicenna’s Necessary Being who knows the universal but not the particular. Al-Shahrastani, particularly in the Musara‘a al-Falasifa, has an Isma‘ili conception of the Originator (Mubdi‘) beyond Being and non-Being. He argues convincingly for the existence of Divine Attributes, but he does not ascribe them directly to God. True worship means Tawhid – declaring the Unicity of God. This includes the negation of all attributes which humans give to God, the Ultimate One who is totally transcendent. God is Unknowable, Indefinable, Unattainable, and above human comprehension.
As for the theory of creation, in the Nihaya, al-Shahrastani insists that God is the only Creator and the only Agent. He also develops a different interpretation of ex-nihilo creation which does not mean creation out of nothing, but creation made only by God. (al-Shahrastani, 1934: 18-9) But in the Majlis and the Mafatih al-Asrar, the angels play a dominant role in the physical creation. (al-Shahrastani, 1998: 82; 1989, vol. I: 109 verso line 24 to 110 recto line 1) His theory of the Divine Word (Kalima) has a convincing Isma’ili imprint; for example, his hierarchy of angels and Divine Words (Kalimat ) are conceived as being the causes of spiritual beings. Al-Shahrastani in the Nihaya writes:
“that his [Divine] Command (Amr) is pre-existent and his multiple Kalimat are eternal. By his Command, Kalimat become the manifestation of it. Spiritual beings are the manifestation of Kalimat and bodies are the manifestation of spiritual beings. The Ibda’ (Origination beyond time and space) and khalq (physical creation) become manifested [respectively in] spiritual beings and bodies. As for Kalimat and letters (huruf), they are eternal and pre-existent. Since his Command is not similar to our command, his Kalimat and his letters are not similar to our Kalimat . Since letters are elements of Kalimat which are the causes of spiritual beings who govern corporeal beings; all existence subsists in the Kalimat Allah preserved in his Command.” (al-Shahrastani, 1934: 316)
In the Majlis, al-Shahrastani divides the creation into two worlds: the spiritual world (i.e. the world of the Origination of spirits (Ibda’-i arwah)) in an achieved (mafrugh) state) and the world of physical creation (khalq) in becoming (musta’naf). He shares an Isma‘ili cosmology in which God has built his religion in the image of creation.
The conception of Prophecy developed in the Nihaya is closer to that of Isma’ilis and Falasifa (Islamic philosophers) than to Ash‘arites, because al-Shahrastani establishes a logical link between miracles and Prophetic Impeccability (‘Isma). For al-Shahrastani, the proof of veracity (sidq) of the Prophet is intrinsic to his nature and is related to his Impeccability. (Al-Shahrastani, 1934: 444-5) He develops the concept of cyclical time explicitly in the Milal, the Majlis, and the Mafatih and implicitly in the Nihaya. In the Majlis, his understanding of the dynamic evolution of humanity is similar to Isma‘ilism, in which each Prophet opens a new cycle. Al-Shahrastani recovers the mythical Qur’anic story of Moses and the Servant of God inspired by Al-Risala al-Mudhhiba of al-qadi al-Nu‘man (d. A.H. 363 / C.E. 974).
Al-Shahrastani was an able and learned man of great personal charm. The real nature of his thought is best referred to by the term theosophy, in the older sense of “divine wisdom”. However, al-Shahrastani was certainly not totally against theology or philosophy, even if he was very harsh against the theologians and the philosophers. As he explained in the Majlis, in order to remain on the right path, one must preserve a perfect equilibrium between intellect (‘aql) and audition (sam‘). A philosopher or a theologian must use his intellect until he reaches the rational limit. Beyond this limit, he must listen to the teaching of Prophets and Imams.
His works reflect a complex interweaving of intellectual strands, and his thought is a synthesis of this fruitful historical period. In his conception of God, Creation, Prophecy, and Imama, al Shahrastani adopted many doctrinal elements that are reconcilable with Nizari Isma’ilism. The necessity of a Guide, belonging both to the spiritual and the physical world, is primordial in his scheme since the Imam is manifested in this physical world.
California State University – Long Beach
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Last updated: October 14, 2004 | Originally published: