Abu Ya‘qub al-Sijistani was first and foremost a member of the Ismaili underground mission — the da‘wa, as it is known in Arabic — that operated in the Iranian province of Khurasan and Sijistan during the tenth century. In the later part of his life, al-Sijistani was or had become a supporter of the Fatimids imams, then ruling from their headquarters far away in North Africa.Al-Sijistani was deeply inspired by Neoplanotism. His cosmology and metaphysics develop a concept of God as the one beyond both being and non-being. God is not a substance, not intellect, nor within the categories that pertain to the created universe in any way. Intellect is the first existent being, originated by God as an indivisible whole.
In contrast to many other Islamic philosophers, al-Sijistani insists that intellect does not divide or separate. The intellect remains a whole and is universal. Only one intellect engenders by procession the soul. The soul falls therefore on its higher side within the lower horizon of intellect whereas its own lower aspect is nature, a semi-hypostatic being between the spiritual and the physical realm. The goal of religion and prophecy is to reorient the soul toward its true higher self and ultimately to return to its original state.
Abu Ya‘qub al-Sijistani was first and foremost a member of the Ismaili underground mission — the da‘wa, as it is known in Arabic — that operated in the Iranian province of Khurasan and Sijistan during the tenth century. His activities and the works he wrote must be seen in that context; he was a partisan of a specific religious and political cause that involved the restoration of Shi‘ism as the dominant force in the Islamic world of the time. In addition al-Sijistani was an important advocate of philosophical doctrines that drew heavily on a current of Neoplatonism then circulating in intellectual circles of various kinds in the major centers of Islamic scholarship. For the latter reason in general and for his clear attachment in his philosophical writings to a fairly pure form of this branch of ancient thought, he earned an important place in the history of philosophy, even though he himself would have insisted that he was not a philosopher.
Although he is mentioned both in Ismaili and non-Ismaili sources, the amount of information about his life that survives is scarcely adequate. Two important details emerge from one of his late works: he was in Baghdad in the year 934 having just then returned from the pilgrimage to Mecca, and in about 971 or 972 he composed that treatise itself. Somewhat later he died a martyr. The one additional fact about him is a nickname, ‘Cotton-seed,’ recorded by several observers both in its Arabic and its Persian forms. By the time he wrote (or revised) those works of his that are now extant, al-Sijistani was or had become a supporter of the Fatimids imams, then ruling from their headquarters far away in North Africa. Hints in his own works and other information suggests, however, that he may have earlier belonged to a dissident wing of the Ismaili movement, as was the case with at least two of his philosophical predecessors in Iran. Accordingly, the works he wrote prior to his acceptance of the Fatimids as imams, would have been considered doctrinally false and they, unless revised, were abandoned and thus did not survive.
Those now available are certainly not all complete and one exists solely in a later Persian paraphrase of its original (lost) Arabic. Critical editions and translations are few in number. Moreover, the philosophical content in some works far exceeds that of others. It was al-Sijistani’s custom to assemble his material in a series of, often disconnected, topical chapters and to mix Ismaili doctrinal teachings with philosophy in alternating, but most often not overlapping, short sections. Therefore, his Neoplatonism frequently appears in what he wrote separated — although not always — from his more specifically religious concerns. Thus his philosophical position becomes apparent only in portions of his works, in particular certain chapters of his The Wellsprings, The Keys, Prophecy’s Proof, and Revealing the Concealed. On these titles, their general contents, and the state of modern studies of them, see Paul E. Walker, Abu Ya‘qub al-Sijistani: Intellectual Missionary (London, 1998) especially the appendix.
The Neoplatonic background to al-Sijistani’s thought is fairly complex. Beginning as early as the middle of the preceding century several important texts, or portions of them, were translated from Greek into Arabic, including the widely circulated Theologia, sometimes called the Theology of Aristotle. Others were a longer version of this same Theologia, the Liber de causis, and a doxographical work that goes by the name of the Pseudo-Ammonius. The Theologia contains for the most part passages from Plotinus’s Enneads IV to VI; the Liber de causis depends ultimately on Proclus’s Element of Theology. All of these texts and others were available to the Ismaili philosophers —and other Islamic thinkers — by the beginning of the tenth century. The Islamic world had time by then to digest this material thoroughly and to begin an elaboration of various specific doctrines expressed in it. From his position a generation or so later, al-Sijistani came to Neoplatonism as much from within a nascent Islamic tradition of it as of his own raw confrontation with specific individual Greek (or pseudo-Greek) texts, which his own writings reflect therefore only secondarily.
Nevertheless, the major Neoplatonic influences in the thought of al-Sijistani comprise a cosmology and metaphysics that adhere closely to important doctrines of Plotinus, among them an austerely rigorous concept of God as the one beyond both being and non-being. God is not a substance, not intellect, nor within the categories that pertain to the created universe in any way. Intellect is the first existent being, originated by God as an indivisible whole. It is the source of all else that exists. In contrast to many other Islamic philosophers, al-Sijistani adamantly insists that intellect does not divide or separate. There is only one intellect. It does, however, engender by procession the soul and the latter again remains a whole and is a universal. It does, even so, descend in parts into individual creatures who are thus animated by it. The soul falls therefore on its higher side within the lower horizon of intellect whereas its own lower aspect is nature, a semi-hypostatic being at the point of transition from the spiritual into the physical realm. The goal of religion and of prophecy is to reorient the soul toward its true unblemished higher self and ultimately to have it regain its original sublime existence.
Although the outline of standard Neoplatonic ideas can be observed in al-Sijistani’s thought, there are curiosities that do not seem to belong. One is his doctrine that God creates by willful fiat — that is, by issuing a command to be. Another involves the notion that salvation — the restoration in the soul of its spirituality — is a historical development that runs upward step by step following the course of the cycles of prophetic revelations and the religious laws that each lawgiving-prophet establishes in turn.
Paul E. Walker
The Institute of Ismaili Studies
Last updated: October 14, 2004 | Originally published: