Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Ancient Greek Skepticism

Although all skeptics in some way cast doubt on our ability to gain knowledge of the world, the term “skeptic” actually covers a wide range of attitudes and positions. There are skeptical elements in the views of many Greek philosophers, but the term “ancient skeptic” is generally applied either to a member of Plato’s Academy during its skeptical period (c. 273 B.C.E to 1st century B.C.E.) or to a follower of Pyrrho (c. 365 to 270 B.C.E.). Pyrrhonian skepticism flourished from Aenesidemus’ revival (1st century B.C.E.) to Sextus Empiricus, who lived sometime in the 2nd or 3rd centuries C.E. Thus the two main varieties of ancient skepticism: Academic and Pyrrhonian.

The term “skeptic” derives from a Greek noun, skepsis, which means examination, inquiry, consideration. What leads most skeptics to begin to examine and then eventually to be at a loss as to what one should believe, if anything, is the fact of widespread and seemingly endless disagreement regarding issues of fundamental importance. Many of the arguments of the ancient skeptics were developed in response to the positive views of their contemporaries, especially the Stoics and Epicureans, but these arguments have been highly influential for subsequent philosophers and will continue to be of great interest as long as there is widespread disagreement regarding important philosophical issues.

Nearly every variety of ancient skepticism includes a thesis about our epistemic limitations and a thesis about suspending judgment. The two most frequently made objections to skepticism target these theses. The first is that the skeptic’s commitment to our epistemic limitations is inconsistent. He cannot consistently claim to know, for example, that knowledge is not possible; neither can he consistently claim that we should suspend judgment regarding all matters insofar as this claim is itself a judgment. Either such claims will refute themselves, since they fall under their own scope, or the skeptic will have to make an apparently arbitrary exemption. The second sort of objection is that the alleged epistemic limitations and/or the suggestion that we should suspend judgment would make life unlivable. For, the business of day-to-day life requires that we make choices and this requires making judgments. Similarly, one might point out that our apparent success in interacting with the world and each other entails that we must know some things. Some responses by ancient skeptics to these objections are considered in the following discussion.

(Hankinson [1995] is a comprehensive and detailed examination of ancient skeptical views. See Schmitt [1972] and Popkin [1979] for discussion of the historical impact of ancient skepticism, beginning with its rediscovery in the 16th Century, and Fogelin [1994] for an assessment of Pyrrhonian skepticism in light of contemporary epistemology. The differences between ancient and modern forms of skepticism has been a controversial topic in recent years-see especially, Annas [1986], [1996], Burnyeat [1984], and Bett [1993].)

Table of Contents

  1. Academic vs. Pyrrhonian Skepticism
  2. Academic Skepticism
    1. Arcesilaus
      1. Platonic Innovator
      2. Attack on the Stoics
      3. On Suspending Judgment
      4. Dialectical Interpretation
      5. Practical Criterion: to Eulogon
    2. Carneades
      1. Socratic Dialectic
      2. On Ethical Theory
      3. On the Stoic Sage
      4. On Epistemology
      5. Practical Criterion: to Pithanon
      6. Dialectical Skeptic or Fallibilist?
    3. Philo and Antiochus
    4. Cicero
  3. Pyrrhonian Skepticism
    1. Pyrrho and Timon
    2. Aenesidemus
      1. Revival of Pyrrhonism
      2. The Ten Modes
      3. Tranquility
    3. Sextus Empiricus
      1. General Account of Skepticism
      2. The Path to Skepticism
      3. The Modes of Agrippa
      4. Skepticism vs. Relativism
      5. The Skeptical Life
  4. Skepticism and the Examined Life
  5. Greek and Latin Texts, Commentaries, and Translations
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Academic vs. Pyrrhonian Skepticism

The distinction between Academic and Pyrrhonian skepticism continues to be a controversial topic. In the Second Century C.E., the Roman author Aulus Gellius already refers to this as an old question treated by many Greek writers (Attic Nights 11.5.6, see Striker [1981/1996]). The biggest obstacle to correctly making this distinction is that it is misleading to describe Academic and Pyrrhonian skepticism as distinctly unified views in the first place since different Academics and Pyrrhonists seem to have understood their skepticisms in different ways. So even though the terms Academic and Pyrrhonian are appropriate insofar as there are clear lines of transmission and development of skeptical views that unify each, we should not expect to find a simple account of the distinction between the two.

2. Academic Skepticism

a. Arcesilaus

Following Plato’s death in 347 B.C.E., his nephew Speusippus became head of the Academy. Next in line were Xenocrates, Polemo and Crates. The efforts of the Academics during this period were largely directed towards developing an orthodox Platonic metaphysics. When Crates died (c. 272 B.C.E.) Arcesilaus of Pitane (c. 318 to 243 B.C.E.) became the sixth head of the Academy. Another member of the Academy, Socratides, who was apparently in line for the position, stepped down in favor of Arcesilaus (Diogenes Laertius [DL] 4.32); so it seems he was held in high regard by his predecessors, at least at the time of his appointment. (See Long [1986] for discussion of the life of Arcesilaus.)

i. Platonic Innovator

According to Diogenes Laertius, Arcesilaus was “the first to argue on both sides of a question, and the first to meddle with the traditional Platonic system [or: discourse, logos] and by means of question and answer, to make it more of a debating contest” (4.28, translation after R.D. Hicks).

Diogenes is certainly wrong about Arcesilaus being the first to argue on both sides of a question. This was a long standing practice in Greek rhetoric commonly attributed to the Sophists. But Arcesilaus wasresponsible for turning Plato’s Academy to a form of skepticism. This transition was probably supported by an innovative reading of Plato’s books, which he possessed and held in high regard (DL 4.31).

Diogenes’ remark that Arcesilaus “meddled” with Plato’s system and made it more of a debating contest indicates a critical attitude towards his innovations. Diogenes (or his source) apparently thought that Arcesilaus betrayed the spirit of Platonic philosophy by turning it to skepticism.

Cicero, on the other hand, in an approving tone, reports that Arcesilaus revived the practice of Socrates, which he takes to be the same as Plato’s.

“[Socrates] was in the habit of drawing forth the opinions of those with whom he was arguing, in order to state his own view as a response to their answers. This practice was not kept up by his successors; but Arcesilaus revived it and prescribed that those who wanted to listen to him should not ask him questions but state their own opinions. When they had done so, he argued against them. But his listeners, so far as they could, would defend their own opinion” (de Finibus 2.2, translated by Long and Sedley, 68J, see also de Natura Deorum 1.11).

Arcesilaus had (selectively) derived the lesson from Plato’s dialogues that nothing can be known with certainty, either by the senses or by the mind (de Oratore 3.67, on the topic of Plato and Socrates as proto-skeptics, see Annas [1992], Shields [1994] and Woodruff [1986]). He even refused to accept this conclusion; thus he did not claim to know that nothing could be known (Academica 45).

ii. Attack on the Stoics

In general, the Stoics were the ideal target for the skeptics; for, their confidence in the areas of metaphysics, ethics and epistemology was supported by an elaborate and sophisticated set of arguments. And, the stronger the justification of some theory, the more impressive is its skeptical refutation. They were also an attractive target due to their prominence in the Hellenistic world. Arcesilaus especially targeted the founder of Stoicism, Zeno, for refutation. Zeno confidently claimed not only that knowledge is possible but that he had a correct account of what knowledge is, and he was willing to teach this to others. The foundation of this account is the notion of katalêpsis: a mental grasping of a sense impression that guarantees the truth of what is grasped. If one assents to the proposition associated with a kataleptic impression, i.e. if one experiences katalepsis, then the associated proposition cannot fail to be true. The Stoic sage, as the perfection and fulfillment of human nature, is the one who assents only to kataleptic impressions and thus is infallible.

Arcesilaus argued against the possibility of there being any sense-impressions which we could not be mistaken about. In doing so, he paved the way for future Academic attacks on Stoicism. To summarize the attack: for any sense-impression S, received by some observer A, of some existing object O, and which is a precise representation of O, we can imagine circumstances in which there is another sense-impression S’, which comes either (i) from something other than O, or (ii) from something non-existent, and which is such that S’ is indistinguishable from S to A. The first possibility (i) is illustrated by cases of indistinguishable twins, eggs, statues or imprints in wax made by the same ring (Lucullus 84-87). The second possibility (ii) is illustrated by the illusions of dreams and madness (Lucullus 88-91). On the strength of these examples, Arcesilaus apparently concluded that we may, in principle, be deceived about any sense-impression, and consequently that the Stoic account of empirical knowledge fails. For the Stoics were thorough-going empiricists and believed that sense-impressions lie at the foundation of all of our knowledge. So if we could not be certain of ever having grasped any sense-impression, then we cannot be certain of any of the more complex impressions of the world, including what strikes us as valuable. Thus, along with the failure to establish the possibility of katalepsis goes the failure to establish the possibility of Stoic wisdom (see Hankinson [1995], Annas [1990] and Frede [1983/1987] for detailed discussions of this epistemological debate).

iii. On Suspending Judgment

In response to this lack of knowledge (whether limited to the Stoic variety or knowledge in general), Arcesilaus claimed that we should suspend judgment. By arguing for and against every position that came up in discussion he presented equally weighty reasons on both sides of the issue and made it easier to accept neither side (Academica 45). Diogenes counts the suspension of judgment as another of Arcesilaus’ innovations (DL 4.28) and refers to this as the reason he never wrote any books (4.32). Sextus Empiricus (Outlines of Pyrrhonism [generally referred to by the initials of the title in Greek, PH] 1.232) and Plutarch (Adversus Colotes 1120C) also attribute the suspension of judgment about everything to him.

Determining precisely what cognitive attitude Arcesilaus intended by “suspending judgment” is difficult, primarily because we only have second and third hand reports of his views (if indeed he endorsed any views, see Dialectical Interpretation below). To suspend judgment seems to mean not to accept a proposition as true, i.e. not to believe it. It follows that if one suspends judgment regarding p, then he should neither believe that p nor should he believe that not-p (for this will commit him to the truth of not-p). But if believing p just means believing that p is true, then suspending judgment regarding everything is the same as not believing anything. If Arcesilaus endorsed this, then he could not consistently believe either that nothing can be known or that one should consequently suspend judgment.

iv. Dialectical Interpretation

One way around this problem is to adopt the dialectical interpretation (advanced by Couissin [1929]). According to this interpretation, Arcesilaus merely showed the Stoics that they didn’t have an adequate account of knowledge, not that knowledge in general is impossible. In other words, knowledge will only turn out to be impossible if we define it as the Stoics do. Furthermore, he did not show that everyone should suspend judgment, but rather only those who accept certain Stoic premises. In particular, he argued that if we accept the Stoic view that the Sage never errs, and since katalepsis is not possible, then the Sage (and the rest of us insofar as we emulate the Sage) should never give our assent to anything. Thus the only way to achieve sagehood, i.e. to consistently avoid error, is to suspend judgment regarding everything and never risk being wrong (Lucullus 66-67, 76-78, see also Sextus Empiricus, Against the Logicians [generally referred to by the initial M, for the name of the larger work from which it comes,Adversus Mathematikos] 7.150-57). But the dialectical Arcesilaus himself neither agrees nor disagrees with this.

v. Practical Criterion: to Eulogon

The biggest obstacle to the dialectical interpretation is Arcesilaus’ practical criterion, to eulogon. Arcesilaus presented this criterion in response to the Stoic objection that if we were to suspend judgment regarding everything, then we would not be able to continue to engage in day to day activities. For, theStoics thought, any deliberate action presupposes some assent, which is to say that belief is necessary for action. Thus if we eliminate belief we will eliminate action (Plutarch, Adversus Colotes 1122A-F, LS 69A).

Sextus remarks that

inasmuch as it was necessary . . . to investigate also the conduct of life, which cannot, naturally, be directed without a criterion, upon which happiness-that is, the end of life-depends for its assurance, Arcesilaus asserts that he who suspends judgment about everything will regulate his inclinations and aversion and his actions in general by the rule of “the reasonable [to eulogon],” and by proceeding in accordance with this criterion he will act rightly; for happiness is attained by means of wisdom, and wisdom consists in right actions, and the right action is that which, when performed, possesses a reasonable justification. He, therefore, who attends to “the reasonable” will act rightly and be happy (M 7.158, translated by Bury).

There is a good deal of Stoic technical terminology in this passage, including the term eulogon itself, and this may seem to support the dialectical interpretation. On this view, Arcesilaus is simply showing the Stoics both that their account of knowledge is not necessary for virtue, and that they nonetheless already have a perfectly acceptable epistemic substitute, to eulogon (see Striker [1980/1996]). But this raises the question, why would Arcesilaus make such a gift to his Stoic adversaries? It would be as if, Maconi’s words, “Arcesilaus first knocked his opponent to the ground and then gave him a hand up again” (1988: 248). Such generosity would seem to be incompatible with the purely dialectical purpose of refutation. Similarly, if he had been arguing dialectically all along, there seems to be no good reason for him to respond to Stoic objections, for he was not presenting his own views in the first place. On the other hand, the proponent of the dialectical view could maintain that Arcesilaus has not done any favors to the Stoics by giving them the gift of to eulogon; rather, this “gift” may still be seen as a refutation of the Stoic view that a robust knowledge is necessary for virtue.

An alternative to the dialectical view is to interpret to eulogon as Arcesilaus’ own considered opinion regarding how one may live well in the absence of certainty. This view then encounters the earlier difficulty of explaining how it is consistent for Arcesilaus to endorse suspending judgment on all matters while at the same time believing that one may attain wisdom and happiness by adhering to his practical criterion.

b. Carneades

Arcesilaus was succeeded by Lacydes (c. 243 B.C.E.), and then Evander and Hegesinus in turn took over as heads of the Academy. Following Hegesinus, Carneades of Cyrene (c. 213 to 129 B.C.E.), perhaps the most illustrious of the skeptical Academics, took charge. Rather than merely responding to the dogmatic positions that were currently held as Arcesilaus did, Carneades developed a wider array of skeptical arguments against any possible dogmatic position, including some that were not being defended. He also elaborated a more detailed practical criterion, to pithanon. As was the case with Arcesilaus, he left nothing in writing, except for a few letters, which are no longer extant (DL 4.65).

i. Socratic Dialectic

Carneades employed the same dialectical strategies as Arcesilaus (Academica 45, Lucullus 16), and similarly found his inspiration and model in Plato’s Socrates. The Socratic practice which Carneades employed, according to Cicero, was to try to conceal his own private opinion, relieve others from deception and in every discussion to look for the most probable solution (Tusculan Disputations 5.11, see also de Natura Deorum 1.11).

In 155 B.C.E., nearly one hundred years after Arcesilaus’ death in 243, Carneades is reported to have gone as an Athenian ambassador to Rome. There he presented arguments one day in favor of justice and the next he presented arguments against it. He did this not because he thought that justice should be disparaged but rather to show its defenders that they had no conclusive support for their view (Lactantius, LS 68M). Similarly, we find Carneades arguing against the Stoic conception of the gods, not in order to show that they do not exist, but rather to show that the Stoics had not firmly established anything regarding the divine (de Natura Deorum 3.43-44, see also 1.4). It seems then that Carneades was motivated primarily by the Socratic goal of relieving others of the false pretense to knowledge or wisdom and that he pursued this goal dialectically by arguing both for and against philosophical positions.

ii. On Ethical Theory

But whereas Arcesilaus seemed to limit his targets to positions actually held by his interlocutors, Carneades generalized his skeptical attack, at least in ethics and epistemology. The main task of Hellenistic ethics was to determine the summum bonum, the goal at which all of our actions must aim if we are to live good, happy lives. Carneades listed all of the defensible candidates, including some that had not actually been defended, in order to argue for and against each one and show that no one in fact knows what the summum bonum is, if indeed there is one (de Finibus 5.16-21). He may have even intended the stronger conclusion that it is not possible to acquire knowledge of the summum bonum,assuming his list was exhaustive of all the serious candidates.

iii. On the Stoic Sage

As with Arcesilaus, Carneades also focused much of his skeptical energy on the Stoics, particularly the views of the scholarch Chrysippus (DL 4.62). The Stoics had developed a detailed view of wisdom as life in accordance with nature. The Stoic sage never errs, he never incorrectly values the goods of fortune, he never suffers from pathological emotions, and he always remains tranquil. His happiness is completely inviolable since everything he does and everything he experiences is precisely as it should be; and crucially, he knows this to be true. Even though the Stoics were extremely reluctant to admit that anyone had so far achieved this extraordinary virtue, they nonetheless insisted that it was a real possibility (Luc.145, Tusc. 2.51, Seneca Ep. 42.1, M 9.133, DL 7.91).

As a dialectician, Carneades carefully examined this conception of the sage. Sometimes he argued, contrary to the Stoic view, that the sage would in fact assent to non-kataleptic impressions and thus that he was liable to error (Luc. 67); for he might form opinions even in the absence of katalepsis (Luc. 78). But he also apparently argued against the view that the sage will hold mere opinions in the absence of katalepsis (Luc. 112). Presumably he didn’t himself endorse either position since the issue that had to be decided first was whether katalepsis was even possible. In other words, if certainty is possible, then of course the sage should not settle for mere opinion. But if it is not possible, then perhaps he will be entitled to hold mere opinions, provided they are thoroughly examined and considered.

iv. On Epistemology

Just as Carneades generalized his skeptical attack on ethical theories, he also argued against all of his predecessors’ epistemological theories (M 7.159). The main task of Hellenistic epistemology was to determine the criterion (standard, measure or test) of truth. If the criterion of truth is taken to be a sort of sense-impression, as in the Stoic theory, then we will not be able to discover any such impression that could not in principle appear true to the most expertly trained and sensitive perceiver and yet still be false (M 7.161-65, see Arcesilaus’ “Attack on the Stoics” above). But if we can discover no criterial sense-impression, then neither will the faculty of reason alone be able to provide us with a criterion, insofar as we accept the empiricist view (common among Hellenistic philosophers) that nothing can be judged by the mind that hasn’t first entered by the senses.

We have no evidence to suggest that Carneades also argued against a rationalist, or a priori approach to the criterion.

v. Practical Criterion: to Pithanon

According to Sextus, after arguing against all the available epistemological theories, Carneades himself needed to advance a criterion for the conduct of life and the attainment of happiness (M 7.166). Sextus does not tell us why it was necessary for Carneades to do so, but it was probably for the same reason that Arcesilaus had presented his practical criterion-namely, in response to the objection that if there were no epistemic grounds on which to prefer one impression over another then, despite all appearances, we cannot rationally govern our choices. Thus, Carneades expounded his practical criterion, to pithanon.

First he noted that every sense impression exists in two distinct relations: one relative to the object from which it comes, the “impressor”, and the other relative to the perceiver. The first relation determines what we ordinarily think of as truth: does the impression correspond to its object or not? The second relation determines plausibility: is the impression convincing to the perceiver or not? Rather than relying on the first relation, Carneades adopted the convincing impression [pithanê phantasia] as the criterion of truth, even though there will be occasions on which it fails to accurately represent its object. Yet, he apparently thought that these occasions are rare and so they do not provide a good reason for distrusting the convincing impressions. For such impressions are reliable for the most part, and in actual practice, life is regulated by what holds for the most part (M 7.166-75, LS 69D).

Sextus also reports the refinements Carneades made to his criterion. If we are considering whether we should accept some impression as true, we presumably have already found it to be convincing, but we should also consider how well it coheres with other relevant impressions and then thoroughly examine it further as if we were cross-examining a witness. The amount of examination that a convincing impression requires is a function of its importance to us. In insignificant matters we make use of the merely convincing impression, but in weighty matters, especially those having to do with happiness, we should only rely on the convincing impressions that have been thoroughly explored (M 7.176-84).

Cicero translates Carneades’ pithanon with the Latin terms probabile and veri simile, and he claims that this criterion is to be employed both in everyday life and in the Academic dialectical practice of arguing for and against philosophical views (Luc. 32, see also Contr.Ac. 2.26, and Glucker [1995]). The novel feature of this criterion is that it does not guarantee that whatever is in accordance with it is true. But if it is to play the dialectical role explicitly specified by Cicero and suggested by Sextus’ report, then it must have some connection with truth. This is especially clear in the case of sense-impressions: the benefit of thoroughly examining sense-impressions is that we may rule out the deceptive ones and accept the accurate ones. And we may make a similar case, as Cicero does, for the dialectical examination of philosophical views. A major difficulty in interpreting Carneades’ pithanon in this way is that it requires some explanation for how we are able to identify what resembles the truth (veri simile) without being able to identify the truth itself (Luc. 32-33).

vi. Dialectical Skeptic or Fallibilist?

Even if the fallibilist interpretation of Carneades’ criterion is correct, it remains a further issue whether he actually endorsed his criterion himself, or whether he merely developed it dialectically as a possible view. Indeed, even Carneades’ student Clitomachus was unable to determine what, if anything, Carneades endorsed (Luc. 139, see also Striker [1980/1996]). A number of difficulties arise if he did endorse his criterion. First, Carneades argued that there is absolutely no criterion of truth (M 7.159) and that would presumably include to pithanon. Second, Clitomachus claims that Carneades endured a nearly Herculean labor “when he cast assent out of our minds, like a wild and savage beast, that is mere opinion and thoughtlessness” (Luc. 108). Thus it would seem to be inconsistent for him to accept a moderate, fallible form of assent if it leads to holding opinions.

We may more simply deal with Carneades’ criterion by noting that sometimes he argued so zealously in support of some view that people reasonably, but incorrectly, assumed that he accepted it himself (Luc.78, Fin. 5.20). Thus we may say that Carneades only advanced views dialectically but remained uncommitted to any of them. His criterion in this case would be the disappointing consequence of Stoic epistemological commitments-disappointing (as in the case with the dialectical reading of Arcesilaus’eulogon) because the Stoics believed these same commitments led to a much more robust criterion.

On the other hand, Cicero endorses a fallibilist interpretation of to pithanon which he seems to think was also endorsed by Carneades himself. This interpretation was developed by another of Carneades’ students, Metrodorus, and by Cicero’s teacher, Philo. We also have evidence that Carneades made an important distinction between assent and approval that he may have appealed to in this context (Luc. 104, see Bett [1990]). He limits assent to the mental event of taking a proposition to be true and adopts the term “approval” for the more modest mental event of taking a proposition to be convincing but without making any commitment to its truth. If this distinction is viable it would allow Carneades to approve of his epistemological criterion without committing himself at any deeper theoretical level. In other words Carneades could appeal to his criterion for his very adoption of that criterion: it is pithanon but not certain that to pithanon is the criterion for determining what we should approve of. Cicero claims that Carneades made just this sort of move in the case of his rejection of the possibility of Stoic katalepsis: it isprobabile (= pithanon), but not certain, that katalepsis is not possible (Luc. 110, see Thorsrud [2002]).

c. Philo and Antiochus

According to Sextus Empiricus, most people divide the Academy into three periods: the first, the so-called Old Academy, is Plato’s; the second is the Middle Academy of Arcesilaus; and the third is the New Academy of Carneades. But, he remarks, some also add a fourth Academy, that of Philo, and a fifth Academy, Antiochus’ (PH 1.220). Philo was head of the Academy from about 110 to 79 B.C.E. His interpretation of Academic skepticism as a mitigated form that permits tentative approval of the view that survives the most dialectical scrutiny is recorded and examined in Cicero’s Academica, and in the earlier version of this dialogue, the Lucullus. The Lucullus is just one of the two books that constituted the earlier version. The second book, now lost was called Catulus, after one of the main speakers. Cicero later revised these books, dividing them into four; but only part of the first of those four, what is usually referred to as the Academica posteriora, has survived. Nevertheless, we have enough of these books to get a pretty good sense of the whole work (see Griffin [1997], Mansfeld [1997]).

Philo apparently claimed that some sense-impressions very well may be true but that we nonetheless have no reliable way to determine which ones these are (Luc. 111, see also 34). Similarly, Sextus attributes to Philo the view that “as far the Stoic standard (i.e. apprehensive appearance [= kataleptic impression]) is concerned, objects are inapprehensible, but as far as the nature of the objects themselves is concerned they are apprehensible” (PH 1.235, translated by Annas and Barnes). He may have made these remarks in order to underwrite the Academic practice of accepting certain views as resembling the truth; for there must be some truth in the first place-even if we don’t have access to it-in order for something to resemble it.

Under the pressure of Stoic objections to his fallibilist epistemology Philo apparently made some controversial innovations in Academic philosophy. Cicero refers to these innovations but doesn’t discuss them in any detail (Luc. 11-12), nor did he accept them himself, preferring Philo’s earlier view of the Academy and the dialectical practices of Carneades. Philo’s innovation may have been to commit himself to the metaphysical claim that some impressions are indeed true by providing arguments to that effect. So rather than rely on the likelihood that some impressions are true he may have sought to establish this more firmly. He then may have lowered the standard for knowledge by giving up the internalist requirement that one be able to identify which impressions are true and adopted instead the externalist position that just having true impressions, as long as they have the right causal history, is enough for one to have knowledge (see Hankinson [1997] for this interpretation, see also Tarrant [1985] and Brittain [2001]).

After Philo, Antiochus (c. 130 to c. 68 B.C.E.) led the Academy decidedly back to a form of dogmatism. He claimed that the Stoics and Peripatetics had more accurately understood Plato and thus he sought to revive these views, including primarily Stoic epistemology and ethics, in his Academy (Cicero examines Antiochus’ views in de Finibus 5. Glucker [1978] is a groundbreaking study of Antiochus.).

d. Cicero

Cicero was a lifelong student and practitioner of Academic philosophy and his philosophical dialogues are among the richest sources of information about the skeptical Academy. Although he claims to be a mere reporter of other philosophers’ views (Att. 12.52.3), he went to some trouble in arranging these views in dialogue form and most importantly in supplying his own words to express them. In some cases he coined the words he needed thereby teaching philosophy to speak Latin. His philosophical coinages-e.g.essentia, qualitas, beatitudo-have left a lasting imprint on Western philosophy.

He is generally not considered to be an original thinker but it is difficult to determine the extent to which this is true since practically none of the books he relied on have survived and so we do not know how much, or whether, he modified the views he presented. Nevertheless, despite questions of originality, his dialogues express a humane and intelligent view of life. Plutarch, in his biography, claims that Cicero often asked his friends to call him a philosopher because he had chosen philosophy as his work, but merely used oratory to achieve his political ends (Life of Cicero 32.6, Colish [1985] is a comprehensive survey of Cicero’s philosophical dialogues, so too MacKendrick [1989], and see Powell [1995] for more recent essays on Cicero’s philosophy).

3. Pyrrhonian Skepticism

Pyrrho of Elis (c. 360 to c. 270 BCE), the founder of Pyrrhonian skepticism, is a shadowy figure who wrote nothing himself. What little we know of him comes, for the most part, from fragments of his pupil Timon’s poems and from Diogenes Laertius’ biography (9.61-108) which is based on a book by Antigonus of Carystus, an associate of Timon. There seem to have been no more disciples of Pyrrho after Timon, but much later in the 1st Century B.C.E., Aenesidemus proposed a skeptical view that he claimed to be Pyrrhonian. Later still in the 2nd Century C.E., Sextus Empiricus recorded a battery of skeptical arguments aimed at all contemporary philosophical views. As with Aenesidemus, Sextus claimed Pyrrho as the founder, or at least inspiration, for the skepticism he reports. The content of these skeptical views, the nature of Pyrrho’s influence, and the relations between succeeding stages of Pyrrhonism are controversial topics.

a. Pyrrho and Timon

The anecdotal evidence for Pyrrho tends to be sensational. Diogenes reports, for example, that Pyrrho mistrusted his senses to such an extent that he would have fallen off cliffs or been run over by carts and savaged by dogs had his friends not followed close by (9.62). He was allegedly indifferent to certain norms of social behavior, taking animals to market, washing a pig and even cleaning the house himself (9.66). For the most part we find his indifference presented as a positive characteristic. For example, while on a ship in the midst of a terrible storm he was able to maintain a state of tranquility (9.68). Similarly, Timon presents Pyrrho as having reached a godlike state of calm, having escaped servitude to mere opinion (9.64-5, see also the fragments of Timon’s prose works, as recorded by Aristocles, LS 2A and 2B). He was also held in such high regard by his native city that he was appointed as high priest and for his sake they made all philosophers exempt from taxation (9.64). We also find a tantalizing report of a journey to India where Pyrrho mingled with, and presumably learned from, certain naked sophists and magi (9.61, the connection with Indian Buddhism is explored by Flintoff [1980]).

Generally, the anecdotal evidence in Diogenes, and elsewhere, is unreliable, or at least highly suspect. Such reports are more likely colorful inventions of later authors attributed to Pyrrho to illustrate, or caricature, some part of his philosophical view. Nevertheless, he is consistently portrayed as being remarkably calm due to his lack of opinion, so we may cautiously accept such accounts.

The most important testimony to the nature of Pyrrho’s skepticism comes from Aristocles, a Peripatetic philosopher of the 2nd Century C.E.:

It is supremely necessary to investigate our own capacity for knowledge. For if we are so constituted that we know nothing, there is no need to continue enquiry into other things. Among the ancients too there have been people who made this pronouncement, and Aristotle has argued against them. Pyrrho of Elis was also a powerful spokesman of such a position. He himself has left nothing in writing, but his pupil Timon says that whoever wants to be happy must consider these three questions: first, how are things by nature? Secondly, what attitude should we adopt towards them? Thirdly, what will be the outcome for those who have this attitude? According to Timon, Pyrrho declared that [1] things are equally indifferent, unmeasurable and inarbitrable. For this reason [2] neither our sensations nor our opinions tell us truths or falsehoods. Therefore, for this reason we should not put our trust in them one bit, but we should be unopinionated, uncommitted and unwavering, saying concerning each individual thing that it no more is than is not, or it both is and is not, or it neither is nor is not. [3] The outcome for those who actually adopt this attitude, says Timon, will be first speechlessness, and then freedom from disturbance . . . (Aristocles apudEusebius, Praeparatio evangelica 14.18.1-5, translated by Long and Sedley, 1F).

Let us consider Pyrrho’s questions and answers in order. First, what are things like by nature? This sounds like a straightforward metaphysical question about the way the world is, independent of our perceptions. If so, we should expect Pyrrho’s answer, [1] that things are equally indifferent, unmeasurable and inarbitrable, to be a metaphysical statement. But this will lead to difficulties, for how can Pyrrho arrive at the apparently definite proclamation that things are indefinite? That is, doesn’t his metaphysical statement refute itself by implicitly telling us that things are decidedly indeterminate? If we take this view we may defend Pyrrho by allowing his claim to be exempt from its own scope-so we can determine only this much: every property of every thing is indeterminate (see Bett [2000] for this defense). Alternatively, we may allow Pyrrho to embrace the apparent inconsistency and assert that his claim is itself neither true nor false, but is inarbitrable. The former option seems preferable insofar as the latter leaves Pyrrho with no definite assertion whatsoever and it thus becomes unclear how he could draw the inferences he does from [1] to [2].

On the other hand, we may seek to avoid these difficulties by interpreting Pyrrho’s first answer as epistemological. After all, the predicates he uses suggest an epistemological claim is being made. And further, Aristocles introduces this passage by noting that we must investigate our capacity for knowledge and he claims that Pyrrho was a spokesman for the view that we know nothing. Bett [2000] argues against the epistemological reading on the grounds that it doesn’t make good sense of the passage as it stands. For if we assume the epistemological reading of [1], that we are unable to determine the natures of things, then it would be pointless to infer from that that [2] our senses lie. It would make much more sense to reverse the inference: one might reasonably argue that our senses lie and thus we are unable to determine the natures of things. Some have proposed emending the text from “for this reason (dia touto)” to “on account of the fact that (dia to)” to capture this reversal of the inference. But if we read the text as it stands, we may still explain Aristocles’ epistemological focus by pointing out that if [1] things are indeterminate, then the epistemological skepticism will be a consequence: things are indeterminable.

Second, in what way ought we to be disposed towards things? Since things are indeterminate (assuming the metaphysical reading) then no assertion will be true, but neither will any assertion be false. So we should not have any opinion about the truth or falsity of any statement (with the exception perhaps of these meta-level skeptical assertions). Instead, we should only say and think that something no more is than is not, or both is and is not, or neither is nor is not, because in fact that’s the way things are. So for example, having accepted [1] (and assuming the predicative reading of “is” in [2]), I will no longer believe that this book is red, but neither will I believe that it is not red. The book is no more red than not-red, or similarly, it is as much red as not-red.

Third, what will be the result for those who are so disposed? The first result is speechlessness (literally, not saying anything)-but this is odd given that we are encouraged to adopt a form of speech in [2]. Perhaps speechlessness follows after initially saying only that things are no more this than that, etc.; then finally, freedom from disturbance follows. Presumably, the recognition that things are no more to be sought after than not sought after is instrumental in producing tranquility, for if nothing is intrinsically good or bad, we have no reason to ever be distressed, or to be exuberantly joyful. But then it seems we would not be able to even choose one thing over another. Pyrrho’s tranquility thus begins to look like a kind of paralysis and this is probably what prompted some of the sensational anecdotes.

Diogenes notes, however, that according to Aenesidemus, Pyrrho exercised foresight in his day-to-day activities, and that he lived to be ninety (9.62). So it seems his tranquility did not paralyze him after all. This may be either because Pyrrho (or Timon) was disingenuous about what he was up to intellectually, or more charitably because he followed appearances (9.106) without ever committing himself to the truth or falsity of what appeared. (See “Sextus on the skeptical life” below for further discussion).

b. Aenesidemus

We know practically nothing about Aenesidemus except that he lived sometime in the 1st Century B.C.E., and that he dedicated one of his written works to a Lucius Tubero, a friend of Cicero’s who was also a member of the Academy. This has led most scholars to suppose that Aenesidemus was a member of the Academy, probably during the period of Philo’s leadership, and that his revival of Pyrrhonian skepticism was probably a reaction to Philo’s tendency towards fallibilism. Although this is plausible, it makes the fact that Cicero never mentions him quite puzzling.

i. Revival of Pyrrhonism

Aenesidemus’ Pyrrhonian Discourses (Pyrrhoneia), like the rest of his works, have not survived, but they are summarized by a ninth century Byzantine patriarch, Photius, who is remarkable in his own right. In his Bibliothêkê (Bib.), he summarized 280 books, including the Pyrrhoneia, apparently from memory. It is clear from his summary that he thinks very little of Aenesidemus’ work. This is due to his view that Aenesidemus’ skepticism makes no contribution to Christian dogma and drives from our minds the instinctive tenets of faith (Bib. 170b39-40). Nevertheless, a comparison of his summaries with the original texts that have survived reveal that Photius is a generally reliable source (Wilson [1994]). So despite his assessment of Aenesidemus’ skepticism, the consensus is that he provides an accurate summary of thePyrrhoneia. The proper interpretation of that summary, however, is disputed.

Aenesidemus was a member of Plato’s Academy, apparently during the period of Philo’s leadership. Growing dissatisfied with what he considered the dogmatism of the Academy, he sought to revitalize skepticism by moving back to a purer form inspired by Pyrrho. His specific complaint against his contemporary Academics was that they confidently affirm some things, even Stoic beliefs, and unambiguously deny other things. In other words, the Academics, in Aenesidemus’ view, were insufficiently impressed by our epistemic limitations.

His alternative was to “determine nothing,” not even the claim that he determines nothing. Instead, the Pyrrhonist says that things are no more one way than another. This form of speech is ambiguous (in a positive sense, from Aenesidemus’ perspective) since it neither denies nor asserts anything unconditionally. In other words, the Pyrrhonist will only assert that some property belongs to some object relative to some observer or relative to some set of circumstances. Thus, he will conditionally affirm some things but he will absolutely deny that any property belongs to anything in every possible circumstance. This seems to be what Aenesidemus meant by “determining nothing,” for his relativized assertions say nothing definite about the nature of the object in question. Such statements take the form: it is not the case that X is by nature F. This is a simple denial that X is always and invariably F, though of course X may be F in some cases. But such statements are importantly different from those of the form: X is by nature not-F. For these sorts of statements affirm that X is invariably not-F and that there can be no cases of X that exhibit the property F. The only acceptable form of expression for Aenesidemus then seems to be statements that may sometimes be false (See Woddruff [1988] for this interpretation, also Bett 2000).

ii. The Ten Modes

The kinds of conclusion that Aenesidemus countenanced as a Pyrrhonist can more clearly be seen by considering the kinds of arguments he advanced to reach them. He apparently produced a set of skeptical argument forms, or modes, for the purpose of refuting dogmatic claims regarding the natures of things. Sextus Empiricus discusses one such group, the Ten Modes, in some detail (PH 1.35-163, M 7.345, see also Diogenes Laertius’ account of the Ten Modes at 9.79-88, and the partial account in Philo of Alexandria, On Drunkenness 169-205, and see Annas and Barnes [1985] for detailed and critical discussion of all ten modes).

The first mode is designed to show that it is not reasonable to suppose that the way the world appears to us humans is more accurate than the incompatible ways it appears to other animals. This will force us to suspend judgment on the question of how these things are by nature, in and of themselves, insofar as we have no rational grounds on which to prefer our appearances and insofar as we are not willing to accept that something can have incompatible properties by nature. If, for example, manure appears repulsive to humans and delightful to dogs, weare unable to say that it really is, in its nature, either repulsive or delightful, or both repulsive and delightful. It is no more delightful than not-delightful, and no more repulsive than not-repulsive, (again, in its nature).

Just as the world appears in incompatible ways to members of different species, so too does it appear incompatibly to members of the same species. Thus, the second mode targets the endless disagreements among dogmatists. But once again, we will find no rational ground to prefer our own view of things, for if an interested party makes himself judge, we should be suspicious of the judgment he reaches, and not accept it.

The third mode continues the line of reasoning developed in the first two. Just as the world appears in incompatible ways to different people, it also appears incompatibly to the different senses of one and the same person. So, for example, painted objects seem to have spatial dimensions that are not revealed to our sense of touch. Similarly, perfume is pleasant to the nose but disgusting to the tongue. Thus, perfume is no more pleasant than not-pleasant.

The fourth mode shows that differences in the emotional or physical state of the perceiver affects his perception of the world. Being in love, calm and warm, one will experience the cold wind that comes in with his beloved quite differently than if he is angry and cold. We are unable to adjudicate between these incompatible experiences of the cold wind because we have no rational grounds on which to prefer our experience in one set of circumstances to our experience in another. One might say that we should give preference to the experiences of those who are healthy, sane and calm as that is our natural state. But in response, we may employ the second mode to challenge the notion of a single, healthy condition that is universally applicable.

The fifth mode shows that differences in location and position of an observed object relative to the observer will greatly affect the way the object appears. Here we find the oar that appears bent in water, the round tower that appears square from a distance, and the pigeon’s neck that changes color as the pigeon moves. These features are independent of the observer in a way that the first four modes are not. But similar to the first four, in each case we are left without any rational grounds on which to prefer some particular location or position over another. Why should we suppose, for example, that the pigeon’s neck is really green rather than blue? And if we should propose some proof, or theory, in support of it being really blue, we will have to face the skeptic’s demand for further justification of that theory, which will set off an infinite regress.

The sixth mode claims that nothing can be experienced in its simple purity but is always experienced as mixed together with other things, either internally in its composition or externally in the medium in which it is perceived. This being the case, we are unable to ever experience the nature of things, and thus are unable to ever say what that nature is.

The seventh mode appeals to the way different effects are produced by altering the quantity and proportions of things. For example, too much wine is debilitating but the right amount is fortifying. Similarly, a pile of sand appears smooth, but individual grains appear rough. Thus, we are led to conclude that wine is no more debilitating than fortifying and sand is no more smooth than rough, in their natures.

The eighth mode, from relativity, is a paradigm for the whole set of modes. It seeks to show, in general, that something appears to have the property F only relative to certain features of the perceiving subject or relative to certain features of the object. And, once again, insofar as we are unable to prefer one set of circumstances to another with respect to the nature of the object, we must suspend judgment about those natures.

The ninth modes points out that the frequency of encountering a thing affects the way that thing appears to us. If we see something that we believe to be rare it will appear more valuable. And when we encounter some beautiful thing for the first time it will seem more beautiful or striking than it appears after we become familiar with it. Thus, we must conclude, for example, that a diamond is no more valuable than worthless.

Finally, the tenth mode, which bears on ethics, appeals to differences in customs and law, and in general, to differences in the ways we evaluate the world. For some, homosexuality is acceptable and good, and to others it is unacceptable and bad. In and of itself, homosexuality is neither good nor bad, but only relative to some way of evaluating the world. And again, since we are unable to prefer one set of values to another, we are led to the conclusion that we must suspend judgment, this time with respect to the intrinsic value of things.

In each of these modes, Aenesidemus seems to be advancing a sort of relativism: we may only say that some object X has property F relative to some observer or set of circumstances, and not absolutely. Thus his skepticism is directed exclusively at a version of Essentialism; in this case, the view that some object has property F in any and every circumstance. A further question is whether Aenesidemus intends his attack on Essentialism to be ontological or epistemological. If it is epistemological, then he is claiming that we simply cannot know what the nature or essence of some thing is, or even whether it has one. This seems most likely to have been Aenesidemus’ position since Photius’ summary begins with the remark that the overall aim of the Pyrrhoneia is to show that there is no firm basis for cognition. Similarly, the modes seem to be exclusively epistemological insofar as they compel us to suspend judgment; they are clearly designed to force the recognition that no perspective can be rationally preferred to any other with respect to real natures, or essences. By contrast, the ontological view that there are no essences, is not compatible with suspending judgment on the question.

iii. Tranquility

We do not have enough evidence to determine precisely why Aenesidemus found inspiration in Pyrrho. One important point, however, is that they both promote a connection between tranquility and an acceptance of our epistemic limitations (see Bett [2000] for an elaboration of this view). Diogenes Laertius attributes the view to both Anesidemus and the followers of Timon that as a result of suspending judgment, freedom from disturbance (ataraxia) will follow as a shadow (DL 9.107-8). Similarly, Photius reports Aenesidemus’ view that those who follow the philosophy of Pyrrho will be happy, whereas by contrast, the dogmatists will wear themselves out in futile and ceaseless theorizing (Bib. 169b12-30, LS 71C). Although there seem to be important differences in what Pyrrho and Aenesidemus understood by our epistemic limitations, they both promoted tranquility as the goal, or at least end product. In general terms the idea is clear enough: the way to a happy, tranquil existence is to live in accordance with how things seem, including especially our evaluative impressions of the world. Rather than trying to uncover some hidden reality, we should accept our limitations, operate in accordance with custom and habit, and not be disturbed by what we cannot know (see Striker [1990/1996]).

c. Sextus Empiricus

We know very little about Sextus Empiricus, aside from the fact that he was a physician. He may have been alive as early as the 2nd Century C.E. or as late as the 3rd Century C.E. We cannot be certain as to where he lived, or where he practiced medicine, or where he taught, if indeed he did teach. In addition to his philosophical books, he also wrote some medical treatises (referred to at M 7.202, 1.61) which are no longer extant.

There are three philosophical works that have survived. Two of these works are grouped together under the general heading, Adversus Mathematikos-which may be translated as Against the Learned, or Against the Professors, i.e. those who profess to know something worth teaching. This grouping is potentially misleading as the first group of six books (chapters, by current standards) are complete and form a self-contained whole. In fact Sextus refers to them with the title Skeptical Treatises. Each of these books target some specific subject in which people profess to be experts, thus: grammar, rhetoric, mathematics, geometry, astrology and music. These are referred to as M 1 through 6, respectively.

There are five additional books in the second set grouped under the heading Adversus Mathematikos:two books containing arguments against the Logicians (M 7, 8), two books against the Physicists (M 9, 10), and one book against the Ethicists (M 11). This set of books is apparently incomplete since the opening of M 7 refers back to a general outline of skepticism that is in none of the extant books of M.

The third work is the Outlines of Pyrrhonism, in three books. The first book provides an outline summary of Pyrrhonian skepticism and would correspond to the missing portion of M. Books 2 and 3 provide arguments against the Logicians, Physicists and Ethicists, corresponding to M 7 through 11. The discussion in PH tends to be much more concise and carefully worded, though there is greater detail and development of many of the same arguments in M. The nature of the relation between these three works is much disputed, especially since the view presented in PH seems to be incompatible with large portions of M (see Bett [1997]).

The following discussion is limited to the views presented in PH.

i. General Account of Skepticism

Sextus begins his overview of Pyrrhonian skepticism by distinguishing three fundamental types of philosopher: dogmatists, who believe they have discovered the truth; Academics (negative dogmatists), who believe the truth cannot be discovered; and skeptics, who continue to investigate, believing neither that anyone has so far discovered the truth nor that it is impossible to do so. Although his characterization of Academics is probably polemical and unfair, the general distinctions he makes are important.

Sextus understands the skeptic, at least nominally as Pyrrho and Aenesidemus do, as one who by suspending judgment determines nothing, and enjoys tranquility as a result. But, as we will see, his conception of suspending judgment is considerably different from his predecessors’.

ii. The Path to Skepticism

According to Sextus, one does not start out as a skeptic, but rather stumbles on to it. Initially, one becomes troubled by the kinds of disagreements focused on in Aenesidemus’ modes and seeks to determine which appearances accurately represent the world and which explanations accurately reveal the causal histories of events. The motivation for figuring things out, Sextus asserts, is to become tranquil, i.e. to remove the disturbance that results from confronting incompatible views of the world. As the proto-skeptic attempts to sort out the evidence and discover the privileged perspectiveor the correct theory, he finds that for each account that purports to establish something true about the world there is another, equally convincing account, that purports to establish an opposed and incompatible view of the same thing. Being faced with this equipollence, he is unable to assent to either of the opposed accounts and thereby suspends judgment. This, of course, is not what he set out to do. But by virtue of his intellectual integrity, he is simply not able to arrive at a conclusion and so he finds himself without any definite view. What he also finds is that the tranquility that he originally thought would come only by arriving at the truth, follows upon his suspended judgment as a shadow follows a body.

Sextus provides a vivid story to illustrate this process. A certain painter, Apelles, was trying to represent foam on the mouth of the horse he was painting. But each time he applied the paint he failed to get the desired effect. Growing frustrated, he flung the sponge, on which he had been wiping off the paint, at the picture, inadvertently producing the effect he had been struggling to achieve (PH 1.28-29). The analogous point in the case of seeking the truth is that the desired tranquility only comes indirectly, not by giving up the pursuit of truth, but rather by giving up the expectation that we must acquire truth to get tranquility. It is a strikingly Zen-like point: one cannot intentionally acquire a peaceful, tranquil state but must let it happen as a result of giving up the struggle. But again, giving up the struggle for the skeptic does not mean giving up the pursuit of truth. The skeptic continues to investigate in order to protect himself against the deceptions and seductions of reason that lead to our holding definite views.

Arriving at definite views is not merely a matter of intellectual dishonesty, Sextus thinks; more importantly, it is the main source of all psychological disturbance. For those who believe that things are good or bad by nature, are perpetually troubled. When they lack what they believe to be good their lives must seem seriously deficient if not outright miserable, and they struggle as much as possible to acquire those things. But when they finally have what they believe to be good, they spend untold effort in maintaining and preserving those things and live in fear of losing them (PH 1.27).

Sextus’ diagnosis is not limited to evaluative beliefs, however. This is clear by virtue of the fact that he provides extensive arguments against physical and logical (broadly speaking, scientific and epistemological) theories also. How, then, do such beliefs contribute to the psychological disturbances that Sextus seeks to eliminate? The most plausible reply is that any such belief that we find Sextus arguing against in PH is one that will inevitably contribute to one’s evaluations of the world and thus will contribute to the intense strivings that characterize disturbance. An examination of a sample of the logical and physical theses that Sextus’ discusses bears this out. Many of these beliefs played foundational roles in the Epicurean or Stoic systems, and thus were employed to establish ethical and evaluative beliefs. Believing that the physical world is composed of invisible atoms, for example, would not, by itself, produce any disturbance since we must draw inferences from this belief in order for it to have any significance for us with respect to choice and avoidance. So it is more appropriate to look past the disturbance that may be produced by individual, isolated beliefs, and consider instead the effect of accepting a system of interrelated, mutually supporting dogmatic claims.

iii. The Modes of Agrippa

As a supplement to the Ten Modes of Aenesidemus (as well as his Eight Modes aimed at causal explanations, see PH 1.180-85, and Hankinson [1998]), Sextus offers a set of Five Modes (PH 1.164-77) and Two Modes (PH 1.178-79) employed by “more recent skeptics.” We may gather from Diogenes (9.88) that the more recent skeptic referred to is Agrippa. It is important to point out that Sextus merely reports these modes, he does not endorse them at a theoretical level. That is, he does not claim that they possess any sort of logical standing, e.g. that they are guaranteed to reveal a flaw in dogmatic positions, or that they represent some ideal form of reasoning. Instead, we should think of these modes as part of the general account of skepticism, with which the skeptic’s practice coheres (PH 1.16-17). In other words, these modes simply describe the way Sextus and his fellow skeptics behave dialectically.

Agrippa’s Five Modes relies on the prevalence of dispute and repeats the main theme of Aenesidemus’ Modes: we are frequently faced with dissenting opinions regarding the same matter and yet we have no adequate grounds on which to prefer one view over another. Should a dogmatist offer an account of such grounds, the skeptic may then request further justification, thereby setting off an infinite regress. And presumably, we should not be willing to accept an explanation that is never complete, i.e. one that requires further explaining itself. Should the dogmatist try to put a stop to the regress by means of a hypothesis, the skeptic will refuse to accept the claim without proof, perhaps citing alternative, incompatible hypotheses. And finally, the skeptic will refuse to allow the dogmatist to support his explanation by what he is supposed to be explaining, disallowing any circular reasoning. And of course the skeptic may also avail himself of the observation that what is being explained only appears as it does relative to some relevant conditions, and thus, contrary to the dogmatist’s presumption, there is no one thing to be explained in the first place (see Barnes [1990]).

iv. Skepticism vs. Relativism

Sextus employs these skeptical modes towards quite a different goal from Aenesidemus’. Aenesidemus, as we have seen, countenances relativistic assertions of the form, X is no more F than not F. This is to say that although X is not really, in its nature, F, it is still genuinely F in some particular circumstance. And it is acceptable for the Aenesidemean skeptic to believe that this is the case. But for Sextus, the skeptical refrain, “I determine nothing” excludes relativistic beliefs as well. It is not acceptable for Sextus to believe that X is F, even with relativistic disclaimers. Instead, Sextus would have us refrain from believing even that X is no more F than not-F. Thus, suspension of judgment extends farther for Sextus than it does for Aenesidemus.

v. The Skeptical Life

So, skepticism is an ability to discover opposed arguments of equal persuasive force, the practice of which leads first to suspension of judgment and afterwards, fortuitously, to tranquility. This makes Sextus’ version of Pyrrhonian skepticism dramatically different from other Western philosophical positions, for it is a practice or activity rather than a set of doctrines. Indeed, insofar as the skeptic is supposed to live without belief (adoxastôs), he could not consistently endorse any philosophical doctrine. But how is it possible to live without beliefs?

The short answer is that one may simply follow appearances and withhold judgment as to whether the world really is as it appears. This seems plausible with respect to physical perceptions, but appearances for Sextus include evaluations, and this creates a complication. For how can the skeptic say “this appears good (or bad) to me, but I don’t believe that it is really good or bad”? It seems that there is no difference between evaluative appearances and evaluative beliefs.

One possible response to this problem is to say that Sextus only targets sophisticated, philosophical theories about value, or about physics or logic, but allows everyday attitudes and beliefs to stand. On this view, skepticism is a therapy designed to cure the disease of academics and theoreticians. But it seems that Sextus intends his philosophical therapy to be quite widely applicable. The skeptical life, as he presents it, is an achievement and not merely the recovering of a native innocence lost to philosophical speculation. (See Burnyeat and Frede [1997], Brennan [1999] for the debate regarding what the skeptic is supposed to suspend judgment about.)

Any answer to the question about how the skeptic may live without beliefs will depend on what sort of beliefs we think the skeptic avoids. Nevertheless, an elaboration on living in accordance with appearances comes in the form of the fourfold observances. Rather than investigate the best way to live or even what to do in some particular circumstance, Sextus remarks that the skeptic will guide his actions by (1) nature, (2) necessitation by feelings, (3) laws and customs, and (4) kinds of expertise (PH 1.23-24). Nature provides us with the capacity for perception and thought, and we may use these capacities insofar as they don’t lead us to dogmatic belief. Similarly, hunger and thirst will drive us towards food and drink without our having to form any explicit beliefs regarding those physical sensations. One need not accept any nutritional theories to adequately and appropriately respond to hunger and thirst. Laws and customs will inform us of the appropriate evaluations of things. We need not actually believe that the gods exist and that they are benevolent to take part in religious ceremonies or even to act in a manner that is (or at least appears) pious. But note that the skeptic will neither believe that the gods exist nor that they do not exist-he is neither a theist nor an atheist, but agnostic in a very robust sense. And finally, the skeptic may practice some trade or profession without accepting any theories regarding his practice. For example, a carpenter need not have any theoretical or geometrical views about doors in order to be skillful at hanging them. Similarly, a doctor need not accept any physiological theories to successfully heal his patients. The further question, recalling the dispute explored in Burnyeat and Frede [1997], is whether the skeptic merely avoids sophisticated, theoretical beliefs in employing these observances, or whether he avoids all beliefs whatsoever.

4. Skepticism and the Examined Life

A unifying feature of the varieties of ancient skepticism is that they are all concerned with promoting, in some manner of speaking, the benefits of recognizing our epistemic limitations. Thus, ancient skeptics nearly always have something to say about how one may live, and indeed live well, in the absence of knowledge.

The fallibilism that developed in Plato’s Academy should be seen in this light. Rather than forego the potential benefits of an examination aimed at acquiring better beliefs, the later Academics opted for a less ambitious criterion, one that would give them merely reliable beliefs. Nonetheless, they maintained a thoroughly skeptical attitude towards the possibility of attaining certainty, but without claiming to have conclusively ruled it out.

The more radical skepticism that we find in Sextus’ Outlines of Pyrrhonism suggests a move in a different direction. Rather than explain how or why we should trust the skeptical employment of reason, Sextus avoids the problem altogether by, in effect, refusing to answer. Instead, he would suggest that we consider the reasons in support of some particular answer and the reasons opposed in accordance with the skeptical ability so that we may regain tranquility.

5. Greek and Latin Texts, Commentaries, and Translations


  • Long and Sedley, eds. (1987), The Hellenistic Philosophers, (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press), is a good place to start. These volumes contain selections from the primary sources grouped by topic. See volume 1, sections 68-72 and the following commentaries (pp. 438-488) for readings on Academic and Pyrrhonian skepticism, and sections 1-3 with commentaries (pp. 13-24) for readings on Pyrrho. Volume 2 contains the original Greek and Latin texts corresponding to the translations in volume 1.
  • Inwood and Gerson, eds. (1988), Hellenistic Philosophy: Introductory Readings, Indianapolis: Hackett), also contains translated selections from the primary sources for Academic and Pyrrhonian skepticism.
  • Annas and Barnes, eds. (1985), The Modes Of Scepticism, (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press), is a very useful arrangement and translation of the texts that discuss the different varieties of Pyrrhonian argumentation.

For the Greek edition of Photius’ summary of Aenesidemus, see R. Henry, ed. (1962), Photius: Bibliothêque, Tome III, (Paris). For a very readable translation, informative introduction and notes, see N.G. Wilson (1994), Photius: The Bibliotheca, (London: Duckworth).

There have been some recently updated and much improved translations and commentaries on Sextus Empiricus.

  • Annas, J. and J. Barnes (1994), Sextus Empiricus: Outlines of Scepticism, (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Bett, R. (1997), Sextus Empiricus: Against the Ethicists (Adversus Mathematikos XI),(Oxford: Oxford University Press).
  • Blank, D. (1998), Sextus Empiricus: Against the Grammarians (Adversus Mathematikos I),(Oxford: Oxford University Press).
  • Greaves, D.D. (1986), Sextus Empiricus: Against the Musicians (Adversus Mathematikos VI), (Lincoln: University of Nebraska Press).
  • Mates, B. (1996), The Skeptic Way: Sextus Empiricus’s Outlines of Pyrrhonism, Translated with Introduction and Commentary, (Oxford: Oxford University Press).

Many of the primary texts can be found in the Loeb series, which contains facing pages of text in the original language and translation. Among the most important are (all published by Harvard University Press):

  • Bury, R.G. (1933), trans., Sextus Empiricus: Outlines of Pyrrhonism.
  • Bury, R.G. (1935), trans., Sextus Empiricus: Against the Logicians
  • Bury, R.G. (1936), trans., Sextus Empiricus: Against the Physicists, Against the Ethicists.
  • Bury, R.G. (1949), trans., Sextus Empiricus: Against the Professors. Hicks, R.D. (1925), trans.,Diogenes Laertius: Lives of Eminent Philosophers, vols. 1 and 2.
  • Rackham, H. (1933), trans., Cicero: De Natura Deorum, Academica.
  • Rackham, H. (1914), trans., Cicero: De Finibus Bonorum et Malorum.

6. References and Further Reading

  • Annas, J., (1996), “Scepticism, Old and New,” in M. Frede and G. Striker, eds., Rationality in Greek Thought, (Oxford: Clarendon).
  • Annas, J. (1993), The Morality of Happiness, (Oxford: Oxford University Press).
  • Annas, J. (1992), “Plato the Sceptic,” in J. Klagge and N. Smith, eds., Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy, Supp. Vol., 43-72.
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Author Information

Harald Thorsrud
New Mexico State University
U. S. A.

Last updated: October 15, 2004 | Originally published: