Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Contemporary Skepticism

Philosophical views are typically classed as skeptical when they involve advancing some degree of doubt regarding claims that are elsewhere taken for granted. Varieties of skepticism can be distinguished in two main ways, depending upon the focus and the extent of the doubt.

As regards the former, skeptical views typically have an epistemological form, in that they are focused on the epistemic status of certain beliefs. For example, one common variety of skepticism concerns our beliefs about the past and argues that such beliefs lack positive epistemic status – that they are not justified, or are not rational, or cannot constitute knowledge (and perhaps even all three). Where skepticism does not have this epistemological focus, then it tends to be of an ontological form in that it is directed at beliefs about the existence of some supposedly problematic entity, such as the self or God. Here the target of the skepticism is not so much one’s putative knowledge of these entities (though it may be that as well), but rather the claim that they exist at all.

As regards the latter, one can differentiate between skeptical views that are either local or radical. Local varieties of skepticism will only concern beliefs about a certain specific subject matter, such as beliefs in abstract objects or the conclusions of inductive arguments. Since ontological varieties of skepticism tend to be concerned with the existence of particular sorts of entities, they are usually (though not always) of this local form. In contrast, radical forms of skepticism afflict most of our beliefs and thus pose, at least potentially, the most pressing philosophical challenge.

Perhaps unsurprisingly, the locus for discussion of skepticism has tended to be radical epistemological varieties of skepticism, and this is certainly a trend that has continued into contemporary debate. In historical discussion, for example, the two most influential forms of skepticism have, arguably, been the radical epistemological skepticism of the classical Pyrrhonian skeptics and the Cartesian form of radical epistemological skepticism that Descartes considers in his Meditations. The former consists of a variety of skeptical techniques that counter any grounds that are offered for belief with grounds for doubt (or at least non-belief) that are at least as persuasive. Since no belief is more reasonable than its denial, the Pyrrhonian skeptics concluded that one ought to be skeptical about most (if not all) of one’s beliefs. Cartesian skepticism reaches a similar conclusion, though this time by highlighting through the use of skeptical hypotheses that we cannot be certain of any (or at least hardly any) of our beliefs and thus must retreat to skepticism. Roughly, a skeptical hypothesis is an error-possibility that is incompatible with the knowledge that we ascribe to ourselves but which is also subjectively indistinguishable from normal circumstances (or, at least, what we take normal circumstances to be), such as that we might be currently experiencing a very vivid dream. Since such scenarios are subjectively indistinguishable from normal circumstances, the Cartesian skeptical move is to say that we cannot know that they are false and that this threatens the certainty of our beliefs.

What is common to both of these historical approaches, and which lives on in the contemporary discussion of skepticism, is the primary conception of skepticism as resting on an entirely intuitive and pre-theoretical understanding of our epistemic concepts. In this sense it has the form of a paradox – a series of wholly plausible and intuitive claims that, collectively, lead to an intellectually devastating conclusion. Recent discussion of skepticism also treats the problem as having this paradoxical form, though the epistemic focus of the discussion is now not so much the lack of grounds for belief which counter the skeptic’s grounds against belief, or the lack of certainty, but rather the lack of knowledge. Contemporary discussions of skepticism have thus tended to make the radical epistemological claim that we fail to know (hardly) anything.

Table of Contents

  1. The Skeptical Paradox in Contemporary Debate
  2. Relevant Alternatives, Infallibilism, and Closure
  3. Semantic Contextualism
  4. “Hinge” Propositions and Inferential Contextualism
  5. Neo-Moorean Responses to Skepticism
  6. Epistemological Externalism and the New Skeptics
  7. References and Further Reading

1. The Skeptical Paradox in Contemporary Debate

Contemporary discussion of the problem of the radical skepticism has tended to focus on a formulation of that problem in terms of a paradox consisting of the joint incompatibility of three claims, each of which appears, on the surface of things and taken individually, to be perfectly in order. Roughly, they are as follows.

First, that we are unable to know that any one of a number of skeptical hypotheses are false, where a skeptical hypothesis is understood as a scenario that is subjectively indistinguishable from what one takes normal circumstances to be but which, if true, would undermine most of the knowledge that one ascribes to oneself. A standard example of a skeptical hypothesis is the so-called ‘brain-in-a-vat’ (BIV) hypothesis that one is being ‘fed’ one’s experiences by computers. If this were true, then most of what one believes about the world would be false (or, at the very least, true in a different way from how one would expect), and thus one would lack knowledge. Moreover, this scenario is characterised such that there would be no perceptible difference between being a BIV and having the non-BIV experiences one currently takes oneself to be experiencing and thus, plausibly, it does not seem to be a scenario that we could ever know to be false. We thus get our first ‘intuitive’ element of the skeptical paradox:

I. I am unable to know the denials of skeptical hypotheses.

The second ‘intuitive’ claim about knowledge that the skeptic employs is the following:

II. If I do not know the denials of skeptical hypotheses, then I do not know very much.

What motivates this claim is the compelling thought that unless one can rule-out the kind of error-possibilities at issue in skeptical hypotheses by knowing them to be false, then this suffices to undermine most (if not all) of the knowledge that one traditionally ascribes to oneself. After all, if I were a BIV, then I wouldn’t be sitting here now. Hence, if, for all I know, I could be a BIV, surely it must follow that I do not know that I am sitting here now (and much more besides)?

Finally, there is the third element of the skeptical paradox that creates the required overall philosophical tension. This is the highly plausible claim that we do know a great deal of what we think we know:

III. A lot of what I believe, I know.

Of course, there may be lots of abstract and technical kinds of knowledge which I think I have but actually lack, but the point of this intuition is that many of the ‘ordinary’ propositions that I believe (such as that I am sitting here now) do seem to be the kinds of propositions that I could not plausibly be wrong about in a wholesale fashion. With these three claims in place, however, the puzzle becomes obvious. For if I cannot know the denials of skeptical hypotheses, and if this lack of knowledge entails that I lack knowledge of most of what I believe, it follows that I must lack knowledge of most of what I believe. Hence, one cannot accept all of these three claims; one of them must go.

The skeptic offers a very simple way out of this puzzle, which is to deny, on the basis of I and II, that we ever have knowledge of the kind of ordinary propositions at issue in III. That is, the skeptic argues as follows:

(S1) I am unable to know the denials of skeptical hypotheses.

(S2) If I do not know the denials of skeptical hypotheses, then I do not know very much.


(SC) I do not know very much.

For example, a skeptical argument which employed the BIV skeptical hypothesis might well run as follows:

(S1*) I am unable to know that I am not a BIV.

(S2*) If I do not know that I am not a BIV, then I do not know very much.


(SC*) I do not know very much,

Clearly, however, this radical skeptical suggestion regarding how we should respond to these three incompatible claims is less of a proposal than a reductio of epistemological theorising. This conclusion is, after all, intellectually devastating, consigning our cognitive activities to, at best, a kind of bad faith. We would thus be wise to look closely at the anti-skeptical alternatives before we accept this (paradoxical) response to the skeptical paradox.

If we are to evade skepticism, we are thus going to have to motivate one (or more) of the following three claims. First, that, despite appearances, we do (or at least can) know the denials of radical skeptical hypotheses after all. Second, that, despite appearances, it does not follow from the fact that we lack knowledge of the denials of radical skeptical hypotheses that we thereby lack knowledge of ordinary propositions as well. Third, that, despite appearances, these three claims are consistent after all.

2. Relevant Alternatives, Infallibilism, and Closure

Of the three anti-skeptical strategies just listed, the second looks, prima facie, to be the most promising. After all, this does seem to be the weakest element of the skeptical argument since, although it is at first pass intuitive, on reflection it is far from immediately obvious that our knowledge of everyday propositions should be dependent upon anti-skeptical knowledge in this fashion. One response to the problem of skepticism has thus been to deny this premise in the skeptical argument by arguing that one can perfectly well know everyday propositions whilst failing to know the denials of anti-skeptical hypotheses such as the BIV hypothesis.

One motivation for this line of argument has been to argue that skeptical error-possibilities are just not relevant to everyday knowledge in the way that everyday error-possibilities are. After all, we do not ordinarily demand that agents should rule out skeptical error-possibilities before we ascribe them knowledge. This relevant alternatives (RA) line of argument, which has its roots in work by J. L. Austin (1961), has been developed by Fred Dretske (1970). As Dretske is aware, however, simply denying (S2) of the skeptical argument on these grounds is not enough, rather one needs to also engage with the epistemological theses that underlie this premise and offer a fully-fledged account of what this notion of epistemological relevance involves.

One epistemological thesis that is often thought to provide support for (S2) is that of infallibilism. This is the thesis that, roughly, for an agent to know a proposition that agent must be able to eliminate all error-possibilities associated with that proposition. Provided that one is willing to make the plausible move of construing ‘eliminate’ here in terms of the ability to know the negation of then one straightforwardly gets the requisite link between infallibilism and (S2) since the skeptical hypothesis in question (whichever skeptical hypothesis it is) will clearly be an error possibility which must be known to be false if the agent is to have knowledge of the ordinary proposition at issue. Accordingly, an inability to know the denial of the skeptical hypothesis will suffice to ensure that the agent lacks knowledge of the ordinary proposition, just as (S2) says. In effect, infallibilism is the opposing thesis to the RA line because it counts every alternative as being relevant.

Although infallibilism may seem to be an obviously false epistemological thesis, a persuasive case can be made in its defence. In particular, Peter Unger (1971; 1975) has been a prominent defender of a version of infallibilism (although in more recent work, such as Unger (1984; 1986) he has moved towards a thesis which is more in line with contextualism, a view which we will be considering below). In these early works Unger argued that ‘knowledge’ is an “absolute term” like ‘flat’ or ‘empty’. According to Unger, what is interesting about absolute terms is that they are never really satisfied, although we often talk as if they are. So, for example, nothing is ever really flat or really empty because, respectively, no surface is ever completely free of friction and no container could ever be a vacuum. Accordingly, even though we may loosely talk of Holland’s ‘flat’ roads or John’s ‘empty’ fridge, reflection indicates to us that such assertions are, in fact, false (Holland’s roads have some bumps on them, however small, and John’s fridge, whilst empty of food, is ‘full’ of air, not to mention refrigerator parts). Similarly, Unger’s point is that what the skeptic is responding to in her arguments is the fact that, strictly speaking, nothing is every really known because to be really known the agent would have to rule out every possibility of error and this is an impossible hurdle to clear (at least for a non-omniscient being). So although we might talk of knowing lots of things, reflection indicates to us, as it does with our use of ‘flat’ and ‘empty’, that our claims to know are all, in fact, false.

We will return to consider infallibilism again below. In the meantime, however, we can set this thesis to one side because there is a (logically) weaker thesis that would also suffice to support (S2). Accordingly, so long as we are able to deny the weaker thesis then we can get a rejection of infallibilism by default. This weaker thesis is the principle that knowledge is ‘closed’ under known entailment, or the ‘closure’ principle for short. Roughly, this principle states that if an agent knows a proposition (such as that she is currently seated), and knows that this proposition entails a second proposition (such as that she is not a BIV), then she also knows the second proposition. In general, this can be roughly expressed as follows:

Closure Principle for Knowledge

If an agent knows P, and knows that P entails Q, then that agent knows Q.

Whereas infallibilism supports (S2) by demanding that an agent should be able to know the denials of all error-possibilities, closure merely demands that the agent knows the denials of those error-possibilities that are known to be logical consequences of what one knows. For example, if one knows the ordinary proposition that one is currently seated, and one further knows that if one is seated then one is not a BIV, then one must also know that one is not a BIV. Conversely, if one does not know that one is not a BIV then, given that one knows the entailment in question (which ought to be uncontroversial), one thereby lacks knowledge of the ordinary proposition in question, just as (S2) says. And note that, unlike (S2), the plausibility of closure is not merely prima facie. After all, we reason in conformity with closure all the time in cases where we gain knowledge of previously unknown propositions via knowledge of other propositions and the relevant entailment. Indeed, closure is in this respect far more compelling than infallibilism, since what credibility the latter thesis has is gained by philosophical argument rather than by prima facie reflection on our actual epistemic practice. The theoretical burden imposed upon anyone who advocates the denial of (S2) is thus very strong, since it requires a principled rejection of the intuitive principle of closure.

The standard proposal put forward to support the denial of closure has been some variation of the original RA model advanced by Dretske (1970; 1971; 1981). Essentially, the idea is to claim that knowledge only transfers across known entailments where the entailments in question are ‘relevant’. Thus, knowledge that one is sitting down may transfer across a known entailment to the relevant proposition that one is not standing up, but it won’t transfer across a known entailment to the irrelevant proposition that one is not a BIV. Accordingly, the link between ordinary knowledge and anti-skeptical knowledge required by the skeptic is severed and ordinary knowledge is secured. Dretske himself puts the point as follows:

The general point may be put this way: there are certain presuppositions associated with a statement. These presuppositions, although their truth is entailed by the truth of the statement, are not part of what is operated on when we operate on the statement with one of our epistemic operators. The epistemic operators do not penetrate to these presuppositions. (Dretske 1970, 1014)

In effect, what Dretske is arguing here is that in everyday contexts an agent’s acquisition of knowledge of the propositions at issue in that context presupposes the falsity of certain irrelevant error-possibilities. That they are taken for granted is, for Dretske, entirely legitimate (that is, he rejects infallibilism). Nevertheless, the negations of these error-possibilities are often entailed by what is known in that context and thus, if closure held, it would follow that an agent could come to have knowledge of what is presupposed in her knowledge simply by knowing the relevant entailment. It is this that Dretske objects to, arguing that one’s epistemic position regarding the antecedent proposition will not transfer to the consequent proposition where the consequent proposition has performed this ‘presuppositional’ role.

An example will help clarify matters. Consider the following two propositions (adapted from ones adduced by Dretske (1970)):

(P) The animals in the pen are zebras.

(Q) The animals in the pen are not mules cleverly disguised to look like zebras.

Dretske argues that in normal circumstances one can come to know (P) without making any special checks to ensure that the irrelevant error-possibility at issue in (Q) is false. Instead, all the agent needs to do is have evidence that eliminates relevant error-possibilities (such as, for example, evidence to support her belief that it is the zebra enclosure and not the ape enclosure that she is looking at). This is fortunate, because if we demand that the agent must rule-out the kind of error-possibility at issue in (Q) (and thus, one might reasonably assume, know (Q)) before she can know (P), then we will end up setting the requirement for knowledge at a very high level. Indeed, it will be highly unlikely that your average agent would be able to know a proposition like (P) if this demand is made, because the average agent would not be able to tell a zebra apart from a cleverly disguised mule. Nevertheless, Dretske acknowledges that the agent’s knowledge of (P) presupposes that the error-possibility at issue in (Q) is false. Here is the crux, however. If we allow closure to stand, then it will follow from the agent’s knowledge of (P), and her knowledge of the entailment from (P) to (Q), that she thereby knows (Q) also, even though we have already granted that the agent in question is not in a position to be able to know such a thing. Dretske puts the point as follows:

If you are tempted to say [that the agent does know (Q) ...], think for a moment about the reasons that you have, what evidence you can produce in favour of this claim. The evidence you had for thinking them zebras has been effectively neutralised, since it does not count toward their not being mules cleverly disguised. Have you checked with the zoo authorities? Did you examine the animals closely enough to detect such a fraud? (Dretske 1970, 1016)

Dretske thus concludes that we should instead allow that an agent might be able to know (P) whilst failing to know (Q), and thus, given that the entailment is known, that closure fails.

This is certainly a very compelling argument, and it does at the very least offer a prima facie case against closure. The job is not quite done, however, because we also need to be given an account of knowledge which will flesh-out this account of relevance. After all, we have strong intuitions that our epistemic concepts do license closure. It is to this end that Dretske (1971) went on to develop his ‘modal’ account of knowledge, an account which was adapted and supplemented by Robert Nozick (1981).

What Dretske needs is a theory of knowledge which, whilst being plausible, can also explain how we can know everyday propositions whilst failing to know the denials of skeptical hypotheses, even in cases where we know that the everyday proposition in question entails the relevant denial of the skeptical hypothesis. Given these arduous demands, his proposal is, to say the least, ingenious. In essence, what Dretske does is to adduce a modal condition on knowledge, what I will call ‘Dretskean Sensitivity’, that can be roughly expressed as follows:

Dretskean Sensitivity

If P were not true, then the agent would not believe P.

The basic idea behind Dretskean Sensitivity is that for a belief to count as knowledge it must at least ‘track’ the truth in the sense that, not only is it true but, had what is believed been false, the agent would not have believed it. With this condition in play, Dretske can get the result he wants.

Suppose the actual world is pretty much as I take it to be. It follows that my belief that I am currently in my office and my belief that I am not a BIV are both true. Now consider whether the former belief counts as an instance of knowledge. On this account it does (at least pending any further conditions that one wants to add to Dretskean Sensitivity), because in the nearest possible world in which I am not in my office – the world in which, for example, I am in the corridor outside my office – I no longer believe that I am. My belief thus ‘tracks’ the truth adequately to be a candidate for knowledge. In contrast, consider my belief that I am not a BIV. The problem with this belief is that in the nearest possible world in which this belief is false (that is, the BIV-world), I continue to have a belief that I am not a BIV because in this world I am the victim of a widespread deception. Accordingly, this belief fails to meet necessary condition for knowledge set out in Dretskean Sensitivity and thus is not even in the running to be an instance of knowledge.

Dretske can thus use Dretskean Sensitivity to explain why closure fails by showing how knowledge needs to be understood relative to a certain relevant range of possible worlds which is variable depending upon the proposition at issue. As a result, one can know one proposition relative to one set of possible worlds, know the entailment to a second proposition, and yet fail to know the second proposition relative to a different set of possible worlds. More specifically, one can have knowledge of everyday propositions relative to one set of possible worlds that is ‘near-to’ the actual world, know that it entails the denial of a skeptical hypothesis, and yet lack knowledge of the denial of the skeptical hypothesis because knowledge is here relative to the ‘far-off’ possible worlds that are quite unlike the actual world. The notion of ‘relevance’ at issue in the basic RA account is thus cashed-out in explicitly modal terms. Moreover, since a number of logical principles fail in modal contexts because of this sort of variability, it should not come as much of a surprise to find that closure meets a similar fate. Dretske is thus in a position to offer a plausible account of knowledge that can accommodate all of the claims that we saw him wanting to make earlier.

This conception of knowledge, along with the later more elaborate version advanced by Nozick (1981), has been extremely influential. It is worth noting, however, that it is an epistemologically revisionist anti-skeptical proposal because it results in the denial of the highly plausible principle of closure. With this in mind, there is a prima facie tension involved in adopting such a proposal, despite the compelling defence of this position that Dretske, Nozick and others have offered. After all, the idea that we must know the known consequences of what we know is extremely strong and the rejection of this claim cannot be taken lightly. As Keith DeRose (1995, §5), has pointed out, dropping closure means allowing what he calls “abominable conjunctions”, such as that one knows that one has two hands but one does not know that one is not a BIV. That closure should hold has been one of the main motivations for alternative interpretations of the core RA anti-skeptical thesis that do not result in the rejection of closure, as we will see in a moment.

Besides this line of criticism against the Dretske-Nozick account, a number of other claims have been made. I will focus here on those avenues of critique that are directed at the view presented as an anti-skeptical proposal, rather than as an analysis (albeit perhaps only a partial one) of knowledge. Edward Craig (1989; 1990), for instance, has argued that the Dretske-Nozick proposal is either impotent at meeting skeptical arguments or unnecessary. After all, the strategy only works on the assumption that skeptical possible worlds are indeed far-off worlds, and Craig argues that if we are entitled to that supposition then we have no need of an anti-skeptical strategy. Conversely, if we are not entitled to that supposition, then the modal analysis of knowledge offered by Dretske and Nozick leaves us in an impasse with the skeptic which is no better than we were in before. That is, all that the Dretskean approach will have achieved is to show us that, provided the world is in fact pretty much as we take it to be, then skepticism is false and this still leaves the issue of whether the world is in fact pretty much as we take it to be unresolved.

Craig’s objection is surely wrong, however, because the skeptical argument purported to show that knowledge was impossible, and the Dretske-Nozick account at least refutes this claim by showing that knowledge is possible; that we can have knowledge provided that certain conditions obtain. What is true, however, is that there is nothing in the Dretske-Nozick line which demands that the agent should be able to become reflectively aware that we have met these conditions if we are to have knowledge, and this ‘externalist’ element of the view may well be problematic. For if this is the case then the existential force of skepticism – that we could indeed, for all we can tell, be a victim of a skeptical hypothesis – is just as powerful as ever. The worry here is that there is always going to be something intellectually unsatisfactory about an anti-skeptical proposal that is run along epistemologically externalist lines. We will consider the role of epistemological externalism and internalism in the skeptical debate in more detail below, since it raises issues which impact upon all anti-skeptical proposals, regardless of whether they retain closure.

The large body of critical appraisal of the Dretskean proposal falls, however, on the rejection of the closure principle, closure. There are two ways in which this critique is often run. Either critics argue directly for the retention of closure and thereby against the Dretskean line by default, or else they try to offer an alternative construal of the motivation for the Dretskean line that retains closure. Peter Klein (1981; 1995) is a good representative of the former position, arguing that, contra Dretske, we can indeed come to know (/be justified in believing) that the animal in the pen is not a cleverly disguised mule on the basis of our knowledge (/justified true belief) that it is a zebra and our knowledge of the entailment. Central to Klein’s view is a commitment to epistemological internalism, whose role in the skeptical debate will be discussed below, and a certain view about the structure of reasons that we do not have the space to go into here. The most interesting attacks on the Dretskean approach to closure do not come from this quarter, however, but from those who claim to be motivated by similar epistemological concerns as those which motivate Dretske himself. After all, that one who endorses a radically different conception of the epistemological landscape should not find the Dretskean proposal plausible is not nearly so intriguing as dissent from those who sign-up to many of the key Dretskean claims. In particular, it is interesting to note that two of the main rival views to the Dretskean line are wrought out of the same basic RA claims.

Consider again the core RA thought. This is was that certain error-possibilities are irrelevant to the determination of knowledge, and thus that one can have knowledge merely by eliminating the salient error-possibilities. With this characterisation of the core RA thesis in mind, the natural question to ask is why the core RA thought should be spelt-out along Dretskean lines. After all, the Dretskean line does take far-off skeptical possible worlds to be relevant to the determination of knowledge (albeit only knowledge of anti-skeptical propositions), whereas the basic RA idea was surely that such far-off worlds were manifestly irrelevant to the determination of knowledge (any knowledge). There thus seems to be an ambiguity in the RA thesis. Either we take it as meaning that relevance is determined by the nearest not-P world (no matter how far-out that might be), and thus end up with the thesis that Dretske and Nozick propose, or else we construe it as simply demanding that only near-by possible worlds are relevant worlds. This is no mere technical dispute either, since a great deal hangs upon which alternative we adopt.

After all, if we adopt the latter reading of the core RA thesis then we are left with the thought that knowledge possession only requires tracking the truth in near-by possible worlds and on this construal the motivation for denying closure fades. For not only will an agent’s belief in an everyday proposition typically track the truth in near-by possible worlds, so will her belief that she is not a BIV (since she is, by hypothesis, not a BIV in any near-by world). Admittedly, this belief will not track the truth in the nearest possible world in which she is a BIV, but since this possible world is far-off, this fact alone should not suffice on this construal of the RA thesis to undermine her knowledge. An entirely different reading of the core RA thesis thus seems to license the denial of the first premise of the skeptical argument, (S1) – that we are unable to know the denials of skeptical hypotheses – rather than the denial of closure and thus the rejection of the second premise, (S2). Moreover, that this reading of the RA thesis does not result in the failure of closure means that it does possess some considerable dialectical advantage over the Dretske-Nozick thesis.

We will consider how such an approach to skepticism might function in more detail below. First, however, we will look at a different reading of the core RA thesis that also does not result in the denial of closure. Where this line differs from the one just canvassed is that it does not straightforwardly allow that one can know the denials of skeptical hypotheses either. Instead, it argues that the standards for relevance are variable such that, although one knows everyday propositions and thus the denials of skeptical hypotheses relative to a low standard of relevance, one lacks knowledge of these everyday propositions and thus of the denials of skeptical hypotheses at high standards of relevance. In this way, the hope is that this thesis can explain both our skeptical and anti-skeptical intuitions (and our attachment to closure), whilst nevertheless denying the universal correctness of the skeptical argument. This anti-skeptical thesis is contextualism, and since the version that we will be considering regards the mechanisms that alter these standards of relevance to be conversational mechanisms, we will call it semantic contextualism.

3. Semantic Contextualism

Semantic contextualism – as put forward by such figures as Stewart Cohen (1987; 1988; 1991; 1999; 2000), DeRose (1995) and David Lewis (1996) – is without doubt the most dominant form of anti-skeptical theory in the current literature. In essence, this view maintains that skeptical arguments only seem to work because they exploit the way in which the correct employment of our epistemic concepts (such as knowledge) can be influenced by features of the conversational context. More specifically, semantic contextualists argue that the standards for knowledge possession fluctuate depending on what is at issue in that conversational context. Accordingly, they are in a position to allow that both skepticism and anti-skepticism could, in a restricted sense, be true. In skeptical conversational contexts where the standards are high, the skeptical conclusion that we know very little will be true. In contrast, in non-skeptical conversational contexts where the standards will be relatively low, we are in a position to know much of what we think we know, albeit only to this low epistemic standard.

In what follows, I will primarily focus my explication of the semantic contextualist thesis by looking at DeRose’s version since this is the most developed (and, arguably, the most influential) characterisation of the thesis which incorporates most of the main features of the other two accounts. Later on, however, I’ll mention some of the key differences between these three versions of the semantic contextualist view. Moreover, in §4, I will be looking at a different type of contextualist theory that is advanced by Michael Williams (1991) – what I call inferential contextualism – which does not conform to the basic semantic contextualist template.

Before we look at the DeRose version of the semantic contextualist thesis, however, it is worthwhile first being clear about the following supposed features of the ‘phenomenology’ of our engagement with skepticism since semantic contextualism can most naturally be viewed as a response, and to some extent as an accommodation, of these features:

I. Ascriptions of knowledge to subjects in conversational contexts in which skeptical error-

possibilities have been raised seems improper.

II. In conversational contexts in which no skeptical error-possibilities are in play it seems perfectly appropriate to ascribe knowledge to subjects.

III. All that may change when one moves from a non-skeptical conversational context to a skeptical context are mere conversational factors.

The first two features represent what Williams (1991, chapter one) refers to as our ‘biperspectivalism’, our intuition that skepticism is compelling under the conditions of philosophical reflection but never able to impact on everyday life where it is all but ignored. The third feature creates the tension because it highlights our sense that one of these judgements must be wrong. That is, since conversational topic has no obvious bearing on the epistemic status of a subject’s beliefs, that it ought to be universally true (that is, whatever the conversational context) that the subject either does or does not know the propositions in question. So either our knowledge ascriptions in everyday contexts are right (and thus the skeptic is wrong), in which case we shouldn’t take skepticism so seriously in conversational contexts in which skepticism is at issue; or else the skeptic is right, and thus our everyday practice of ascribing knowledge is under threat. Semantic contextualism opposes this thought with the suggestion that what is actually occurring is not a contradiction but a responsiveness, on the part of the attributor of knowledge, to a fluctuation in the epistemic standards (and with them the subject’s possession of knowledge) caused by a change in the conversational context. In effect, and contra the third claim listed above, semantic contextualism holds that mere changes in the conversational context can have an effect on the epistemic status of one’s beliefs so that it can be true both that one has knowledge in everyday contexts whilst lacking it in skeptical conversational contexts.

Accordingly, we find DeRose (1995) arguing that the basic contextualist strategy pivots upon the acceptability, and appropriate use, of the following contextualist thesis:

Suppose a speaker A (for “attributor”) says, “S knows that P”, of a subject S’s true belief that P. According to contextualist theories of knowledge attributions, how strong an epistemic position S must be in with respect to P for A’s assertion to be true can vary according to features of A’s conversational context. (DeRose 1995, 4)

Here we get the essentials of the semantic contextualist view. In particular, we get (i) the claim that the strength of epistemic position that an agent needs to be in if she is to have knowledge can fluctuate from context to context (which makes the thesis contextualist); and (ii) the claim that what is at issue in the determination of contexts in this respect is the conversational context (which makes the contextualist thesis semantic). The interesting question now is how the details of how this account is to function are to be spelt-out.

The first thing that DeRose tries to capture is the intuition that as one moves from one conversational context to another one’s epistemic situation (one’s total informational state for instance) could remain exactly the same. DeRose accommodates this intuition in conjunction with the contextualist picture by arguing, as the above quotation indicates, that although one’s “epistemic position” is constant at any one time, the epistemic position that one needs to be in so as to count as possessing knowledge can be variable. Strength of “epistemic position” is characterised by DeRose as follows:

[...] being in a strong epistemic position with respect to P is to have a belief as to whether P is true match the fact of the matter as to whether P is true, not only in the actual world, but also at the worlds sufficiently close to the actual world. That is, one’s belief should not only be true, but also should be non-accidentally true, where this requires one’s belief as to whether P is true to match the fact of the matter at nearby worlds. The further away one gets from the actual world, while still having it be the case that one’s belief matches the fact at worlds that far away and closer, the stronger a position one is in with respect to P. (DeRose 1995, 34)

In order to see this, imagine that Lars believes that his car is outside on the basis of a certain fixed informational state (which involves, perhaps, his memory of the car being there a few hours ago, his grounds for believing that no-one would steal it, and so forth). Now imagine an (almost) exact counterpart of Lars – Lars* – who is in exactly the same cognitive state except that he has the extra piece of information that the car was there a minute ago (perhaps he looked). Clearly, Lars* will be in a slightly better epistemic position with respect to his belief that his car is outside than Lars. Although they will, in general, track the truth across the same set of possible worlds, Lars* will track the truth in a few extra possible worlds, such as the possible worlds in which his car was stolen ten minutes ago.

DeRose then goes on to describe the mechanism which changes the conversational context (and thereby alters the epistemic standards at play) in terms of the thesis of Dretskean Sensitivity that we saw above. Recall that for an agent to have a belief in P that is sensitive in this way, the agent must not only have a true belief in P in the actual world, but also not believe P in the nearest possible world (or worlds) in which P is false. DeRose’s thought is that in any particular conversational context there is a certain set of propositions that are explicitly at issue and that the agent must, at the very least, be sensitive to all these ‘explicit’ propositions if she is to know them. Moreover, the most demanding of these propositions – the proposition which has a negation that occupies the furthest-out possible world – will set the standard for that conversational context since this not-P world will determine the extent of possible worlds that one’s beliefs must be able to track if one is to be truly said to know a proposition in that context. Knowing a proposition thus involves being in an epistemic position sufficient to track the truth across the range of possible worlds determined by the most demanding proposition explicit to that context. Crucially, however (and I will be expanding upon this detail in a moment), this point also applies to propositions which are implicit to a conversational context (that is, propositions which one believes but which are not explicit to that conversational context). In order to know such a proposition – even if one’s belief in that proposition is not sensitive – one need only be in a sufficient epistemic position to meet the standards of that context. (The importance of this point will soon become apparent).

DeRose then characterises the mechanism that brings about an upward shift in epistemic standards as follows:

When it is asserted that some subject S knows (or does not know) some proposition P, the standards for knowledge (the standards for how good an epistemic position one must be in to count as knowing) tend to be raised, if need be, to such a level as to require S’s belief in that particular P to be sensitive for it to count as knowledge. (DeRose 1995, 36)

That is, what changes a conversational context is when a new proposition is made explicit to that context which is more demanding than any of the propositions currently explicit in that context. This will thus increase the range of possible worlds at issue in the determination of knowledge, and thereby increase the strength of epistemic position required in order to be truly said to know.

What motivates this claim is the fact that, as Lewis (1979) famously argued, when it comes to ‘context-sensitive’ terms like ‘flat’ or ‘knowledge’, the conversational ‘score’ tends to change depending upon the assertions of that context. We may all agree that the table in front of us is ‘flat’ in an everyday context, but, ceteris paribus, if someone enters the room and denies that it is flat we do not thereby disagree with her. Instead, we take it that she means ‘flat’ in some more demanding sense and so raise the standards for ‘flatness’ so as to make her assertion true (this is what Lewis (1996, 559) calls a “rule of accommodation”). That is, we take it that the new participant of our conversational context means flat in some more restricted sense so that the barely perceptible bumps on the table before us are sufficient to make the claim “This table is flat” false. DeRose considers the Lewis line to have captured something intuitive about the pragmatics of how we use our ‘context-sensitive’ terms and, moreover, believes that epistemic terms such as ‘knowledge’ behave in a similar way.

An example will help clarify matters here. Imagine an agent in a quotidian context in which only everyday propositions, such as whether or not one is currently having dinner with one’s brother (P), or whether or not the garden gate has been closed (Q), are at issue. Sensitivity to these everyday propositions will only require the consideration of nearby possible worlds and thus the strength of epistemic position demanded will be very weak. Let us say, plausibly, that the possible world in which one is not having dinner with one’s brother is ‘further-out’ than the possible world in which the garden gate is not closed. This proposition will thus determine the range of possible worlds at issue in the determination of knowledge in that conversational context. Let us further suppose that the agent in question does have a sensitive belief in this proposition. The issue of what other propositions the subject knows will now be decided by whether the agent’s belief in those propositions will track the truth across the range of possible worlds determined by not-P. If, for instance, the agent’s belief that the garden gate is closed matches the truth as to whether Q in all of the possible worlds within that range, then she will know Q. Equally, however, if the subject’s belief in a proposition which is implicit to that conversational context tracks the truth across this range of possible worlds then that proposition will be known also, even if the agent’s belief in that proposition is not sensitive.

Consider, for instance, the agent’s belief that she is not a BIV, a proposition which, as we saw above, one cannot be sensitive to because in the nearest BIV-world one still believes that one is not a BIV. On the contextualist model, however, if one is in a conversational context in which such a proposition is not explicit, then one can know this proposition just so long as one has a belief as to whether this proposition is true which matches the facts as to whether it is true within the range of possible worlds at issue. And, clearly, this demand will be trivially satisfied in the above scenario where the subject has a sensitive belief in the ordinary proposition, P. After all, insofar as one has such a sensitive belief in P, then it must be the case that the BIV skeptical world is, modally speaking, far-out, for if it weren’t, then this would affect the sensitivity of the subject’s beliefs in ordinary propositions like P. Accordingly, on this view, all the subject needs in this context is a stubborn belief that she is not a BIV in order to be truly said to know this proposition in this conversational context. The contextualist can thus capture the second element of the ‘phenomenology’ of our engagement with skepticism that we noted above – that, in quotidian conversational contexts, we are perfectly willing to ascribe knowledge of everyday propositions and also feel that we must know the denials of skeptical hypotheses as well.

One might wonder why I use the word ‘feel’ here. Well, the reason is that, on the contextualist account, if one were to explicitly mention these anti-skeptical propositions (as one would if one were to verbally ascribe knowledge of them to oneself), then one would thereby make that proposition explicit to the conversational context and so change the epistemic standards needed for knowledge accordingly. In order to have knowledge that one is not a BIV within the new conversational context, one’s belief that one is not a BIV must now exhibit sensitivity (which, as we saw above, is impossible), and the possible worlds relevant to the determination of that sensitivity will be relevant to one’s knowledge of even everyday propositions. Accordingly, one will now lack knowledge both of the denial of the skeptical hypothesis (because one’s belief in this respect is not sensitive), and of the everyday propositions (since even though one’s beliefs in these propositions are sensitive, one can never be in an epistemic position that would support knowledge of them which would be strong enough to track the truth in far-off BIV-worlds). The contextualist thus claims to have captured the other two aspects of the ‘phenomenology’ of our engagement with skepticism – that we are completely unwilling to ascribe knowledge in skeptical conversational contexts, and that this is even so when the only thing that may have changed from the non-skeptical conversational context in which we were willing to ascribe knowledge is the course of the conversation. Moreover, the contextualist has done this without either conceding the universal truth of skepticism (since skepticism is false in everyday contexts), or denying closure (since there is no single context in which one both knows an everyday proposition whilst lacking knowledge of the denial of a skeptical hypothesis). Accordingly, DeRose claims to have ‘solved’ the skeptical paradox in an entirely intuitive manner.

The semantic contextualist proposals made by Lewis, Cohen and others run along similar lines to the DeRose thesis. The key difference between DeRose and Lewis is that Lewis cashes-out his thesis in terms of a series of rules which determine when we may and may not properly ignore a certain error-possibility rather than in terms of a general modal account of knowledge. The key difference between Cohen’s position and that advanced by Lewis and DeRose is that it is centred upon the concept of justification rather than knowledge and incorporates a certain view about the structure of reasons (Cohen 1999; 2000). That the DeRose view differs in these ways from the views presented by Lewis and Cohen may work in its favour. As Timothy Williamson (2001) has pointed out, DeRose’s more straightforward position may be insulated from the kind of ad hoc charges regarding Lewis’ employment of numerous rules governing when an error-possibility is properly ignored, (as put forward, for example, by Williams (2001)). Moreover, the stress on justification in Cohen’s account can make it unappealing to those who find such a notion problematic, at least insofar as it is understood as playing an essential role in knowledge acquisition. There are thus prima facie grounds for thinking that if any semantic contextualist theory will work, then it will be one run along the lines presented by DeRose.

In any case, the most interesting objections against semantic externalism do not rest upon specific elements of the particular versions of this position, but rather strike against the general approach. Perhaps the most obvious concern facing semantic contextualism is that its claim that the epistemic status of an agent’s beliefs can be variable in response to mere conversational factors is highly contentious. For instance, contra Cohen’s (1991) contextualist characterisation of his RA position, Dretske writes:

Knowledge is relative, yes, but relative to the extra-evidential circumstances of the knower and those who, like the knower, have the same stake in what is true in the matter in question. Knowledge is context sensitive, according to this view, but it is not indexical. If two people disagree about what is known, they have a genuine disagreement. They can’t both be right. (Dretske 1991, 191)

That is, Dretske rejects outright the thought that the truth-value of a knowledge claim can be dependent upon anything other than what the concrete features of the situation are. I won’t undertake a detailed discussion of this line of attack against semantic contextualism here, however, since the semantic contextualist proposal is clearly meant to be understood as a revisionistic proposal in this respect. Indeed, this is to be expected given that, as we have already seen, any plausible anti-skeptical proposal will have to deny some claim that is otherwise thought to be intuitive (Dretske himself denies closure, for example). To query this element of the thesis alone is thus not to give it a run for its money (although, if one can couple this line of critique with other concerns then it can carry some dialectical weight).

The other more general lines of criticism against semantic contextualism fall into three main camps. First, there is the allegation that semantic contextualism leaves us no better off than we were before. Second, there is the worry about how the contextualist is to explain our knowledge (albeit only in quotidian contexts) of the denials of skeptical hypotheses. After all, as we noted above, we do have a strong intuition that we can never know such propositions in any context (recall that this intuition was one of the motivating factors behind the Dretskean theory). Third, there is the claim that semantic contextualism is guilty of over-kill in its approach to skepticism in that it essentially incorporates a claim which would suffice to undermine radical skepticism by itself (i. e., regardless of whether it is combined with a general contextualist thesis). Accordingly, on this view, contextualism is both unnecessary and ill-motivated.

The worry that motivates the first concern is that what semantic contextualism does concede to the skeptic is the ‘hierarchical’ structure of her doubts. That is, on the semantic contextualist view the skeptic is indeed working at a high epistemic standard, one that is more demanding than our everyday standards. The problem with conceding this much to the skeptic is that it appears to legitimate the concern that the skeptic’s standards are the right standards, and thus that, although we are content to ascribe everyday knowledge in quotidian contexts, we ought not to ascribe such knowledge because, strictly speaking, we lack knowledge relative to the proper skeptical standards that should be employed (see Pritchard 2001a for a development of this problem). This line of thought should be familiar as the general infallibilist line that we saw Unger arguing for in §2 and one might think that one could dismiss it on the same grounds that were canvassed there. Matters are not quite so simple, however. Indeed, it is interesting that in more recent works Unger (1984; 1986) has toned down his commitment to infallibilism in favour of a different conception of the skeptical debate which argues that there is nothing to tell between the contextualist reading of our epistemic concepts and what he calls ‘invariantism’, which would license infallibilist conclusions. Unger’s point here is that all contextualism can achieve is, at best, a kind of impasse with the skeptic such that we know that one of these views must be right but where we are unable to definitively determine which. Is it that the standards are high and only seem variable because we are content to talk loosely in everyday contexts (in which case the infallibilist, and thus the skeptic, is right), or is it that our epistemic concepts are genuinely variable and thus that we do have knowledge relative to low everyday epistemic standards (in which case the contextualist is right and the skeptic is wrong)? The skeptical thought that arises here is that if we are unable to offer sufficient reasons for preferring the latter scenario over the former then contextualism does not put us in a better situation than we were in before.

The second worry – that contextualism is unable to explain how we can have knowledge of the denials of skeptical hypotheses – is particularly striking because if this claim holds then semantic contextualism does not even supply us with an impasse with the skeptic. Instead, the position would simply be incoherent. The thought here is that since our, presumably empirical, knowledge in this respect cannot be coherently thought of as being the result of an empirical investigation, hence we cannot make sense of it at all. Perhaps the bravest response to this line of attack in the recent literature can be found in the suggestion made by both Cohen (1999; 2000) and DeRose (2000) that it might be possible to understand an agent’s knowledge of the denials of skeptical hypotheses along a priori lines. Cohen motivates this thought relative to what he terms the “a priori rationality” of denying skeptical error-possibilities (e.g. Cohen 2000, 104), whilst DeRose employs Putnamian reflections on semantic externalism as a means of showing how we might have a priori knowledge of empirical truths.

Even if these lines of argument could be made palatable, however, a further line of attack (the third worry listed above) would instantly emerge. For if we can indeed make sense of our putative knowledge of the denials of skeptical hypotheses then what could the motivation for an epistemologically revisionist thesis like contextualism possibly be? After all, the epistemological revisionism incorporated in contextualism only seemed necessary because our knowledge of these propositions seemed so insecure. If we can have knowledge of these propositions, however, then why not simply motivate one’s anti-skepticism by straightforwardly denying the first premise of the skeptical argument, (S1), rather than by going contextualist? We will return to consider this kind of anti-skeptical proposal – known as the ‘Neo-Moorean’ view – in more detail in §5.

4. “Hinge” Propositions and Inferential Contextualism

Before we look at this neo-Moorean approach to radical skepticism, however, it is worthwhile to first consider two lines of argument which, at least superficially, might appear to be analogue approaches to that of the Dretskean and semantic contextualist line. Where these anti-skeptical approaches differ, in the first instance at least, from those just canvassed, is that they primarily take their stimulus not from the RA debate but from Wittgenstein’s last notebooks (published as On Certainty) which were on the topic of knowledge and skepticism.

Both of these accounts focus upon the Wittgensteinian notion of a “hinge proposition”, though they each use the notion in a different way. The first camp, which includes such figures as Peter Strawson (1985), Crispin Wright (1985; 1991; 2000), Hilary Putnam (1992) and Avrum Stroll (1994) might be considered to be offering the purest hinge proposition thesis because for them the notion is the primary unit upon which their anti-skepticism rests. In contrast, the conception of this notion employed by Williams (1991) is developed along explicitly contextualist lines. Interestingly, however, the type of contextualism that emerges is not of a semantic variety. I will consider each of these views in turn. First, however, we need to look a little at what Wittgenstein had in mind in his employment of this notion.

Wittgenstein describes hinge propositions as follows:

[...] the questions that we raise and our doubts depend upon the fact that some propositions are exempt from doubt, are as it were like hinges on which those turn.

That is to say, it belongs to the logic of our scientific investigations that certain things are in deed not doubted.

But it isn’t that the situation is like this: We just can’t investigate everything, and for that reason we are forced to rest content with assumption. If I want the door to turn, the hinges must stay put. (Wittgenstein 1969 §§341-3)

As this quotation indicates, what is odd about these propositions is that, unlike other seemingly empirical propositions, our belief in them does not seem to either stand in need of evidential buttress or, for that matter, be legitimately prone to coherent doubt. And this property is not explained merely by the fact that these propositions are “in deed not doubted”, since the situation is rather that we do not doubt them because, in some sense, we ought not to doubt them. Even despite their lack of sufficient evidential support, their immunity to coherent doubt is part of “the logic of our scientific investigations.”

In proposing this notion Wittgenstein was explicitly challenging the conventional epistemological wisdom that a belief is only legitimately held if it is sufficiently evidentially grounded (otherwise it is open to legitimate doubt), and that no belief in an empirical proposition is beyond coherent doubt should the grounds for that belief be found wanting. In particular, Wittgenstein’s remarks here were primarily targeted at G. E. Moore’s (1925; 1939) famous “common-sense” response to the skeptic. In effect, what Moore did was reverse the skeptical train of reasoning by arguing, on the basis of his conviction that the skeptical conclusion must be false, that he did know the denial of the relevant skeptical hypothesis after all. In general, the Moorean response to the skeptic is to respond to the skeptic’s modus ponens argument with the corresponding modus tollens.

Wittgenstein claimed that where Moore went wrong was in treating a hinge proposition as if it were just a normal empirical proposition. In particular, he focussed upon Moore’s use of the everyday proposition ‘I have two hands’ in this respect, arguing that this is, in normal circumstances, a hinge proposition and thus that the certainty that we attach to it is not due to any evidence that we might have for its favour but rather reflects the fact that in those circumstances it is what ‘stands fast’ in our assessment of other propositions. Nothing is more certain that this proposition in ordinary circumstances, and thus no other belief could be coherently regarded as providing support for it or be coherently thought to undermine it. As Wittgenstein puts the matter at one point:

My having two hands is, in normal circumstances, as certain as anything that I could produce in evidence for it.

That is why I am not in a position to take the sight of my hand as evidence for it. (Wittgenstein 1969 §250)

Given that this is so, however, Moore cannot use the certainty he has for this proposition in order to derive support for his belief in the denials of skeptical hypotheses since, strictly speaking, his belief in this proposition is not grounded at all. Indeed, Wittgenstein goes further to argue that, insofar as Moore regards this proposition as being grounded by the evidence he has for it, then the circumstances are no longer ‘normal’ in the relevant respects and thus the proposition is no longer a hinge proposition. And in these conditions, it would be ridiculous to try to buttress one’s belief in the denials of skeptical hypotheses with the support that one has for this proposition (Wittgenstein (1969, §20) compares it to basing one’s belief in the existence of the external world on the grounds one has for thinking that there are other planets).

Wittgenstein is not endorsing radical skepticism by attacking Moore in this way, for the general anti-skeptical line that emerges is that where the skeptic, like Moore, goes wrong is in considering certain basic propositions as being coherently open to doubt. In doing so, or so the argument runs, she fails to pay due attention to the pivotal role that certain, apparently ordinary, propositions can play in our systems of beliefs and thus to the manner in which even everyday propositions can be held with conviction without thereby standing in need of a corresponding degree of evidential buttress.

So construed, the hinge proposition line is largely a diagnosis of why we are so tempted by skeptical arguments rather than a refutation of the skeptical argument. Indeed, in the hands of Strawson (1985), Putnam (1992), and Stroll (1994) this is what the hinge proposition line is largely designed to do. So construed, however, it is difficult to see what comfort it offers. After all, it is far from clear that it results in the denial of any of the intuitions that we saw at issue in our formulation of the skeptical argument in §1. In particular, this diagnostic thesis neither results in the denial of closure nor in a contextualist thesis. Moreover, the standard hinge proposition line explicitly allows that hinge propositions are not known, strictly speaking, since they fall outside of the ambit of epistemic evaluation (being instead the nodes around which epistemic evaluation takes place). The anti-skeptical import of the basic hinge proposition line is thus moot.

In the hands of Wright (1985; 1991; 2000) and Williams (1991), however, one finds a much stronger version of this approach. I will focus on each in turn. In effect, Wright argues that doubting hinge propositions does not merely reflect a misunderstanding of the epistemological landscape, rather it also leads to intellectual self-subversion. The most sophisticated of these arguments can be found in Wright (1991), where he attempts to show that dreaming skepticism must be unsound because it leads to a more radical form of doubt which undermines the very presuppositions that the skeptic needs to employ in order to get her dreaming skepticism off the ground. Thus, dreaming skepticism is necessarily intellectually self-subverting and thus it can be disregarded with impunity. What this line adds to the previous approaches is a principled epistemic ground for discounting the skeptic’s doubt. In particular, since it is epistemically irrational to doubt the hinge propositions in question, the implication of the argument that Wright offers is that we can indeed know the denials of skeptical hypotheses on the basis of our knowledge of everyday propositions even though our belief in the former is not evidentially grounded. As Wright (1991, 107-8) puts the point, “the impossibility of earning a warrant that one is not now dreaming does not imply that no such warrant is ever possessed.”

Although Wright does succeed in at least showing how the diagnosis of radical skepticism that the hinge proposition line offers might lead to a refutation of the skeptical argument, a number of problems with his approach remain. One worry concerns the examples of hinge propositions that he uses. Whereas Wittgenstein seemed to have everyday propositions in mind in his use of this notion (and ‘I have two hands’ in particular), Wright’s argument only works if one takes the denials of skeptical hypotheses as hinge propositions, a move that receives only ambiguous support in the text. A more serious worry concerns how, exactly, we are to cash-out this idea that the warrant which underpins our putative knowledge of the denials of hinge propositions can be “unearned” in the fashion that Wright envisages (see Pritchard 2001c). After all, the idea that we could have knowledge of these propositions purely because we have knowledge of everyday propositions does seem to be question begging. Again, then, the worry about closure in the context of the skeptical debate is brought to the fore. The intuition that closure holds leads us to think that an anti-skeptical theory must incorporate the claim that we can know the denials of skeptical hypotheses, even though such knowledge bears few, if any, of the usual hallmarks of empirical knowledge. This tension can only be resolved by either denying closure or allowing that we can know the denials of skeptical hypotheses, but each of these moves raises tensions of its own.

Wright responds to this latter worry in more recent work. Drawing upon remarks made by Martin Davies (1998), Wright (2000) argues that we need to distinguish between the principle of closure and what he terms the principle of “transmission”. In essence, his way around this concern about closure is to maintain that whilst knowledge does indeed transfer across known entailments as closure demands, it does not transmit, where transmission requires something more demanding. In particular, transmission demands that the “cogency” of the argument be preserved, which is its aptitude to produce rational conviction. Here is Wright:

A cogent argument is one whereby someone could be moved to rational conviction of the truth of its conclusion. (Wright 2000, 140)

So Wright’s thought is that if one does know the everyday propositions then, trivially, one must know the denials of skeptical hypotheses that are known to be entailed by those propositions. Nevertheless, that closure holds in these cases does not mean that any argument that attempts to establish anti-skeptical knowledge on this basis will be apt to convince a third party. After all, notes Wright, the argument is question begging in the relevant respect since it is only by taking for granted the denials of radical skeptical hypotheses (that is, by taking the relevant hinge propositions for granted) that the agent is able to have knowledge of the everyday propositions in the first place. This is a compelling move to make since it diagnoses the arguments against closure by characterising them in terms of how what is lacking from the conclusion is not knowledge but something just as valuable, a conclusion that is apt to convince. It also explains the failure of the Moorean approach, for where Moore goes wrong is not in lacking the knowledge that he claims to have, but rather in attempting to secure any conviction on the part of his audience by offering his argument. Indeed, this is a very Wittgensteinian claim to make since Wittgenstein himself argues that:

Moore’s mistake lies in this – countering the assertion that one cannot know that, by saying “I do know it”. (Wittgenstein 1969, §521, my italics)

As this quotation implies, the problem with Moore’s argument is precisely not the falsity of the conclusion (which would be to validate either radical skepticism or the denial of closure), but rather concerns the manner in which he proposes it and the ends that it is designed to serve.

Still, compelling though this approach is, we are still in need of an account of knowledge which can explain how it is that we can know such propositions as the denials of skeptical hypotheses, something which Wright himself does not offer (see Pritchard 2002a for more on this point). For this contribution to the anti-skeptical debate we must look elsewhere. I will consider such an account in a moment, for one could view the neo-Moorean strategy as presenting the required analysis. First, however, I will briefly mention another influential reading of the hinge proposition thesis, due to Williams (1991).

As might be expected, what identifies Williams’ inferential thesis as a contextualist account is that it incorporates the claim that one should understand knowledge relative to a context of some description. Like the semantic contextualist view put forward by DeRose et al, Williams argues that certain error-possibilities are only epistemically relevant, and thus potentially knowledge defeating, in certain contexts. Moreover, Williams is also keen to retain the closure principle. He does so on contextualist grounds, arguing that provided one keeps to the one context then closure will hold. As with the semantic contextualist position, then, apparent failures of closure are simply due to equivocations between different contexts.

The Williams line thus shares a central core of claims with the semantic contextualist view. Nevertheless, their disagreements are significant. The two main areas of disparity between the two theories are as follows. First, Williams does not individuate contexts along a ‘conversational’ axis, but rather in terms of the inferential structure of that context (hence the name, inferential contextualism). Second (and as we will see this point is closely related to the inferential thesis), Williams does not allow a context-independent hierarchy of contexts. That is, unlike the semantic contextualists, Williams does not, for example, regard the skeptical context as being a more epistemically demanding context. Rather, it is just a context which employs a different epistemic structure.

Indeed, on Williams’ view, contextualism just is the thesis that there is no such hierarchy of epistemic contexts – instead, each context is, epistemically speaking, autonomous. To think otherwise is, he thinks, to fall victim to the doctrine of “epistemological realism” – the view that the objects of epistemological inquiry have an inherent, and thus context-independent, structure. In contrast, the inferential contextualism that he advances is defined as the denial of this thesis. It holds that:

[...] the epistemic status of a given proposition is liable to shift with situational, disciplinary and other contextually variable factors: it is to hold that, independently of such influences, a proposition has no epistemic status whatsoever. (Williams 1991, 119)

And Williams is quite clear that this last phrase “has no epistemic status whatsoever” is meant to indicate that there is no context-independent means by which we can evaluate the standards wrought in different contexts. He describes his view as a “deflationary” theory of knowledge, in that it holds that there need be nothing that ties all instances of knowledge together other than the fact that they are instances of knowledge. He writes:

A deflationary account of “know” may show how the word is embedded in a teachable and useful linguistic practice, without supposing that “being known to be true” denotes a property that groups propositions into a theoretically significant kind. We can have an account of the use and utility of “know” without supposing that there is such a thing as human knowledge. (Williams 1991, 113)

It is as a consequence of such a view that the very validity of the epistemological enterprise, at least as it is commonly understood, is called into question:

If we give up the idea of pervasive, underlying epistemological constraints; if we start to see the plurality of constraints that inform the various special disciplines, never mind ordinary, unsystematic factual discourse, as genuinely irreducible; if we become suspicious of the idea that “our powers and faculties” can be evaluated independently of everything having to do with the world and our place in it: then we lose our grip on the idea of “human knowledge” as an object of theory. (Williams 1991, 106)

And to say that “human knowledge” is not a suitable object of theory is itself to say that the epistemological project cannot be systematically conceived. On Williams’ view there is no epistemological analysis to be conducted outside of contextual parameters and, accordingly, there are no context-independent standards either as the semantic contextualist model would suggest.

It is as a consequence of this stance that Williams is forced to concede that the skeptic is perfectly correct in her assessment of our knowledge, but only because she is operating within an epistemic context that utilises a standard which defeats our everyday knowledge. That is, the skeptic’s conclusions are correct, but, by being confined to a specific epistemic context, they lack the hegemony that she requires in order to cause the intended epistemic harm. It does not follow from the truth of skepticism that we lack the everyday knowledge that we attribute to ourselves, or even that such knowledge is inferior to the knowledge that the skeptic has in mind (which would, in line with the semantic contextualist view, presuppose a hierarchy). That is:

The skeptic takes himself to have discovered, under the conditions of philosophical reflection, that knowledge of the world is impossible. But in fact, the most he has discovered is that knowledge of the world is impossible under the conditions of philosophical reflection. (Williams 1991, 130)

So whereas the ‘hierarchical’ camp of semantic contextualists tend to individuate contexts in terms of a context-transcendent criterion of rigour, Williams’ schema allows no such ordering of contexts. For him, a context is individuated purely in terms of the epistemic structure it endorses – in terms of the inferential relations that obtain between the types of beliefs that that context is interested in. And since no context employs universal standards, this contextual epistemic structure is also identified in terms of what it takes for granted – which propositions it regards as being immune from doubt in terms of that context. Williams calls the defining assumptions of a context of inquiry its “methodological necessities”, and this notion is explicitly meant to capture the chief insights behind the Wittgensteinian notion of a hinge proposition. When we do history, for example, we take the general veracity of historical documentation for granted, as well as the denials of certain skeptical scenarios such as that the world came into existence five minutes ago replete with the traces of a distant ancestry (the so-called ‘Russellian Hypothesis’). To doubt such methodological necessities (/hinge propositions) is not, he argues, to conduct our historical investigations in a more exacting fashion, but rather to engage in a different sort of investigation altogether, one that is guided by traditional epistemological concerns.

The methodological necessities of the traditional epistemological project which, Williams claims, spawns the skeptical threat, are meant to involve a commitment to this false doctrine of epistemological realism. This leads, he argues, to an antiquated foundationalism, one manifestation of which is the traditional epistemologist’s concern with the problem of the external world. This problem is meant to reflect the inadequacy of beliefs of one type – concerning immediate experience – at serving the purpose of epistemically supporting beliefs of another type – concerning material objects in the external world. With the problem so characterised, Williams maintains that it should come as no surprise to find that it is without a solution (there are no beliefs concerning immediate experience that are able to act as epistemic guarantors for beliefs concerning objects in the material world). But, he contends, this need not result in a general external world skepticism because this conception of the inferential ordering needed for warranted beliefs about ‘external’ objects is far from obligatory. In terms of another type of inquiry, such as psychological investigations of perception for example, we may legitimately begin with beliefs about material objects and draw inferences about immediate experience. And since no context has any epistemological ascendancy over any other, the project of justifying psychological beliefs with reference to external world beliefs is just as valid as any epistemological theory which demanded that the inferential relations should point in the opposite direction.

Williams’ inferentialist contextualist view is thus both more radical and more demanding than its semantic counterpart. On the one hand, it is more radical because Williams does not concede to the skeptic that her skepticism functions at a higher epistemic standard. Instead, he argues that such skepticism merely reflects a different, and faulty, conception of the epistemological landscape. Williams’ view therefore evades one strand of criticism that we saw levelled at the semantic contextualist account above. On the other hand, it is more demanding because, for related reasons, Williams does not believe that mere changes in the conversational context can suffice to bring about a different epistemic context. Instead, there must be an actual difference in the inferential structure that is employed, and thus, given his contextualism, a difference in what is being taken for granted relative to what. Nevertheless, inferential contextualism may well carry with it even more troubling problems of its own, not least the worry that this approach is allied to a general quietistic philosophical approach. Critical appraisal of this theory has been limited, however, since this variant of the contextualist thesis has tended to be obscured by its semantic counterpart (though see Putnam 1998). As the dust settles on the current wave of discussion of the semantic contextualist proposal, one would expect this distinctive thesis to gain a greater degree of attention.

5. Neo-Moorean Responses to Skepticism

Back, then, to Wright, or, more specifically, to what was absent in Wright’s account, viz., an analysis of knowledge that could account for the conclusions that he presents. In essence, what Wright is offering is a neo-Moorean response to skepticism in that he allows, with Moore, that if we do know everyday propositions then we must know the denials of radical skeptical hypotheses that are known to be entailed by them. Where Wright differs from Moore is in not allowing that one can coherently argue to this conclusion in any way that could secure rational conviction. Like Moore, however, Wright fails to supplement this account with an analysis of knowledge that would support it. In so doing, Wright is failing to properly engage with other proponents of the debate regarding radical skepticism – such as Dretske, Nozick and DeRose – who do supplement their anti-skeptical account with an analysis of knowledge (albeit, perhaps, only a partial one) that backs-up their theory. Although Wright does not offer such an account, however, there are analyses of knowledge in the literature that might provide support for his view, and it is to these analyses that we now turn.

Recall that the Dretskean line made Dretskean Sensitivity an essential component of knowledge, where this demanded that an agent should have a belief which is not only true, but which ‘tracks’ the truth of the proposition in question in the nearest possible world in which that proposition is false, no matter how ‘far-off’, modally speaking, that world is. It was this element of the thesis that secured the skeptic’s first premise, (S1), because no-one’s belief in the denial of a radical skeptical hypothesis could track the truth in this sense. Similarly, DeRose also made Dretskean Sensitivity relevant to knowledge, albeit only as regards those propositions that were at issue in that context. Accordingly, in skeptical conversational contexts where skeptical hypotheses were at issue agents lacked knowledge of these propositions. What both of these anti-skeptical approaches have in common is thus that they allow that, at least in some contexts, we can lack knowledge of the denials of ‘far-off’ skeptical error-possibilities (and thus that the first premise of the skeptical argument, (S1), is true, at least in some contexts).

In contrast to these lines of thought, Ernest Sosa (1999; 2000) has argued that we should instead regard what he terms “safety” as being central to knowledge rather than sensitivity. In essence, he characterises this notion as follows (Sosa 1999, 142):


In all near-by possible worlds, if an agent believes P, then P is true.

Similar proposals have also been put forward by Mark Sainsbury (1997), Williamson (2000a; 2000b, chapter 8), and Duncan Pritchard (2002c; cf. Pritchard 2001a; 2001b; 2002a). The anti-skeptical advantage that this kind of proposal offers over both the Dretskean line and either of the contextualist views that we have discussed is that it allows one to endorse a version of the Moorean proposal which neither issues in the denial of closure nor results in contextualism.

Take the former point first. What prompted the denial of closure was the fact that, if we take sensitivity as a necessary condition on knowledge, then we must allow that a subject can know everyday propositions whilst being unable to know all the known consequences of those everyday propositions – i.e., the denials of skeptical hypotheses. In contrast, on this view we can allow both that agents have knowledge of everyday propositions and that they can know the denials of radical skeptical hypotheses. Suppose, for example, that the agent does have a safe belief in an everyday proposition. Not only is this belief true in the actual world, but, across the range of near-by possible worlds where she believes this proposition, it is true there as well. Insofar as this belief really is safe, however, then there will not be any skeptical possible worlds in the realm of near-by possible worlds which determine that safety (henceforth, the “realm of safety”). For if there were such worlds present in the realm of safety, then this would suffice to undermine the agent’s knowledge of the everyday proposition since there would then be a near-by possible world in which the agent still believes the everyday proposition but where this proposition is false (because the skeptical hypothesis is true). But since skeptical possible worlds are now excluded from the realm of safety, it follows that the agent must also have a safe belief that she is not a BIV (or, indeed, the victim of any skeptical hypothesis). The reason for this is that there will be no possible world within the realm of safety in which this proposition is false, and thus, in every world in the realm of safety in which she believes this proposition (which, I take it, is all of them), her belief is true. Accordingly, skepticism is evaded and closure, as least as it functions in skeptical and anti-skeptical reasoning, is retained.

Moreover, the adoption of safety as a necessary condition on knowledge is also able to speak to the core relevant alternatives thought that we saw in §2. As expressed there, the thought was that I should be able to have knowledge without having to consider far-fetched, and therefore irrelevant, error-possibilities. This was supposed to be the intuition that Dretske was trying to accommodate with his modal account of knowledge, but, as we saw, he in fact ended up with a slightly different view which did make far-fetched error-possibilities relevant to knowledge, albeit only knowledge of the denials of skeptical hypotheses (note that it was this element of the view that resulted in the denial of closure). In contrast, a modal interpretation of the RA approach that is much closer to this core intuition is that knowledge (any knowledge) is only dependent upon one’s ability to track the truth in the relevant range of near-by possible worlds, not also in worlds far away. Accordingly, if the skeptical possibility is indeed far-fetched then it ought to be unable to influence my knowledge of everyday propositions or, for that matter, my knowledge of the denials of skeptical hypotheses. Safety captures this intuition by allowing agents to have knowledge in both cases provided skeptical possible worlds do not feature in the realm of safety. Dretskean Sensitivity, in contrast, violates this intuition by making knowledge dependent not just on the relevant circumstances in near-by worlds but also on the circumstances that obtain in far-off worlds (such as skeptical worlds) where the target proposition is false.

Furthermore, since the realm of safety does not vary in response to mere conversational factors, it follows that this is not a semantic contextualist thesis. If the agent does indeed know everyday propositions then, in line with the central Moorean contention, she will also know the denials of radical skeptical hypotheses, and this will be so no matter what conversational context the agent is in. We thus have a Moorean variety of anti-skepticism which, whilst keeping to the RA spirit of both the Dretskean and the semantic contextualist proposals, lacks the epistemological revisionism of either.

This is a compelling account of how a neo-Moorean proposal might run, and it certainly does seem to present one very plausible way of reading the core RA thesis. It is not quite as novel as it may at first seem, however, since one can trace the beginnings of such view in Gail C. Stine’s critical appraisal of the Dretskean thesis back in 1976. She noted that so long as one sticks to the core RA conception of relevance then the proper conclusion to be extracted is precisely that we shouldn’t concede a lack of knowledge of the denials of radical skeptical hypotheses, and thus reject closure. Instead, the conclusion we should draw is that, since such skeptical error-possibilities are indeed modally far-off, and thus irrelevant, it follows that we do know their denials after all (insofar as we know anything much) and thus that closure remains intact. Stine thus reaches a similar conclusion to Sosa’s, though without employing the technical modal machinery that Sosa adduces. It is interesting to note, however, that Stine recognised problems with this proposal that Sosa does not mention. In particular, she saw that the difficulty facing this brand of RA thesis is to explain how it can be that closure holds and thus that we do know the denials of anti-skeptical hypotheses after all, a problem that we also saw facing the semantic contextualist account above. As Stine herself admits, such a conclusion does indeed “sound odd”. In defence of her position she argues that this ‘oddness’ is not due to what is said being false, however (as the Dretske-Nozick line would suggest), but rather concerns the kind of false conversational implicatures that such a claim to know generate.

Although Stine does not develop this move, it is clearly a manœuvre that has a lot of mileage in it since it confronts head-on the worries about the lack of diagnostic appeal of the neo-Moorean approach. After all, one of the advantages of both the Dretskean and the semantic contextualist line is that they can explain the intuitive appeal of radical skepticism without succumbing to it. The neo-Moorean approach, in contrast, seems to make it a mystery as to why we were ever taken in by this fallacious line of reasoning in the first place. Thus, if it could be shown that the skeptic plays on pragmatic features of our language-games with epistemic terms in order to make her arguments superficially plausible, then we could supplement the neo-Moorean theory with a powerful diagnostic account which explains the phenomenology of our engagement with radical skepticism.

Just such an account is offered in Pritchard (2002c; cf. Pritchard 2001b; 2002a). Pritchard claims that we can strengthen Sosa’s account of knowledge whilst keeping true to the basic intuition that drives that notion (he offers an account of knowledge based on the notion of “super-safety”). Moreover, he goes on to show that the kind of mechanisms employed by the semantic contextualist account could just as well be regarded as mechanisms which govern the appropriate assertion of knowledge claims rather than as mechanisms which influence the truth-conditions of what is claimed. For example, the thought is that in skeptical conversational contexts it is the standards for correct assertion of knowledge claims that is raised (rather than the standards for knowledge), and that this fact explains why it is that we are reluctant to ascribe knowledge in skeptical contexts even though we are happy to ascribe such knowledge in quotidian contexts. Accordingly, the idea is that semantic contextualism, construed as a thesis about the fluctuating propriety conditions of knowledge claims, could actually be put into the service of the neo-Moorean view to offer the required diagnostic account. Indeed, elsewhere Pritchard (2001b) argues that a similar view can be extracted from some of Wittgenstein’s remarks on “hinge” propositions, so this view may well represent the beginnings of a thesis which integrates the two branches of recent work as regards skepticism. Moreover, Pritchard (2002a) also argues that Wright’s distinction between transmission and closure can be recast in terms of a distinction between the transference of knowledge across known entailments simpliciter (closure), and the transference of knowledge across known entailments where the knowledge retains a certain quality that makes it apt for proper assertion. Wright’s intuition about transmission is thus captured within this development of the neo-Moorean model by making use of the pragmatic features of our employment of epistemic terms.

This neo-Moorean approach is so recent that detailed critical assessment of it has not yet appeared. Nevertheless, we can note one possible avenue of discussion here, which is the possibly contentious use that the diagnostic element of this theory makes of the pragmatic/semantic distinction. If this element of the theory could be called into question then this would suffice to scupper the diagnostic component of the theory and thus drastically reduce its plausibility as an anti-skeptical thesis.

6. Epistemological Externalism and the New Skeptics

Before concluding, it is worthwhile to briefly dwell upon those influential figures in the recent epistemological debate who, in contrast to the current mood of optimism that can be found in epistemological discussion of the problem of radical skepticism, are deeply suspicious that any intellectually satisfactory solution could ever be given to this problem. The roots of this movement in the contemporary literature can be traced back to the work of three main figures – Unger (1971; 1975), Barry Stroud (1984; 1989) and Thomas Nagel (1986). We saw Unger’s infallibilist defence of skepticism earlier on, so here I will summarise Stroud’s and Nagel’s contribution, and highlight one way in which this variety of ‘meta-skepticism’ currently informs the skeptical debate, particularly as it figures in more recent work by Stroud (1994; 1996) and Richard Fumerton (1990; 1995).

For both Nagel and Stroud, the thought seems to be that there is something in our philosophical quest for objectivity that inexorably leads us to skeptical conclusions. Nagel argues, for instance, that objectivity involves attaining a completely impartial view of reality, one that is not tainted by any particular perspective. We must, he argues, “get outside of ourselves”, and thereby achieve the impossible task of being able to “view the world from nowhere from within it” (Nagel 1986, 76). We realise that the initial appearances present to a viewpoint can be unreliable guides to reality and therefore seek to modify our ‘subjective’ view with a more ‘objective’ perspective that is tempered by reason and reflection. As Nagel points out, however, the trouble with this approach is that

[...] if initial appearances are not in themselves reliable guides to reality, [then] why should the products of detached reflection be any different? Why aren’t they [...] equally doubtful [...]? [...] The same ideas that make the pursuit of objectivity seem necessary for knowledge make both objectivity and knowledge seem, on reflection, unattainable. (Nagel 1986, 76)

We can reconstruct the argument here as follows. We recognise that our initial unmodified ‘subjective’ experience of the world is unreliable and therefore should be adapted along ‘objective’ lines by eliminating the ‘subjective’ element. For instance, initial appearances tell us, falsely, that straight sticks suddenly become ‘bent’ when placed in water. Accordingly, we modify our initial ‘subjective’ view with the testimony of ‘objective’ scientific investigation which tells us that the stick in fact stays straight, it is just the light that is bending. However, and here is the crux of the matter as far as Nagel is concerned, why do we regard this modified view as being any more reliable than the completely ‘subjective’ perspective that it replaces? After all, we cannot eliminate every trace of ‘subjectivity’ and thus the problematic component of our conception of reality that engendered the pursuit of objectivity in the first place remains. Consequently, we are both aware of the need for objectivity whilst also recognising that such objectivity is impossible. As a result, according to Nagel, we are condemned to the following pessimistic evaluation of our epistemic capacities:

The search for objective knowledge, because of its commitment to a realist picture, is inescapably subject to skepticism and cannot refute it but must proceed under its shadow. [...] Skepticism [...] is a problem only because of the realist claims of objectivity. (Nagel 1986, 71)

That is, the problem of skepticism

[...] has no solution, but to recognise that is to come as near as we can to living in the light of truth. (Nagel 1986, 231)

Moreover, since these ‘realist’ truths concerning objectivity are meant to be inherent in our epistemic concepts, so it is held that this pessimism falls naturally out of any reflective analysis of our epistemic concepts.

Stroud makes similar claims. He writes:

The sceptical philosopher’s conception of our position and of his question for an understanding of it [...] is a quest for an objective or detached understanding and explanation of the position we are objectively in. What is seen to be true from a detached ‘external’ standpoint might not correspond to what we take to be the truth about our position when we consider it ‘internally’, from within the practical contexts which give our words their social point. Philosophical scepticism says the two do not correspond; we never know anything about the world around us, although we say or imply that we do hundreds of times a day.

I think we do have a conception of things being a certain way quite independently of their being known or believed or said to be that way by anyone. I think that the source of the philosophical problem of the external world lies somewhere within just such a conception of an objective world or in our desire, expressed in terms of that conception, to gain a certain kind of understanding of our relation to the world. But in trying to describe that conception I think I have relied on nothing but platitudes we would all accept – not about specific ways we all now believe the world to be, but just the general idea of what an objective world or an objective state of affairs would be. If those platitudes about objectivity do indeed express the conception of the world and our relation to it that the sceptical philosopher relies on, and if I am right in thinking that scepticism can be avoided only if that conception is rejected, it will seem that in order to avoid scepticism we must deny platitudes we all accept. (Stroud 1984, 81-2)

And note that if responding to skepticism involves denying “platitudes that we would all accept”, then it follows that any adequate response to the problem of radical skepticism is bound to be intellectually unsatisfactory.

One might wonder, however, exactly how such epistemological pessimism is to impact on the kind of anti-skeptical proposals that we have considered in previous sections. After all, nearly all of them results in the denial of some key claim that the skeptic makes, and does so on motivated grounds. In what sense, then, must we accept that these proposals, whatever the details, are all going to be intellectually unsatisfactory?

In more recent discussion, one begins to see the emergence of a more definitive pessimistic line, however, which may well be able to give a more compelling expression to this worry. In general, although the point is not always put in these terms, the complaint is that these recent anti-skeptical approaches offer us, at best, an epistemologically externalist response to skepticism when what we wanted was one that functioned within an epistemologically internalist framework.

Simplifying somewhat, we can take epistemological internalism to consist in the claim that there is some substantive necessary condition for knowledge which depends upon facts that the agent is in a position to know by reflection alone. That is, the internalist insists that meeting an appropriate ‘internal’ epistemic condition is necessary for knowledge possession. Externalists, in contrast, demure from this claim and therefore allow that agents might know merely by meeting ‘external’ epistemic conditions. So, for example, externalists tend to allow that small children or unreflective subjects (such as the now notorious, and possibly non-existent, “chicken-sexer”) can have knowledge even though they fail to meet an internal epistemic condition. Internalists, in contrast, set the standards for knowledge higher and thus exclude these agents from possessing knowledge (for more on this distinction, see the essays collected in Kornblith (2001)).

It is notable that all of the main anti-skeptical accounts that we have discussed so far have tended to side with externalism. For both Dretske and Nozick, for example, the sensitivity condition is a condition that merely needs to be met by the agent for that agent to be a potential knower – it is not further demanded that the agent should have the relevant reflective access to the facts which determine that sensitivity. Similar remarks apply to the semantic contextualist account, with both DeRose and Lewis endorsing externalist views (though Cohen might be an exception in this respect). Finally, the neo-Moorean accounts offered by Sosa et al are all described in terms of an externalist epistemology. On closer reflection, it is unsurprising that externalism should be so widely endorsed in this way, though the reasons in each case are different.

The Dretskeans need to be externalists because it is far more problematic to deny closure if knowledge is given an internalist construal. If the denial of closure were not contentious enough, to argue that one could have the kind of ‘reflective’ knowledge at issue in the internalist account of both the antecedent and the entailment and yet lack it of the consequent just seems plain absurd.

Since both the neo-Mooreans and the contextualists retain closure, it follows that they need not be troubled by this particular motivation for externalism. The driving force behind their adoption of externalism is, in contrast, the fact that they allow (albeit, in the contextualist case, relative to certain contexts) that an agent can have knowledge of the denials of radical skeptical hypotheses. The problem is that this seems to be precisely the sort of knowledge that cannot be possessed under the internalist rubric because skeptical scenarios are, ex hypothesi, phenomenologically indistinguishable from everyday life. Accordingly, it is plausible to suppose that agents are unable to have the required reflective access to the relevant facts that determine the epistemic status of their beliefs when it comes to these propositions.

Despite the current popularity of externalist accounts of knowledge, however, one might be less sanguine about the prospects for an externalist response to the problem of radical skepticism. After all, the skeptical puzzle seems to be one that strikes against the prima facie attraction of an externalist account of knowledge. As we saw Craig in effect arguing in §2, if we cannot tell the difference between being in the world that we think we are in now and a skeptical possible world such as the BIV-world, then of what comfort is it to be told that, provided we are in the world we think we are, we know a great deal? Instead, it would seem that we want some sort of subjective assurance as regards our knowledge that externalist anti-skeptical accounts are not in a position to provide.

It is this line of thinking that ultimately motivates recent work by Stroud (1994; 1996) and Fumerton (1990; 1995). For example, Fumerton makes the following point:

It is tempting to think that externalist analyses of knowledge [...] simply remove one level of the traditional problems of skepticism. When one reads the well-known externalists one is surely inclined to wonder why they are so sanguine about their supposition that our commonplace beliefs are, for the most part, [...] knowledge. [...] Perception, memory, and induction may be reliable processes (in Goldman’s sense) and thus given his metaepistemological position we may [... have knowledge of] the beliefs they produce but, the sceptic can argue, we have no reason to believe that these process are reliable and thus even if we accept reliabilism, we have no reason to think that the beliefs they produce [constitute knowledge]. (Fumerton 1990, 63)

In effect, the complaint that Fumerton is giving expression to here is that externalism allows that there are certain conditions on knowledge that we are unable to reflectively determine have obtained. Indeed, Fumerton is more explicit about the focus of his objection when he goes on to write that

[...] the main problem with externalist accounts, it seems to me, just is the fact that such accounts [...] develop concepts of knowledge that are irrelevant. [...] The philosopher doesn’t just want true beliefs, or even reliably produced beliefs, or beliefs caused by the facts that make them true. The philosopher wants to have the relevant features of the world directly before consciousness. (Fumerton 1990, 64)

Presumably, to argue that externalist accounts of knowledge are problematic because they fail to demand that the relevant facts should be “directly before consciousness” is simply to complain that such theories make the satisfaction of non-reflectively accessible external epistemic conditions central to knowledge possession.

Fumerton is not the only one to put forward objections to externalism that run along these lines, though he is perhaps the most explicit about what the complaint that he is giving voice to amounts to. For example, a similar argument against externalism seems to be implicit in the following passages from Stroud:

[...] suppose there are truths about the world and the human condition which link human perceptual states and cognitive mechanisms with further states of knowledge and reasonable belief, and which imply that human beings acquire their beliefs about the physical world through the operation of belief-forming mechanisms which are on the whole reliable in the sense of giving them mostly true beliefs. [...] If there are truths of this kind [...] that fact alone obviously will do us no good as theorists who want to understand human knowledge in this philosophical way. At the very least we must believe some such truths; their merely being true would not be enough to give us any illumination or satisfaction. But our merely happening to believe them would not be enough either. We seek understanding of certain aspects of the human condition, so we seek more than just a set of beliefs about it; we want to know or have good reasons for thinking that what we believe about it is true. (Stroud 1994, 297)

It is difficult to understand Stroud’s objection here if it is not to be construed along similar lines to that found in the passages from Fumerton cited above. Stroud’s thought seems to be that it is not enough merely to meet the external epistemic conditions that give us knowledge, rather we should also have the special kind of internal access to those conditions that the internalist demands (and perhaps even more than that).

A new debate is thus emerging in the literature which is to some extent orthogonal to the key discussions that we have considered so far since it questions the very presuppositions of those discussions. Future work on the skeptical puzzle will thus enjoin participants to not only meet the skeptical argument in a motivated fashion, but also respond to this meta-epistemological challenge.

7. References and Further Reading

  • Austin, J. L. (1961). ‘Other Minds’, reprinted in his Philosophical Papers, (eds.) J. O. Urmson & G. J. Warnock, 44-84, Clarendon Press, Oxford, England.
  • Cohen, S. (1987). ‘Knowledge, Context, and Social Standards’, Synthese 73, 3-26.
  • Cohen, S. (1988). ‘How to be a Fallibilist’, Philosophical Perspectives 2, 91-123.
  • Cohen, S. (1991). ‘Skepticism, Relevance, and Relativity’, Dretske and his Critics, (ed.) B. McLaughlin, 17-37, Basil Blackwell, Oxford, England.
  • Cohen, S. (1999). ‘Contextualism, Skepticism, and the Structure of Reasons’, Philosophical Perspectives 13, 57-90.
  • Cohen, S. (2000). ‘Contextualism and Skepticism’, Philosophical Issues 10, 94-107.
  • Craig, E. (1989). ‘Nozick and the Sceptic: The Thumbnail Version’, Analysis 49, 161-2.
  • Craig, E. (1990). Knowledge and the State of Nature: An Essay in Conceptual Synthesis, Clarendon Press, Oxford, England.
  • Davies, M. (1998). ‘Externalism, Architecturalism, and Epistemic Warrant’, Knowing Our Own Minds: Essays on Self-Knowledge, (eds.) C. J. G. Wright, B. C. Smith & C. Macdonald, Oxford University Press, Oxford, England.
  • DeRose, K. (1995). ‘Solving the Skeptical Problem’, Philosophical Review 104, 1-52.
  • DeRose, K. (2000). ‘How Can We Know that We’re Not Brains in Vats?’, The Southern Journal of Philosophy 38, 121-48.
  • Dretske, F. (1970). ‘Epistemic Operators’, Journal of Philosophy 67, 1007-23.
  • Dretske, F. (1971). ‘Conclusive Reasons’, Australasian Journal of Philosophy 49, 1-22.
  • Dretske, F. (1981). ‘The Pragmatic Dimension of Knowledge’, Philosophical Studies 40, 363-78.
  • Dretske, F. (1991). ‘Knowledge: Sanford and Cohen‘, Dretske and his Critics, (ed.) B. McLaughlin, 185-96, Basil Blackwell, Oxford, England.
  • Fumerton, R. (1990). ‘Metaepistemology and Skepticism’, Doubting: Contemporary Perspectives on Skepticism, (eds.) M. D. Roth & G. Ross, 57-68, Kluwer Academic Publishers, Dordrecht, Holland.
  • Fumerton, R. (1995). Metaepistemology and Skepticism, Rowman & Littlefield, Lanham, Maryland.
  • Klein, P. (1981). Certainty, University of Minnesota Press, Minneapolis.
  • Klein, P. (1995). ‘Skepticism and Closure: Why the Evil Genius Argument Fails’, Philosophical Topics 23, 213-36.
  • Kornblith, H. (2001). Epistemology: Internalism and Externalism, (ed.) Basil Blackwell, Oxford, England.
  • Lewis, D. (1979). ‘Scorekeeping in a Language Game’, Journal of Philosophical Logic 8, 339-59.
  • Lewis, D. (1996). ‘Elusive Knowledge’, Australasian Journal of Philosophy 74, 549-67.
  • Moore, G. E. (1925). ‘A Defence of Common Sense’, Contemporary British Philosophy (2nd series), (ed.) J. H. Muirhead, Allen and Unwin, London, England; reprinted in his Philosophical Papers, Allen & Unwin, London, England (1959).
  • Moore, G. E. (1939). ‘Proof of an External World’, Proceedings of the British Academy 25; reprinted in his Philosophical Papers, Allen & Unwin, London, England (1959).
  • Nagel, T. (1986). The View from Nowhere, Oxford University Press, Oxford, England.
  • Nozick, R. (1981). Philosophical Explanations, Oxford University Press, Oxford, England.
  • Pritchard, D. H. (2001a). ‘Contextualism, Scepticism, and the Problem of Epistemic Descent’, Dialectica 55, 327-49.
  • Pritchard, D. H. (2001b). ‘Radical Scepticism, Epistemological Externalism, and “Hinge” Propositions’, Wittgenstein-Studien, 81-105.
  • Pritchard, D. H. (2001c). ‘Scepticism and Dreaming’, Philosophia 28, 373-90.
  • Pritchard, D. H. (2002a). ‘McKinsey Paradoxes, Radical Scepticism, and the Transmission of Knowledge across Known Entailments’, Synthese 130, 1-24.
  • Pritchard, D. H. (2002b). ‘Radical Scepticism, Epistemological Externalism, and Closure’, forthcoming in Theoria 69.
  • Pritchard, D. H. (2002c). ‘Resurrecting the Moorean Response to Scepticism’, forthcoming in International Journal of Philosophical Studies 10.
  • Putnam, H. (1992). Renewing Philosophy, Harvard University Press, Cambridge, Massachusetts.
  • Putnam, H. (1998). ‘Skepticism’, Philosophie in Synthetischer Absicht (Synthesis in Mind), (ed.) M. Stamm, 239-68, Klett-Cotta, Stuttguard, Germany.
  • Sainsbury, R. M. (1997). ‘Easy Possibilities’, Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 57, 907-19.
  • Sosa, E. (1999). ‘How to Defeat Opposition to Moore’, Philosophical Perspectives 13, 141-54.
  • Sosa, E. (2000). ‘Skepticism and Contextualism’, Philosophical Issues 10, 1-18.
  • Stine, G. C. (1976). ‘Skepticism, Relevant Alternatives, and Deductive Closure’, Philosophical Studies 29, 249-61.
  • Strawson, P. F. (1985). Skepticism and Naturalism: Some Varieties, Methuen, London.
  • Stroll, A. (1994). Moore and Wittgenstein on Certainty, Oxford University Press, Oxford, England.
  • Stroud, B. (1984). The Significance of Philosophical Scepticism, Oxford University Press, Oxford, England.
  • Stroud, B. (1989). ‘Understanding Human Knowledge in General’, Knowledge and Scepticism, (eds.) M. Clay & K. Lehrer, Westview, Boulder, Colorado.
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Author Information

Duncan Pritchard
University of Stirling

Last updated: October 15, 2004 | Originally published: