Skeptical theism is the view that God exists but that we should be skeptical of our ability to discern God’s reasons for acting or refraining from acting in any particular instance. In particular, says the skeptical theist, we should not grant that our inability to think of a good reason for doing or allowing something is indicative of whether or not God might have a good reason for doing or allowing something. If there is a God, he knows much more than we do about the relevant facts, and thus it would not be surprising at all if he has reasons for doing or allowing something that we cannot fathom.
If skeptical theism is true, it appears to undercut the primary argument for atheism, namely the argument from evil. This is because skeptical theism provides a reason to be skeptical of a crucial premise in the argument from evil, namely the premise that asserts that at least some of the evils in our world are gratuitous. If we are not in a position to tell whether God has a reason for allowing any particular instance of evil, then we are not in a position to judge whether any of the evils in our world are gratuitous. And if we cannot tell whether any of the evils in our world are gratuitous, then we cannot appeal to the existence of gratuitous evil to conclude that God does not exist. The remainder of this article explains skeptical theism more fully, applies it to the argument from evil, and surveys the reasons for and against being a skeptical theist.
Skeptical theism is a conjunction of two theses. The first thesis of skeptical theism is that theism is true, where “theism” is roughly the view that God exists and “God,” in turn, is an honorific title describing the most perfect being possible. This is the being putatively described in classical western theologies of Judaism, Christianity, Islam, and some theistic forms of Eastern religions. The second thesis is that a certain limited form of skepticism is true, where this skepticism applies to the ability of humans to make all-things-considered judgments about what God would do or allow in any particular situation. Not all theists are skeptical theists, and not all of the philosophers who endorse the skeptical component of skeptical theism are theists. Since it is the skeptical component that is of most interest, it will be the focus in what follows.
It is important to get clear on the scope of the skepticism endorsed by skeptical theists. First, it is not a global skepticism—skeptical theists are not committed to the view that we cannot know anything at all. Instead, the skepticism is (putatively) limited to a narrow range of propositions, namely those having to do with God’s reasons for action. For example, a skeptical theist could admit that humans have ceteris paribus knowledge of God’s reasons for actions. An example of such knowledge might be the following: other-things-being-equal, God will eliminate suffering when he is able to do so. However, knowing this latter claim is consistent with denying that we know the following: God will eliminate this particular instance of suffering. Holding the combination of these two views is possible for the following reason: while we might know that other-things-being-equal, God will eliminate suffering when he is able to do so, we might not know whether or not other things are equal in any particular instance of suffering.
As an example of this limited sort of skepticism, consider a much more mundane example. One might know that other-things-being-equal, it is better to save aces in a hand of draw poker (since aces are the highest denomination). However, one might know this while at the same time withholding judgment on whether or not it is a good idea for Jones to save aces in any particular hand, since one would not know what Jones’ other cards were (for example, perhaps saving an ace requires discarding a member of a four-of-a-kind set in another denomination).
Agnosticism is the philosophical view that neither affirms that God exists nor affirms that God does not exist. On the other hand, atheism is the view that God does not exist. Perhaps the most powerful argument for atheism is the argument from evil. According to this line of reasoning, the fact that the world contains evil is powerful evidence that God does not exist. This is because God is supposed to be the most perfect being possible, and among these perfections is both perfect power and perfect goodness. If God were perfectly powerful, then he would be able to eliminate all instances of evil. If God were perfectly good, then he would want to eliminate all instances of evil. Thus, if God exists, there would be no evil. But there is evil. Therefore, God does not exist.
While the foregoing sketches the rough terrain, the argument from evil comes in two distinct forms. First is the logical problem of evil. According to the logical problem of evil, it is not logically possible for both evil and God to coexist. Any world in which God exists will be a world devoid of any evil. Thus, anyone who believes both that God exists and that evil exists is committed to an implicit contradiction.
Second is the evidential argument from evil. According to the evidential argument from evil, while it is logically possible that both God and evil coexist, the latter is evidence against the former. The evidential argument is sometimes put in terms of an inference to the best explanation (that is, the abductive argument from evil) and sometimes in terms of probabilities (that is, the inductive argument from evil). In either case, certain facts about the existence, nature and distribution of evils in the world are offered as pro tanto evidence against the truth of theism. This article focuses on the probabilistic (inductive) version of the evidential argument from evil as it is the most common in the contemporary literature.
It is widely conceded that there is no logical problem of evil for the following reason: if there is a God, he would allow any particular instance of evil that is necessary either to avoid some evil equally bad or worse or to secure some compensating (or justifying) good. For instance, the experience of pain is an intrinsic evil. However, the fact that a human father allows his child to experience the pain of an inoculation does not thereby show that the father is not perfectly good. That is because, although evil in itself, the pain was necessary to secure a compensating good, namely being immune to a painful or deadly disease. Philosophers call any instance of evil that is not necessary either to avoid some evil equally bad or worse or to secure some compensating (or justifying) good a gratuitous evil. Thus, it is only the existence of gratuitous evil (instead of any evil whatsoever) that poses a (putative) problem for theism.
With the distinction between gratuitous and non-gratuitous evil in hand, the evidential argument from evil can be formulated as follows:
1. If God exists, then there are no instances of gratuitous evil.
2. It is likely that at least some instances of evil are gratuitous.
3. Therefore, it is likely that God does not exist.
The gist is that insofar as we have reason to believe that at least some of the evils in our world are not necessary either to avoid some evil equally bad or worse or to secure some compensating (or justifying) good, we have reason to believe that God does not exist. So there is still a sense in which a logical problem of evil remains—it is logically impossible that God and gratuitous evil coexist. The evidential nature of this argument focuses around premise (2): the best we can do is to present an inductive case for the claim that any particular evil in our world is gratuitous.
Theists have challenged both premises in the argument from evil. Regarding premise (1), some have challenged the notion that God is required by his moral perfection to eliminate all instances of gratuitous evil (for example, Van Inwagen 2003). However, by and large, theists have focused their attention on the minor premise: the claim that it is likely that some of the evils in our world are gratuitous. There are two ways of responding to this premise. One may either deny it or seek to show that we should be agnostic about it. Each strategy is sketched below.
Challenges to the argument from evil that purport to show that premise (2) is false are typically called theodicies. A theodicy is an attempt to show that no actual evil in our world is gratuitous, or, in logically equivalent terms, that all the evils in our world are necessary either to avoid some evil equally bad or worse or to secure some compensating (or justifying) good. If a theist can successfully show this, then premise (2) in the argument from evil is false, and the argument from evil is unsound.
Theodicies take a number of different forms. Some try to show that the evils in our world are necessary for compensating goods such as moral development, significant free will, and so on. Others try to show that evils in our world are necessary to avoid evils equally bad or worse. In either case, a successful theodicy will have to be thorough—if even one instance of evil in the world turns out to be gratuitous, the minor premise is true and the argument from evil goes through.
The burden of proof for a theodicy is tremendously high. The theodicist must show that all of the evils in our world are non-gratuitous. For this reason, many theistic philosophers prefer only to show that we should be agnostic about premise (2). Skepticism about premise (2) is typically defended in one of two ways: by appeal to a defense or by appeal to the resources of skeptical theism.
Unlike a theodicy, a defense does not attempt to show what God’s actual reason is for allowing any particular instance of evil. Instead, it attempts to show what God’s reasons might be for all we know. And if God might have reasons for allowing a particular evil that we do not know about, then we are in no position to endorse premise (2) in the evidential argument from evil. The idea is that there are relevant alternatives that we are in no position to rule out, and unless we are in such a position, we should not conclude that the minor premise is true.
For example, suppose you are a jurist in a criminal case, and—given only the videotape evidence—you cannot determine whether the defendant or his twin committed the crime. In this case, you are not justified in concluding that the defendant is guilty, and that is because there is a live possibility that you cannot rule out, and this possibility would show that the defendant is innocent. The same might be said of premise (2) in the argument from evil: there are live possibilities that we are in no position to rule out, and these possibilities show that God is justified in allowing the evils in our world. And if so, we are in no position to endorse premise (2) of the argument from evil.
Skeptical theism provides a second, independent case for agnosticism about premise (2). This case takes the form of an undercutting defeater for the standard defense of premise (2). Why should we think that it is likely that at least some of the evils in our world are gratuitous? The standard defense of this claim is as follows:
Well, it seems like many of the evils in our world are gratuitous, so it is likely that at least some instances of evil are gratuitous.
Put differently, we cannot see any reason for God to allow some of the evils in our world, therefore there we should conclude that there is no reason for God to allow some of the evils in our world. Call this inference pattern the “noseeum” inference (“if we can’t see ‘um, they ain’t there”).
The skeptical theist denies the strength of this noseeum inference. The fact that an evil appears to be gratuitous to us is not indicative of whether or not it is gratuitous. So on the one hand, the skeptical theist is happy to grant that it seems as if many of the evils in our world are gratuitous. However, she denies that this fact is good evidence for the claim that such evils really are gratuitous. And hence we have no reason to endorse premise (2) in the argument from evil.
As a reply to the argument from evil, skeptical theism seems initially quite plausible. Surely if there were a God, there would be many, many cases in which we could see no reason for a course of action although such reasons were available to God. Some things that look unjustifiable given our own perspectives are justifiable once one has all the facts. Besides relying on this initial plausibility, skeptical theists have defended their view in roughly three ways.
The fact that a young child cannot discern a reason for her parents allowing her to suffer pain does not constitute a good reason for the young child to conclude that there are no such reasons. In this case, a clear example of the noseeum inference fails. Given the child’s limited knowledge and experience as compared to the knowledge and experience of her parents, she ought not conclude that her parents are not justified in allowing a certain evil to occur. Other similar examples are easy to come by: if one does not play much chess, the fact that one cannot see why the chess master makes a particular move is not indicative of whether or not such a move is justified. It would be silly to reason as follows: I cannot see a good reason for that move, therefore, there is no good reason for that move.
If these cases are persuasive, the skeptical theist can defend her position accordingly. The cognitive distance between a young child and her parents is analogous to the cognitive position between a human agent and God. Thus, the fact that a human is unable to see a reason for allowing a particular evil is not a good reason for concluding that God would have no reason for allowing that evil.
On its face, premise (2) is very straightforward: it is very likely that at least some of the evils in our world are gratuitous. But when we get clear on what that means, we see that this kind of judgment is extraordinarily complex. It says, in effect, that we are able to identify some instances of evil which were not necessary either to avoid an evil equally bad or worse or to secure some compensating good. How could we ever know such complex facts? For example, consider the following:
On the night that Sir Winston Churchill was conceived, had Lady Randolph Churchill fallen asleep in a slightly different position, the precise pathway that each of the millions of spermatozoa took would have been slightly altered. As a result…Sir Winston Churchill, as we knew him, would not have existed, with the likely result that the evolution of World War II would have been substantially different… (Durston 2000, p. 66)
On the face of it, it appears that it would not matter what position Lady Churchill sleeps in. Put differently, it appears that there is no good reason to prefer her sleeping in one position rather than another. But given the specifics of human reproduction, this assumption is unwarranted and—in this case—plausibly false. So the fact that we cannot see a reason is not indicative of whether or not there is any such reason. This same objection applies, mutatis mutandis, to the inference from “we can see no reason to allow this evil” to “there is no reason to allow this evil.”
One of the most sophisticated defenses of skeptical theism insists that some sort of enabling premise must be reasonably believed before noseeum inferences are warranted and, further, that this enabling premise is not reasonably believed with regard to inferences about what God would allow. Two such enabling premises have been proposed in the literature: the first concerns our sensitivity to evidence and the second concerns the representativeness of our inductive samples.
The most common instance of the sensitivity strategy invokes an epistemic principle dubbed the Condition on Reasonable Epistemic Access, or “CORNEA” for short (Wyskstra 1984). CORNEA says that inferences from “I see no X” to “There is no X” are justified only if it is reasonable to believe that if there were an X, I would likely see it. So, for example, the inference from “I see no elephant in my office” to “There is no elephant in my office” is licensed by CORNEA since I reasonably believe that if there were an elephant in my office, I would likely see it. However, such skeptical theists have insisted that it is not reasonable for me to think that if there were a reason for allowing any particular evil that I would be aware of it. Given this assumption, CORNEA says that the inference from “I see no reason for allowing this instance of evil” to “There is no reason for allowing this instance of evil” is invalid.
The second strategy has to do with our knowledge of the representativeness of the inductive sample used in the noseeum inference. According to this version of the strategy, the inductive move from “I see no X” to “There is no X” is warranted only if it is reasonable for me to believe that my inductive sample of X’s is representative of the whole. For example, one should not rely on inductive evidence to conclude that all crows are black unless it is reasonable to assume that one’s sample of crows is representative of all crows. As applied to the argument from evil, the inference from “I can see no reason to allow this evil” to “There is no reason to allow this evil” is justified only if it is reasonable for one to believe that the sample of reasons currently understood is representative of all of the reasons that are. The crucial question then becomes whether or not any of us have good reason to think that our sample of goods, evils, and the connections between them is suitably representative. Some philosophers think that we do have such reason (for example, Tooley 1991). Others think that our knowledge is not representative (for example, Sennett 1993). Others think we cannot tell one way or the other whether our sample is representative, and thus we lack good reason for thinking that the sample is representative, as required by the second strategy (for example, Bergmann 2001).
As with any form of skepticism, skeptical theism has its critics. Some of these critics are theists who think that skeptical theism has unbecoming implications for issues of importance to theism (such as knowledge of God, relationship with God, and the like). Other critics think that skeptical theism has unbecoming implications for more general issues such as everyday knowledge, moral living, and so on. The objections to skeptical theism fall roughly into five different sorts.
One prominent criticism of skeptical theism is that it eliminates the potential for a close relationship between humans and God. It does so in two ways. First, if skeptical theism undercuts arguments against the existence of God by highlighting the fact that we know very little about how God would act (all-things-considered), then by parity of reasoning it also undercuts arguments for the existence of God. Skeptical theist considerations seem to suggest agnosticism about whether God would create a world, finely-tune the universe, create rational beings, and so on, despite the fact that each of these are assumptions in standard arguments for the existence of God. And the same considerations appear to undercut our knowledge of God’s interactions in the world; it is no longer open to the theist to say what God wants in her life (all-things-considered), whether a particular event was a miracle, and so on.
Second, skeptical theism not only appears to undercut one’s knowledge of God, but it also seems to undercut one’s trust in God. Being in a close relationship with another person requires some kind of understanding of what the other person wants and why the other person acts as she does. Furthermore, communication is important to a relationship, but skeptical theists should not trust communication from God (including divine commands, mystical experiences, and so on). Why? Because for all we know, God has a reason for deceiving us that is beyond our ken.
Any non-global version of skepticism will face objections that attempt to stretch the skepticism to new areas of inquiry. One objection of this sort claims that skeptical theism breaks down into a near-global skepticism that disallows what we might think of as everyday knowledge. Consider the claim that all crows are black. This seems a perfect example of everyday knowledge. But a skeptical crowist might respond as follows: “for all we know, there are purple crows beyond our ken, thus, the fact that we see no purple crows is not indicative of the fact that there are no purple crows.” Thus we do not know the claim that all crows are black.
Others have argued not that skeptical theism is incompatible with any particular knowledge claim but that it is incompatible with a promising set of theories in epistemology. In particular, skeptical theism appears to rule out so-called commonsense epistemologies that rely on something like the principle of credulity: other things being equal, it is reasonable to believe that things are as they appear. The problem is that skeptical theists grant that at least some evils appear gratuitous, thus, by the principle of credulity, they ought to grant that it is reasonable to believe that at least some evils are gratuitous. But that is precisely what skeptical theism denies.
The skeptical theist’s strategy relies on the presumption that there are some moral judgments that we are not justified in making. Consider an instance of childhood cancer. The skeptical theist is unwilling to grant that this evil is gratuitous because—for all we know—it was necessary either to prevent some evil equally bad or worse or to secure some compensating good. Furthermore, if the evil is not gratuitous, it seems that it would be morally permissible (or even morally obligatory) for God to allow that evil to occur. This is how the skeptical theist hopes to get God off the hook: we cannot blame him for creating the actual world if he meets all of his moral obligations in doing so.
The putative problem is that the skeptical theist seems to be committed to a consequentialist view of ethics, and many philosophers find such a view unappealing. The apparent implications result from the fact that a skeptical theist seems to allow that no matter how horrendous a particular instance of evil might be, it can always be justified given good enough consequences. Thus, if one thinks that there are some things that morally ought not be allowed regardless of consequences (such as the torture of an innocent person), this putative implication counts against skeptical theism.
Finally, the most pressing objection to skeptical theism is that it seems to preclude both the possibility of engaging in moral deliberation and the possibility of moral knowledge. The putative problem can be sketched as follows: if, for any instance of evil, we are unable to tell whether or not the evil is gratuitous, then we are unable to engage in moral deliberation and arrive at a view about what is reasonable for us to do. For example, suppose a skeptical theist comes upon a young boy drowning in a pond. His skeptical theism seems to commit him to reasoning as follows: for all I know, the boy’s death is necessary to prevent some greater evil or to secure some greater good, thus I do not have a reason to intervene.
Skeptical theists have offered a number of interesting responses to this objection. Some think that what is wrong for a person depends only on what he or she knows, and thus it would be wrong for the bystander to let the boy drown since he does not know that the boy’s death is non-gratuitous. Others think that what is right for God to allow might be different than what is right for us to allow. In that case, it might be wrong for you to let the boy drown even though you cannot conclude (for skeptical theist reasons) that it is wrong for God to do the same. Still others insist that there is no unique difficulty here: everyone faces the hurdle of attempting to decide whether a particular event will have, on balance, good or bad consequences. In that case, though it is true that moral deliberation is difficult given skeptical theism, it is also difficult given any view of religious epistemology.
Justin P. McBrayer
Fort Lewis College
U. S. A.
Last updated: October 31, 2010 | Originally published: