The philosophy of social science can be described broadly as having two aims. First, it seeks to produce a rational reconstruction of social science. This entails describing the philosophical assumptions that underpin the practice of social inquiry, just as the philosophy of natural science seeks to lay bare the methodological and ontological assumptions that guide scientific investigation of natural phenomena. Second, the philosophy of social science seeks to critique the social sciences with the aim of enhancing their ability to explain the social world or otherwise improve our understanding of it. Thus philosophy of social science is both descriptive and prescriptive. As such, it concerns a number of interrelated questions. These include: What is the method (or methods) of social science? Does social science use the same methods as natural science? If not, should it aspire to? Or are the methods appropriate to social inquiry fundamentally different from those of natural science? Is scientific investigation of the social world even possible – or desirable? What type of knowledge does social inquiry produce? Can the social sciences be objective and value neutral? Should they strive to be? Does the social world represent a unique realm of inquiry with its own properties and laws? Or can the regularities and other properties of the social world be reduced to facts about individuals?
The following article will survey how philosophers of social science have addressed and debated these questions. It will begin by examining the question of whether social inquiry can – or should – have the same aims and use the same methods as the natural sciences. This is perhaps the most central and enduring issue in the philosophy of social science. Addressing it inevitably leads to discussion of other key controversies in the field, such as the nature of explanation of social phenomena and the possibility of value-free social science. Following examination of the views of proponents and critics of social inquiry modeled on the natural sciences will be a discussion of the debate between methodological individualists and methodological holists. This issue concerns whether social phenomena can be reduced to facts about individuals. The penultimate section of the article asks the question: How does social science as currently practiced enhance our understanding of the social world? Even if social science falls short of the goals of natural science, such as uncovering lawlike regularities and predicting phenomena, it nonetheless may still produce valuable knowledge. The article closes with a brief discussion of methodological pluralism. No single approach to social inquiry seems capable of capturing all aspects of social reality. But a kind of unification of the social sciences can be posited by envisioning the various methods as participating in an on-going dialogue with each other.
The achievements of the natural sciences in the wake of the scientific revolution of the seventeenth century have been most impressive. Their investigation of nature has produced elegant and powerful theories that have not only greatly enhanced understanding of the natural world, but also increased human power and control over it. Modern physics, for instance, has shed light on such mysteries as the origin of the universe and the source of the sun’s energy, and it has also spawned technology that has led to supercomputers, nuclear energy (and bombs), and space exploration. Natural science is manifestly progressive, insofar as over time its theories tend to increase in depth, range and predictive power. It is also consensual. That is, there is general agreement among natural scientists regarding what the aims of science are and how to conduct it, including how to evaluate theories. At least in the long run, natural science tends to produce consent regarding which theories are valid. Given this evident success, many philosophers and social theorists have been eager to import the methods of natural science to the study of the social world. If social science were to achieve the explanatory and predictive power of natural science, it could help solve vexing social problems, such as violence and poverty, improve the performance of institutions and generally foster human well-being. Those who believe that adapting the aims and methods of natural science to social inquiry is both possible and desirable support the unity of scientific method. Such advocacy in this context is also referred to as naturalism.
Of course, the effort to unify social and natural science requires reaching some agreement on what the aims and methods of science are (or should be). A school of thought, broadly known as positivism, has been particularly important here. An analysis of positivism’s key doctrines is well beyond the scope of this article. However, brief mention of some of its key ideas is warranted, given their substantial influence on contemporary advocates of naturalism. The genesis of positivism can be traced to the ideas of the British empiricists of the seventeenth and eighteenth century, including most notably John Locke, George Berkeley, and David Hume. As an epistemological doctrine, empiricism in essence holds that genuine knowledge of the external world must be grounded in experience and observation. In the nineteenth century, Auguste Comte, who coined the term “positivism,” argued that all theories, concepts or entities that are incapable of being verified empirically must be purged from scientific explanations. The aim of scientific explanation is prediction, he argued, rather than trying to understand a noumenal realm that lies beyond our senses and is thus unknowable. To generate predictions, science seeks to uncover laws of succession governing relations between observed phenomena, of which gravity and Newton’s laws of motion were exemplars. Comte also advocated the unity of scientific method, arguing that the natural and social sciences should both adopt a positivist approach. (Comte was a founder of sociology, which he also called “social physics.”) In the middle third of the twentieth century an influential version of positivism, known as logical positivism, emphasized and refined the logical and linguistic implications of Comte’s empiricism, holding that meaningful statements about the world are limited to those that can be tested through direct observation.
For a variety of reasons, positivism began to fall out of favor among philosophers of science beginning in the latter half of the twentieth century. Perhaps its most problematic feature was the logical positivists’ commitment to the verifiability criterion of meaning. Not only did this implausibly relegate a slew of traditional philosophical questions to the category of meaningless, it also called into question the validity of employing unobservable theoretical entities, processes and forces in natural science theories. Logical positivists held that in principle the properties of unobservables, such as electrons, quarks or genes, could be translated into observable effects. In practice, however, such derivations generally proved impossible, and ridding unobservable entities of their explanatory role would require dispensing with the most successful science of the twentieth century.
Despite the collapse of positivism as a philosophical movement, it continues to exercise influence on contemporary advocates of the unity of scientific method. Though there are important disagreements among naturalists about the proper methodology of science, three core tenets that trace their origin to positivism can be identified. First, advocates of naturalism remain wedded to the view that science is a fundamentally empirical enterprise. Second, most naturalists hold that the primary aim of science is to produce causal explanations grounded in lawlike regularities. And, finally, naturalists typically support value neutrality – the view that the role of science is to describe and explain the world, not to make value judgments.
At a minimum, an empirical approach for the social sciences requires producing theories about the social world that can be tested via observation and experimentation. Indeed, many naturalists support the view, first proposed by Karl Popper, that the line demarcating science from non-science is empirical falsifiability. According to this view, if there is no imaginable empirical test that could show a theory to be false, then it cannot be called a scientific theory. Producing empirically falsifiable theories in turn necessitates creating techniques for systematically and precisely measuring the social world. Much of twentieth century social science involved the formation of such tools, including figuring out ways to operationalize social phenomena – that is, conceptualize them in such a way that they can be measured. The data produced by operations in turn provide the raw, empirical material to construct and test theories. At the practical level, ensuring that scientific theories are subject to proper empirical rigor requires establishing an institutional framework through which a community of social scientists can try to test each others’ theories.
The purpose of a theory, according to naturalists, is to produce causal explanations of events or regularities found in the natural and social worlds. Indeed, this is the primary aim of science. For instance, astronomers may wish to explain the appearance of Haley’s comment at regular intervals of seventy-five years, or they might want to explain a particular event, such as the collision of the comet Shoemaker-Levy 9 with Jupiter in July 1994. Scientific explanations of such regularities or events in turn require identification of lawlike regularities that govern such phenomena. An event or regularity is formally explained when its occurrence is shown to be logically necessary, given certain causal laws and boundary conditions. This so-called covering law model thus views explanation as adhering to the structure of a deductive argument, with the laws and boundary conditions serving as premises in a syllogism. Underpinning the explanations of the periodic return of Haley’s comment or the impact of Shoemaker-Levy 9 in astronomy, for instance, would be certain casual laws of physics, namely gravity and Newton’s laws of motion. These laws may be invoked to produce causal explanations of a variety of other events and regularities, such as the orbit of the planets in our solar system, the trajectory of projectiles, the collapse of stars, and so forth. Thus the discovery of lawlike regularities offers the power to produce parsimonious explanations of a wide variety of phenomena. Proponents of the unity of scientific method therefore hold that uncovering laws of social phenomena should be a primary goal of social inquiry, and indeed represents the sine qua non for achieving genuinely scientific social investigation.
The doctrine of value neutrality is grounded in the so-called fact/value distinction, which traces its origins to David Hume’s claim that an ought cannot be derived from an is. That is, factual statements about the world can never logically compel a particular moral evaluation. For instance, based on scientific evidence, biologists might conclude that violence and competition are natural human traits. But such a factual claim itself does not tell us whether violence and competition are good or bad. According to advocates of naturalism, the same holds true for claims about the social world. For example, political scientists might be able to tell us which social, political and material conditions are conducive to the development of democracy. But, according to this view, a scientific explanation of the causes of democracy cannot tell us whether we ought to strive to bring about democracy or whether democracy itself is a good thing. Science can help us better understand how to manipulate the social world to help us achieve our goals, but it cannot tell us what those goals ought to be. To believe otherwise is to fall prey to the so-called naturalistic fallacy. However, value neutrality does not bar social scientists from providing an account of the values that individuals hold, nor does it prevent them from trying to discern the effects that values might have on individuals’ behavior or social phenomena. Indeed, Max Weber, a central figure in late nineteenth and early twentieth century sociology and a defender of value neutrality, insisted that providing a rich account of individuals’ values is a key task for social scientists. But he maintained that social scientists can and should keep their ethical judgment of people’s values separate from their scientific analysis of the nature and effects of those values.
Naturalism has been highly influential in the social sciences, especially since the middle in the twentieth century and particularly in the United States. Movements to make social inquiry genuinely scientific have dominated many fields, most notably political science and economics. However, whether these efforts have been successful is contestable, and naturalism has been subjected to wide-ranging criticism. Some critics point to what they view as formidable obstacles to subjecting the social world to scientific investigation. These include the possible absence of law-like regularities at the social level, the complexity of the social environment, and the difficulty of conducting controlled experiments. These represent practical difficulties, however, and do not necessarily force the conclusion that modeling social inquiry on the natural sciences is doomed to failure. More radical critics of naturalism argue that the approach is thoroughly misconceived. Proponents of interpretive social inquiry are perhaps the most significant among such critics. Advocates of this approach claim that the aim of social investigation should be to enhance our understanding of a meaningful social world rather than to produce causal explanations of social phenomena grounded in universal laws. In addition, many proponents of interpretive social inquiry also cast doubt on the possibility, as well as the desirability, of naturalism’s goals of objectivity and value neutrality. Their skepticism is shared by adherents of two other influential schools of social inquiry, known as critical theory and postmodernism. But proponents of these approaches also emphasize the various ways in which social science can mask domination in society and generally serve to reinforce the status quo. These various criticisms of naturalism are considered below.
Among critics who point to practical obstacles impeding efforts to model social inquiry on the natural sciences, perhaps their most important objection questions the very existence of law-like regularities in the social world. They argue that the stringent criteria that philosophers of science have established for deeming an observed regularity to be an authentic law-like regularity cannot be met by proposed social laws. For a regularity to be deemed a genuine law of nature, the standard view holds that it must be universal; that is, it must apply in all times and places. The second law of thermodynamics, for example, is held to apply everywhere in the universe and at all points in the past and future. In addition, the types of laws of most importance to science are causal laws. A law may be described as causal, as opposed to a mere accidental regularity, if it represents some kind of natural necessity – a force or power in nature – that governs the behavior of phenomena. Not all law-like regularities meet the causal requirement. For instance, it is a regularity of nature that the earth orbits the sun in a certain elliptical path once every 364 days. But the orbital regularities of earth and the other planets in the solar system have no causal powers themselves. They are rather the product of certain conditions and certain causal laws, namely gravity and Newton’s laws of motion.
Whether there are genuine law-like causal regularities that govern social phenomena is not at all clear. In any event, no laws governing the social world have been discovered that meet the demanding criteria of natural science. To be sure, social scientists have identified many social regularities, some of which they have even dubbed social laws. Examples from the discipline of economics would include the laws of supply and demand. From political science we find Roberto Michels’ iron law of oligarchy, which holds that popular movements, regardless of how democratically inclined, over time will become hierarchical in structure. Another proposed law of politics is Duverger’s Law, which posits that two-party systems will emerge in political systems that feature simple-majority, single-ballot electoral systems. But upon closer inspection, these laws fail to meet the criteria for genuine law-like regularities. Sometimes, particularly in economics (which boasts more purported laws than the other social sciences), the laws merely describe logical relationships between concepts. These laws may be true by definition, but because they do not describe the empirical world, they are not scientific laws. On the other hand, social laws that claim to describe empirical regularities invariably turn out to be imprecise, exception ridden and time-bound or place-bound rather than precise and universal. Consider the law of demand from economics, which holds that consumer demand for a good will decrease if prices go up and increase if prices go down. Though this pattern typically occurs, it is not without exception. Sometimes increasing the price of a good also increases demand for it. This may happen when consumers interpret a higher price as signaling higher quality or because purchasing an expensive good provides an opportunity for conspicuous consumption – wasteful expenditure as a display of status. Moreover, the law of demand is a weak law; it merely specifies an inverse relationship between price and demand. Unlike the more precise laws of natural science, it does not specify the magnitude of the expected change.
In many cases proposed social laws are grounded in simplified and therefore false assumptions about human nature. For instance, the laws of economics are typically grounded in the assumptions of rational choice theory. This theory posits that individuals always act rationally and instrumentally, weighing potential costs and benefits as they aim to maximize their own utility. But though individuals may typically act rational in this sense, especially in the economic sphere, it is nonetheless the case that they do not always do so. Psychologists, for instance, have documented numerous ways in which individuals frequently fail to act rationally, owing to predictable kinds of flawed reasoning or perceptual errors. Moreover, it is evident that much behavior, even within the sphere of economics, is not instrumental but rather is guided by social norms, habit or tradition. Thus the laws of economics grounded in the assumption of instrumental rationality are in fact false. Outside of economics, the laws of social science are fewer and generally even more dubious. Duverger’s law, which is also grounded in similar assumptions about human rationality, admits of numerous exceptions. Many simple-majority, single-ballot systems do in fact exhibit more than two political parties. And Michels’ himself acknowledged that his eponymous law could be nullified if steps were taken to enhance norms of democratic participation within groups. At best, such purported laws could be described as tendencies or typical patterns rather than genuine law-like regularities.
The reason for the absence of genuine laws in the social sciences is a source of debate. Some argue that the failure to uncover social laws stems from the complexity of human behavior and the social world. Human behavior is the product of manifold factors, including biological, psychological and perhaps sociological forces, each of which are themselves quite complex. Moreover, the social systems in which human behavior are embedded are themselves highly intricate. Untangling the myriad interactions between multiple individuals in, for example, an economic system is a daunting task. Perhaps it simply lies beyond human cognitive powers to detect law-like patterns in such a milieu. Or perhaps no law-like regularities even obtain at the social level, even if laws obtain at the level of individuals.
In addition to complexity, another impediment to social scientists’ ability to uncover law-like regularities is the difficulty, and sometimes impossibility, of conducting controlled experiments. Natural scientists often enjoy the ability to manipulate variables in a controlled laboratory setting. This helps them identify causal factors with respect to phenomena that they are trying to explain. For practical or ethical reasons, this is often not possible in the social sciences. In many cases the best a social scientist can hope for is to uncover so-called natural experiments, in which a suspected causal factor is present in one naturally occurring setting but absent in another. For instance, suppose social scientists wish to test the hypothesis that television viewing causes violence. They would benefit from a natural experiment if they could find two demographically similar communities, one of which has just recently received access to television and another that remains without it. They could then track violence rates over time in the two communities to determine if exposure to television does in fact lead to more violence. The difficulty is that social scientists must wait for natural experiments to come to them and, in any event, such experiments seldom offer the opportunity to control for all the potentially relevant variables.
Some observers have pointed to the relative youth of social science to explain the failure to uncover law-like regularities of the social world. According to this view, the social sciences are still awaiting their Galileo or Newton to provide an explanatory framework that will allow them to begin uncovering such laws. However, critics of this view may note that rigorous, systematic attempts to explain social behavior arguably date back all the way to the ancient Greeks. And attempts to produce empirically grounded social inquiry intentionally modeled on natural science are almost as old as the scientific revolution itself. At many points in the history of social science, eminent figures have emerged who seemed to offer the promise of putting social investigation on a proper scientific footing. These would include Thomas Hobbes, Adam Smith, Auguste Comte, Emile Durkheim, Max Weber, as well as the numerous advocates of behaviorism and positivism in the twentieth century. But, in the end, a consensus on method and the hoped-for scientific progress have failed to materialize.
The explanations discussed above for why social scientists have yet to identify genuine law-like regularities cite the practical difficulties of uncovering such laws in the social realm. But more radical critics of naturalism argue that the attempt to unify the methods of the natural and social sciences is deeply misguided. They claim that the social world is different from the natural world in crucial respects that render the methods of natural science at best inadequate for enhancing understanding of the social world. At worst, naturalism not only fundamentally mischaracterizes the social world, it also serves to reinforce oppressive beliefs, values and social practices. These critics include advocates of interpretive social inquiry, critical theorists, and postmodernists.
Advocates of interpretivism propose an approach to social inquiry grounded in profoundly different assumptions about the nature of the social world than those who support naturalism. In particular, interpretivists assert that the social world is fundamentally unlike the natural world insofar as the social world is meaningful in a way that the natural world is not. This difference can be made clear by considering the difference between human action and the behavior of entities or systems found in the natural world. Suppose that there is an action by an individual that we wish to explain – for example, voting at a school board meeting for a particular proposal. Imagine that the individual votes for a measure by raising his hand. The act of voting entails more than a particular physical movement, however. In fact, in different situations the same physical behavior of hand raising could indicate different things – posing a question, pointing to the ceiling, yawning, and so forth. Thus to adequately explain the person’s behavior, it is not enough to explain the physical processes that caused the hand raising. Indeed, in most cases of social inquiry, the physical processes will be irrelevant to explanation of the behavior. Rather, what is required is an account of the meaning behind the action. In this example, that would be an account of what the person meant by raising his hand, namely to vote.
There is no equivalent type of explanation in the physical sciences. Astronomers, for instance, might wish to explain the orbital path of a comet. To do so, they cite relevant natural laws and conditions that produce the comet’s orbital trajectory. But the motion of the comet has no meaning per se in need of explanation (although the appearance of the comet might be interpreted by some human observers as having some meaning, such as auguring ill fortune). Similarly, a physiologist might seek to explain the biophysical processes that cause limbs to rise. But, again, the physical processes that cause a human arm to rise have no meaning as such. It is only from the standpoint of social, as opposed to biological, behavior that the action has meaning. Moreover, the elements of the natural world – its objects, forces, events and phenomena – are not created or constituted by the meanings that human beings attribute to them. They exist independent of human beliefs, and the laws that govern them are not dependent on human beliefs either. Atoms, DNA, planets, and so forth, would still exist and be governed by natural laws if human beings did not exist. This is obviously not the case for the social world. Social institutions – a marketplace, a church, a business firm, a sports game, marriage, and so forth – are created and governed in part by the beliefs that people hold about them.
What implication does the meaningful nature of the social world have for the methods and aims social inquiry? According to interpretivists, it means that the key aim of social inquiry should be to enhance our understanding of the social world’s meanings as opposed to producing causal explanations of social phenomena. Interpretivists often compare social inquiry to textual interpretation. The aim of textual interpretation is to make sense of a novel, play, essay, religious document or other text by laying bare the beliefs, intentions, connections and context that comprise their meaning. Similarly, interpretivists say, the aim of social inquiry should be to make sense of the actions, beliefs, social practices, rituals, value systems, institutions and other elements that comprise the social world. This involves uncovering the intentions and beliefs that inform human action, which in turn requires making sense of the broader social context in which those beliefs, intentions, and actions reside.
Interpretive theory has drawn much of its inspiration from the fields of cultural anthropology and ethnomethodology, the study of how people make sense of their everyday world. Indeed, some advocates of interpretive social inquiry wish to make the aims and methods of these approaches the exemplar for all social inquiry. A key goal of cultural anthropology is to make sense of the beliefs, norms, practices, and rituals of foreign cultures. For instance, suppose an anthropologist wishes to explain a particular religious ceremony practiced by a hunter-gather tribe. According to interpretivists, the aim of such inquiry has nothing to do with identifying relevant law-like regularities or causal mechanisms that govern the ceremony. Nor should the litmus test of a successful explanation be the ability to generate predictions about the tribes’ behavior in the ceremony (although the capacity to predict behavior might be a byproduct of such inquiry). Rather, the anthropologist’s aim should be to make sense of the purpose and meaning of the ceremony. Naturally, this would require producing an account of how the members of the tribe understand their ceremony. But it would also entail placing the ceremony within the broader context of the tribes’ values, worldview, practices or institutions. The end product of such investigation would be a so-called thick description that enhances our understanding of the tribe, rather than a causal explanation of their behavior. This kind of social inquiry has been labeled “descriptivism.”
Many social scientists and philosophers acknowledge that advocates of descriptivism have identified an important difference between the social and natural worlds. And there is no doubt that the thick descriptions of foreign cultures that the approach produces have greatly enhanced our understanding of them. This in turn has increased understanding of human society generally, insofar as it has revealed the great diversity of human beliefs, values, traditions, and practices. However, the claim that the primary goal of social inquiry should be to produce thick descriptions has been subjected to serious criticism from advocates of naturalism and well as from critics who identify with the interpretive approach.
A key objection to descriptivism is that it would limit interpretive inquiry to describing cultures or societies in their own terms, leaving no room for criticizing the beliefs, values or self-understandings of those cultures or societies. Clearly, the objection runs, this is unsatisfactory, for persons and even cultures collectively can be unaware or deeply misguided about how their societies really function, and some beliefs and values operative in a society may be incoherent, contradictory, self-defeating or even delusional. Surely a primary task of social inquiry must be to offer accounts that are more penetrating and critical than descriptivism can offer. If, as the Canadian political theorist Charles Taylor has said, the primary aim of social investigation is to tell us “what is really going on,” then descriptivism falls far short of this goal (1985b: 92).
An important criticism of descriptivism challenges the notion that the role of the social scientists is to simply to re-express the ideas, beliefs, values and self-understandings of a culture or society by adopting the viewpoint of its inhabitants. This criticism has been developed by advocates of an alternative and influential version of interpretive theory that draws on the philosophical hermeneutics of continental thinkers such as Martin Heidegger, Hans-Georg Gadamer, Paul Ricoeur, as well as Anglo-American theorists working within the tradition, most notably Taylor. These theorists argue that coming to understand a culture or society – or another person or even a text or work of art – does not involve producing an objective description of an independent object. That is, the philosophical hermeneutics approach rejects a subject/object ontology in which knowledge consists of an accurate representation of an external world in the mind of a subject. Instead, explaining the beliefs of a culture or society, whether our own or a foreign one, entails a kind of dialogue with it. The process of coming to understand a culture, society or social practice is analogous to a conversation with another person, especially one aimed at getting to know the other person. In such a conversation, both participants may have their views challenged, their presuppositions about the other exposed, and in the process a better understanding of themselves and their conservation partner will emerge.
The same holds for attempts to understand whole societies or cultures, according to the hermeneutical theorists. Understanding is produced through a dialectical process in which the self-understanding of both parties – the investigator as well as the culture being studied – may be transformed. In striving to explain the worldview embedded in a culture – its beliefs, values, and self-definitions – we must necessarily compare and contrast those beliefs, values, and self-definitions to our own. In doing so, we may come to see limitations, inconsistencies, contradictions, lacunae or even plain falsehoods associated with our own worldview as well as that of others. “Understanding,” Charles Taylor has written, “is inseparable from criticism, but this in turn is inseparable from self-criticism” (1985b: 131). Advocates of the philosophical hermeneutics approach emphasize that such interpretive inquiry may also be applied to our own world. Taylor, for instance, via deep interpretive inquiry has detected a legitimation crisis at the core of contemporary Western society (1985b: 248-288). He argues that the instrumentalist and acquisitive values of modern industrial society are in contradiction with (and in fact erode) other fundamental Western values, including genuine autonomy and community.
Hermeneutics’ rejection of naturalism’s subject/object epistemology, and its embrace of a dialogical model of understanding, also leads to very different understanding of data in the social sciences. Naturalists, Taylor has argued, wish to make data univocal (1985a: 117). That is, they seek to build theories grounded in data that will admit of only one meaning. Univocal data allow for intersubjective agreement among scientists and thus are a key source of science’s claim to objectivity. In the natural science, the goal of producing univocal data is frequently achieved. Natural scientists do in fact often reach consensus on the meaning of data used to construct or test a theory – for example, the composition of gasses detected in a volcanic eruption, the number of sea turtle eggs detected on a beach, or the kind of radiation emitted in a supernova. But advocates of a hermeneutical approach to social inquiry argue that the data of social science theories can only be made univocal at the cost of producing a highly distorted or largely vacuous description of the social world. The data of the social world are partly composed of intentions, beliefs, values, rituals, practices and other elements in need of interpretation. Interpreting them requires unpacking the larger web of meanings in which they are embedded. However, no interpretation of such data can be considered final and uncontestable. As with the interpretation of a novel, a poem or a painting, there will be no criteria or external data that can be appealed to that will produce a definitive and incorrigible interpretation of social phenomena. This does not mean that anything goes and that all interpretations should be considered equally plausible or valid. But it does mean that the data of social science cannot be univocal in naturalism’s sense. Rather, the data of social science will remain multivocal and always open to multiple meanings. If consensus about the meaning of social phenomena it is to be attained, it must be arrived at via dialogue rather than appeal to data deemed to be external, objective and beyond dispute.
Supporters of the hermeneutical approach also emphasize that social inquiry is inherently evaluative. Here the hermeneutical tradition departs decisively from descriptivism and naturalism, both of which embrace the aim of objective, value-free social inquiry. Descriptivists believe that an objective account of a culture can be rendered by recovering the point of view of the culture’s members. There is no need to assess the validity, coherence or merit of a culture’s desires and values. In fact, if the culture under study is a foreign one, to attempt to do so risks ethnocentricity – the improper judging of another culture in terms of one’s own values. Advocates of naturalism, embracing the fact/value distinction discussed above, tend to view desires, purposes and values as merely individuals’ subjective preferences, which cannot be rationally assessed. We may seek to explain the causes of people’s beliefs and values, but moral evaluation of them lies beyond science. But hermeneutical interpretivists argue that desires, values and purposes are not merely subjective. As humans we do not simply desire or value some end or trait unreflectively and uncritically. We also evaluate our values, desires and purposes – assess them as noble or base, deep or superficial, authentic or inauthentic, rational or irrational. For instance, a person might desire to hurt someone physically, but also view that desire as shameful, inconsistent with his more deeply held values, and not reflective of the kind of person he aspires to be. Importantly, this person would not be the only one in position to evaluate his desire. In fact, others might be more perceptive in identifying the inconsistencies between the person’s deeper sense of self and his desire to hurt another. This means that a person can be mistaken regarding his or her own values, purposes or desires. They do not necessarily have the final word. The same holds for entire societies and cultures. Incongruence between values, purposes, desires and beliefs may also occur at a society-wide level, and good interpretive inquiry will bring these inconsistencies to light. In doing so, it will be evaluative.
There is another sense in which a purely descriptivist account can fail to provide an adequate account of what’s really going on in a society. A descriptivist account may fail to identify causal processes or mechanisms that operate, to borrow a phrase from Karl Marx, behind the back of a society’s inhabitants. Identifying such processes and mechanisms may take the form of revealing how individual actions or social policies or practices may produce unintended consequences (sometimes welcome, but also often unwanted). Adam Smith’s unpacking of the invisible hand mechanism of the market is an exemplar of such kinds of explanations. Individuals and, indeed, entire societies may be dimly or even wholly unaware of such processes, and simply producing a thick description of a society may leave them obscure. According to some social scientists, unveiling such mechanisms is a central task of social science. This view is discussed in the final section of this article.
Advocates of naturalism as well as of hermeneutics may agree that an important aim of social investigation is to uncover such unseen causal processes. However, proponents of the philosophical hermeneutics approach will insist that any such explanation must begin with an attempt to make sense of individuals on their own terms, with their own concepts and self-descriptions. “Interpretive social science,” Taylor says, “cannot by-pass the agent’s self-understanding” by creating some purportedly neutral scientific language. (1985b: 118). But some naturalists will insist that social science explanations need not always be tied to the particular self-understandings of the people under study. In fact, both the explanandum (that is, the phenomena to be explained) and the explanans (the explanation itself) may sometimes be couched in a neutral, transcultural scientific language. Such explanations typically attempt to make sense of phenomena that are either universal or common at least to most human societies (for example, birth, death, violence, order, domination, hierarchy). They would also be grounded in assumptions about human goals (for example, nutrition, safety, material well-being, status) and human rationality (typically means-end rationality) posited to be species specific rather than culture specific. These explanations require merely a thin, rather than a thick, description of the social practice or phenomena to be explained. In this way, naturalists believe that science can offer explanations of social phenomena that transcend – and are in fact superior to – the self-understanding of the society being explained.
A related critique of interpretive social inquiry leveled by naturalists is the charge of particularism. This criticism says that interpretive social inquiry would appear to produce merely a collection of particularistic interpretive accounts of different cultures. That is, an interpretive approach would seem to limit social science’s ability to explain similar kinds of events and phenomena that occur in different cultures. Political scientists, for example, do not want merely to explain the Iranian Revolution or the Russian Revolution. They also want to explain revolutions in general. This requires uncovering the typical conditions, mechanisms or laws that produce revolutions. That is, it requires creating a model of a typical revolution. This in turn entails abandoning the thick descriptions of human beliefs and goals favored by interpretivists and replacing it with a thinner, more abstract account of human action – the sort used by rational choice theorists, for example. If interpretivists object to using this level of abstraction, naturalists argue, it appears they must relinquish the goal of producing explanations of social phenomena that transcend particular cultures. This would necessitate abandoning many important questions that social sciences have traditionally sought to answer.
Two other schools of thought that reject naturalism are critical theory and postmodernism. Both of these approaches agree that social inquiry must be in part interpretive. They also agree with advocates of hermeneutics that interpretation is an inherently evaluative activity. Thus they reject naturalism’s goal of value neutrality. Their most important contribution to the critique of value neutrality lies in their exploration of the various ways that social science can serve to legitimate and reinforce oppressive values, beliefs and practices and thereby mask domination. Far from being unbiased, value neutrality represents a hidden ideology.
Critical theory traces is origins to the Frankfurt School, founded in the 1920s in Germany, which included such thinkers as Max Horkheimer, Theodor Adorno, Herbert Marcuse and Jurgen Habermas. Coming out of the Marxist tradition, members of this school took to heart Marx’s famous conclusion from his “Theses on Feuerbach”: “Philosophers have hitherto only interpreted the world in various ways; the point is to change it.” Marx viewed his efforts to explain the inner workings of capitalism and the logic of history as a scientific endeavor. But he also saw social inquiry as necessarily intertwined with critiquing society and ultimately liberating mankind from oppression. Following in this vein, the original critical theorists argued that a social scientist should not – and cannot – be a neutral observer of the social world. Thus the Frankfurt School sought to retain the social criticism intrinsic to Marxism while distancing their approach from the rigidified orthodox version of the doctrine that propped up the totalitarian system in the Soviet Union and its satellites. In place of orthodox Marxism they aimed to produce a new theory that could at once explain the failure of socialism in the Western liberal democracies and also provide a critique of what they saw as oppressive features of developed capitalist societies.
Today critical theory encompasses a broader group of social theorists than solely the contemporary descendents of the Frankfurt School. Use of the term has expanded to include many other approaches, such as feminism and other liberation ideologies that claim to offer both a systematic explanation and critique of economic, social and political structures, institutions or ideologies that are held to oppress people. The aim of critical theory is human emancipation, and this is accomplished in part by laying bare structural impediments to genuine freedom, contradictions and incoherencies in people’s beliefs and values, and hidden ideologies that mask domination. Liberation thus comes through enlightenment. When people are made aware of the true nature of their situation, they will cast off the shackles of oppression. In this sense, critical theory remains continuous with the broader Enlightenment project of the West that began in the seventeenth century: reason would triumph over irrationality, superstition and prejudice to usher in a new era of freedom and justice.
For critical theorists the sources of domination and false consciousness are wide-ranging. Those in the Marxist tradition, for instance, explore how the values, beliefs and hierarchies generated by capitalism serve to keep the working class deluded and exploited. Feminist critical theorists examine how patriarchal values, which they find are deeply imbedded in contemporary institutions, legal systems, and social values, serve to keep women subordinate. But critical theorists also train much of their criticism on mainstream social science, particularly its claim to value neutrality. Like the advocates of hermeneutical social inquiry described above, critical theorists contend that social inquiry is an inherently evaluative enterprise. In fact, critical theorists hold that that social science is a necessarily political enterprise. Mainstream social science modeled on naturalism, they charge, reinforces the status quo and serves the interests of the powerful, though usually unwittingly. In contrast, critical theory wears its values on it sleeve as an intentionally partisan endeavor on the side of liberation.
How, according to critical theorists, does naturalistic social science serve the status quo and mask domination? They argue that many of the supposedly neutral, objective concepts and categories of social science actually subtly but powerfully support particular political interests and worldviews. Consider the understanding of rationality that is central to standard economic theory. Economists conceptualize rational action in a particular way, namely as maximizing utility – choosing the most efficient means to achieve some end. Economists may claim that their concept of rationality is merely descriptive, containing no moral judgment of individuals’ behavior. But in ordinary use “rationality” clearly implies a positive moral evaluation, and its opposite, “irrationality,” indicates a negative judgment. Therefore designating actions as rational or irrational has the effect not only of evaluating certain kinds of behavior as superior to others, it also tends to justify public policy grounded in assumptions about what constitutes rational individual or government behavior. In particular, public policy guided by economists’ conceptualization of rationality will tend to be governed by instrumental reasoning – achieving the most efficient means to some desired end. As such, it will be biased against other values or motivations for action that may interfere with efficiency, such a social justice, tradition, or preserving community. Other concepts used by social scientists are similarly value laden, critical theorists charge. When political scientists, for instance, describe societies as developed, developing or undeveloped, such classification necessarily implies a moral and political hierarchy among nations, with the wealthy, capitalist societies invariably winding up on top.
Critical theorists also point to other ways in which social science has helped to justify and reinforce oppressive practices and beliefs. In particular, critical theorists charge that social science often serves to reify social processes. That is, it tends to foster the illusion that malleable or socially constructed aspects of society are natural, permanent or otherwise incapable of being altered. Social scientists tend to take the institutions and social structure of society as well as its values, beliefs, customs and habits are taken as a given. In doing so they establish the parameters within which public policy must operate. According to critical theorists, this produces a bias towards the status quo, and also tends to reinforce the power of dominant groups or forces in society. For example, orthodox economists tend to depict certain features of capitalist economies, such as inequality and unemployment, as the enduring and inevitable (if unwelcome) results of the laws of market system. Attempts to eliminate these features will be ultimately ineffective or produce unacceptably high tradeoffs, in the form of, for example, high inflation and sluggish growth. Nothing can be done about this unhappy situation, economists may say; it results from the fundamental and inalterable dynamics of economic systems. But critical theorists charge that the purported laws of economics are in fact the product of certain institutional arrangements, beliefs and values that can be altered. Other kinds of economic systems are in fact possible. Relying on the (often questionable) expertise of the economist turns public policy into merely a technical matter. The reality is that economic policy is also political policy. The institutions and values that underpin an economy reflect political choices. However, social science modeled on the natural sciences tends to blind the public – as well as social scientists themselves – to this reality.
In addition to helping reify social structures, critical theorists argue that the knowledge produced by social science too easily becomes a tool with which to manipulate people rather than to enlighten or emancipate them. Consider, for instance, some of the ways that governments and private industry use findings from psychology and sociology. Politicians and interest groups hire psychologists to find the best way to sell their policy initiatives to the public, rather than attempting to enhance public understanding of complex policy issues. Political parties and private corporations use focus groups to discover which words or images have the biggest impact on the public and adjust their rhetoric and advertising accordingly. Political consultants in the United States, for example, in recent years have advised opponents of the estate tax to dub it a death tax, which focus group research shows reduces support for it. Such studies have also led consultants to advise opponents of efforts to rein in carbon emissions to use the term “climate change” rather than “global warming.” Public opinion is thus manufactured rather than discovered through deliberation and analysis. Critical theorists claim that in this way social science fosters a society governed by technocratic control and is thus ultimately corrosive to genuine democracy.
Plainly critical theory has much in common with the hermeneutical approach described above. Critical theorists and proponents of a hermeneutical social inquiry both agree that social science is an inherently evaluative enterprise. Also, critical theorists agree that social inquiry must be, at least in part, an interpretive activity. Social inquiry, they agree, must aim at enhancing understanding of our world rather than merely enhancing our powers of prediction and technical control. But the two approaches differ fundamentally in their ontological assumptions about the social world and the relationship between the social scientist and the objects of his or her study. As noted above, the hermeneutical school holds that understanding is a dialogical and transformative process. Through what Hans-Georg Gadamer called a fusion of horizons, both the social inquirer and the target of inquiry create a kind of higher understanding that transcends the viewpoints of both parties.
In contrast, critical theorists, along with those in the naturalism camp, tend to embrace a subject/object ontology. From this standpoint, objective knowledge is produced when the social scientist produces an accurate representation of the social world. This understanding of the relationship between the social investigator and the subjects of his study privileges the social scientist as the knowing expert. The truth – provided by the expert – enlightens the subjects of inquiry and, it is hoped, thereby sets them free. They trade in their distorted ideological understanding for the clear-eyed perspective provided by critical theory. But advocates of hermeneutical inquiry, as well as other critics of naturalism, may object that this approach may undermine the liberationist goals of critical theory. Social inquiry should enlighten its subjects, but this is best attained through dialogue rather than a top-down imposition of expert analysis. Indeed, people may be inclined to reject the verdict of the critical theorists, opposing such knowledge as not reflective of their own self-understanding or experience. For this reason some proponents of hermeneutical inquiry support a participatory form of social science, in which social scientists and non-expert citizens work together in conducting research aimed at enlightening subjects and solving social problems.
It is important to note, however, that critical theorists often insist that the ultimate test of a theory is whether its intended audience accepts it as valid. The purportedly oppressed – for example, the working class, women, racial minorities – must come to see the critical theorists’ evaluation of their situation as true. Nonetheless, the privileged position of the critical theorist is perhaps still retained. For in practice he or she decides when the subjects of his inquiry are still in the grip of false consciousness and when they see their situation as it truly is – that is, when they see the world as critical theory depicts it. Presumably no feminist critical theorist would accept the falsification of her theory of women’s oppression if the subjects of her inquiry, after dialogue and reflection, concluded that traditional gender roles benefit women. Rather, she would conclude that the distorting powers of patriarchal ideology are more pervasive and entrenched than she had thought.
Adherents of another influential school of thought, postmodernism, have also been critical of social science’s claim to value neutrality and, again like the critical theorists, they tend to see social science as a potential source of domination. While postmodern is a rather loosely defined category, with the views of thinkers associated with it varying widely, some key tenets of the approach can be identified. Central among them is cultural and historical relativism. According to postmodernists, what counts as knowledge and truth is always relative to a particular culture or historical period. This holds not only for moral and aesthetic judgments, but also for the claims to truth made by natural and social science. Thus science does not offer a method for arriving at universal, objective truths that transcend time and place. Rather, it represents one way of knowing that reflects certain values, beliefs and interests of modern, Western society. Moreover, for postmodernists there is no fixed, universal human nature. Instead, human nature (our beliefs, values, desires, interests, and even our emotions) is itself a product of a particular history or social configuration – or, as postmodernists sometimes say, human nature is socially constructed. (Hence a variant of postmodernism is known as social constructionism.)
Postmodernists’ relativism and their denial of a universal human nature lead to certain criticisms of social science modeled on naturalism. They reject as deeply misguided attempts by social scientists to uncover patterns, structures or laws that purportedly transcend history and culture. For postmodernists, understanding of particular societies must be local and contextual. In this respect, postmodernists partly share the concern of critical theorists that social science tends to reify social patterns and structure. But postmodernists are also skeptical of critical theory’s approach to social inquiry. Though distorting ideologies and power structures may obscure the truth, critical theorists maintain that ultimately an objective picture of society can be rendered. Moreover, the critical theorists’ view of enlightenment is grounded in the view that there is an identifiable universal human nature in need of liberation. But, given their relativism, postmodernists tend to see these views as supporting subtle forms of Western imperialism. In seeking to emancipate people, critical theorists risk imposing their own ethnocentric views of rationality, autonomy and justice onto non-Western societies (or reinforcing them in Western ones). Thus for postmodernists, critical theory is grounded in many of the same faulty assumptions about objectivity, rationality and knowledge as mainstream social science.
Perhaps the most influential postmodern critic of social science was the French social theorist Michel Foucault. Foucault not only challenged the value neutrality of social science, he also disputed the broader enlightenment view (shared by most critical theorists as well as social science modeled on naturalism) that modern reason and science provide the route to moral and epistemological progress. Foucault’s critique of social science concerned the way social science categorized individuals and groups, which he believed constituted a subtle but pervasive form of social power. His critique is some ways resembles the critical theorists’ observations described above regarding the ideological nature of social science categories. But Foucault’s critique was more radical.
Foucault contended that most if not all of the social kinds identified and used by social scientists are inventions. That is, they are the creations of social science as opposed to discoveries of natural kinds that reflect the real underlying, objective structure of social reality. Foucault trained much of his criticism on the fields of clinical psychology, criminology, and sociology, which in the nineteenth century began creating elaborate taxonomies of abnormal types of persons, for example, psychopaths, neurotics, kleptomaniacs, delinquents, and the like. Many of these new kinds of persons were identified by reference to their sexual proclivities. For instance, before the emergence of clinical psychology as a discipline, the today commonplace view that homosexuals are a kind of person did not exist. Of course, people prior to the emergence of psychology recognized that some individuals are sexually attracted to people of the same sex. But they did not generally see this fact as a fundamental element of a person’s nature that could be used to categorize him or her as particular kind of person.
Foucault argued that in the process of creating such categories, social science at the same time created and disseminated a particular view of normality. In this way social science became a new and important kind of potentially oppressive power in the modern world. According to Foucault, the state works hand in hand with other institutions of the modern world – prisons, schools, medical clinics, the military – to monitor and control people. It accomplishes this, however, neither principally through brute force nor via a regiment of rewards and punishments. Rather, the state works in concert with social science to construct the very categories through which individuals understand themselves. In doing so it establishes the criteria by which normal and abnormal behavior is understood, and thereby regulates behavior – most importantly by getting people to regulate themselves. In this way social science has in effect become a handmaiden to the forces of domination rather than a potential source of emancipation. Significantly, Foucault never claimed that this new type of control is intentional. It is merely an unwelcome artifact of social science.
Foucault’s depiction of social science was part of his broader account of how all social orders generate claims to truth and knowledge. For Foucault what counts as truth or knowledge in a particular society is merely the product of a certain configuration of power relations. There is no truth or knowledge outside of such power regimes, he argued. Since the nineteenth century, the social sciences in conjunction with the state have been instrumental in setting up a new system of power/knowledge, principally through creating – not discovering – the categories by which we make sense of our social world. But, for Foucault, the alliance of the state and social science is merely the latest power regime in human history. Other systems preceded it and no doubt new systems of power/knowledge will emerge in the future. Here critics point to a disturbing implication of Foucault’s ideas. It appears that for Foucault human beings, collectively or individually, cannot liberate themselves from the grip of such power regimes. They may trade one regime for another, but no genuine emancipation is possible. Indeed, given Foucault’s views of the self as thoroughly constructed by social forces, the very notion of liberation becomes incoherent. Thus Foucault’s radical relativism would seem to undermine the central aim of any critical approach that seeks to unmask oppressive ideologies, enhance human autonomy, advance justice or promote greater social transparency. The ideas of other influential postmodern and social constructionist critics of social inquiry (such as Richard Rorty and Kenneth Gergen) that entail relativism and deny the existence of a fixed human nature would seem to be vulnerable to such criticism, too. Postmodernists may charge that mainstream social science modeled on naturalism and critical theory alike both have the effect of imposing certain modernist notions of normality, rationality, and autonomy. But critics of postmodernism can retort that by undermining the very possibility of genuine emancipation postmodernism invites nihilism, quietism or apathy.
Another long-standing controversy in the philosophy of social science is the debate between methodological individualists and methodological holists. The former hold that social facts and phenomena are reducible without remainder to facts about individuals. Advocates of methodological holism, on the other hand, argue that there are some facts, conventionally dubbed “social facts,” that are not reducible to facts about individuals and that social phenomena can sometimes be adequately explained without reference to individuals. It should be noted that there is no necessary connection between support for methodological individualism or holism and one’s stance vis-à-vis the naturalism debate. Nonetheless there is a tendency for advocates of naturalism to embrace methodological individualism. Still, holists are found in the naturalist camp, too, including Emile Durkheim and Auguste Comte, both of whom were key figures in founding the field of sociology.
The individualism-holism debate can be somewhat confusing because the terms of debate often refer to different claims. Sometimes methodological individualism is understood to be a theory of meaning that holds that all statements about social entities or phenomena can be defined in terms that refer solely to individuals. So, according to this view, the meaning of “bureaucracy” can be defined exclusively in terms of the individuals that compose a bureaucracy without reference to the properties of a bureaucracy as an institution. Methodological individualism can also constitute an ontological theory. This version claims that only individuals are real and that social entities, facts or phenomena are, at best, useful abstractions. According to this view we may speak of armies, trade cycles or riots in our explanations, but we must keep in mind that such entities and phenomena merely describe individuals and their interactions with each other. Our terms describing social entities and phenomena may be useful for formulating shorthand descriptions or explanations, but this does not mean that the entities and phenomena that they refer to actually exist.
Both the meaning and the ontological versions of methodological individualism are contested. Critics of the meaning theory note that the view entails barring reference to institutions, rules, and norms when defining social entities and phenomena. This, they charge, is simply not possible. For instance, explaining the meaning of “army” would require defining it in terms of the individuals that compose an army, namely soldiers. But the description of the soldiers could not contain any reference to the rules, aims, norms, social relations and structures that in part create an army. Not only would, for example, a description of a soldier as someone who belongs to an army be barred, also prohibited would be any reference to other holistic phenomena and entities, such as wars or platoons. The account of soldiers would have to be limited solely to narrow descriptions of their psychological dispositions. Such restriction seems highly implausible, not the least of which because soldiers’ self-understanding naturally includes holistic entities and phenomena. If individuals incorporate holistic entities into their actions and self-descriptions, why must social science be barred from doing so? Moreover, a social science bereft of such references seems unimaginable, and, in any event, social scientists routinely and without controversy employ them in their descriptions and explanations. Thus few actual practitioners of social inquiry accept the meaning thesis.
The ontological thesis is generally regarded as less objectionable but is still contested. It is arguable that individuals are the only real inhabitants of the social world, even if people typically act as if social entities and phenomena are real. So, for instance, a person might favor privatization of government services on the ground that, in her judgment, government control fosters bureaucracies, which in her view are inherently inefficient. She may hold this belief about bureaucracies without knowing anything about the attitudes, values and so forth of particular individuals who work in them. That is, she believes something about the nature of bureaucracies themselves as opposed to merely holding certain beliefs about the individuals that inhabit them. Methodological holists may claim that her belief is grounded in a proper realist understanding of institutions. Bureaucracies are real entities, they argue, because the institutional structure of bureaucracies affects the behavior of the individuals within in them. But methodological individualists can retort that in principle the structural properties of a bureaucracy can be reduced to facts about the individuals that comprise them. This is true even if individuals, including bureaucrats themselves, believe and act as if bureaucracies themselves have certain properties. It may be impossible to define a bureaucracy in terms that omit reference to holistic entities, but that does not mean that bureaucracies or other holistic entities are real. The situation can be compared to the relationship between paranormal investigators and the ghosts that they believe in. It may be impossible to define “paranormal investigator” without reference to the idea of ghosts and other fantastical entities. And it may be the case that belief in ghosts affects the behavior of paranormal investigators. But none of this proves that ghosts exist.
A third and least controversial version of methodological individualism merely posits that social phenomena must be animated by individual actions. Therefore any satisfactory explanation of a social event or regularity must show how it is the result of individuals responding to a particular social situation. This view does not require that holistic entities or phenomena be defined in terms of individual-level facts, nor does it require denying the reality of holistic entities or phenomena. It simply requires that whenever a holistic entity or phenomena is claimed to cause certain effects, or whenever a social regularity is identified, some plausible mechanism at the individual level that produces the phenomena must be identified.
Some advocates of methodological individualism have argued that methodological holism is politically dangerous. They claim that ascribing reality to holistic entities lends credence to the view that such entities have needs or interests of their own. As such, methodological holism too readily becomes the handmaiden to tyrannical regimes that claim that the needs of the state or the nation transcend those of actual, living people. For this reason, Karl Popper called methodological individualism a “democratic-individualist” approach to social inquiry, whereas methodological collectivism supported “totalitarian justice.” However, critics of methodological individualism claim that it too has its own built-in biases. By denying the reality of institutional structures and other holistic entities – or at least downplaying the degree to which they can constrain individuals’ actions – methodological individualism tends to support a conservative political outlook. This worldview attributes individuals’ social or economic position principally to their own actions and abilities rather than the social situation that they are embedded in. Thus the poor are poor owing to their own choices and effort, and not because the capitalist system presents obstacles to exiting their situation.
Reflecting the tendency of philosophy of social science, most of this article has focused on comparing social science to the natural sciences. We have seen that formidable problems are encountered when the social sciences strive to produce theories that approach the range, elegance, predictive power and objectivity associated with natural science. But instead of asking whether social science can or should mirror the natural sciences, another way to evaluate social science is to ask: How does social science enhance our understanding of the social world? Assessing the merits of social science in this way entails reflection on the actual practices of social scientists – the methods they use, the questions they ask, the puzzles they try to solve, the kind of evidence that they produce, and so forth. Even if social science has failed to produce theories that rival the elegant and powerful theories of the natural sciences that does not necessarily show that social science is not a worthwhile endeavor. One way to measure the success of the social sciences is to ask whether their findings surpass common sense or folk wisdom, or otherwise tell us something useful, non-obvious or counterintuitive about the social world. This section examines three ways in which social science could be deemed successful by this standard: uncovering facts about the social world, finding correlations, and identifying mechanisms.
An important task of social inquiry is to lay bare facts about an often murky social world. This can be a significant achievement in its own right, even if the discovery and collection of facts never leads to the more desirable goals of producing elegant theories and causal explanations of social phenomena or empowers us to make precise predictions about the social world. Without social science, our factual understanding of the social world would be left mainly to folk wisdom and anecdotal evidence, neither of which is very reliable. Uncovering facts about the social world is no mean feat. It often requires empirical rigor and conceptual sophistication. It also often necessitates developing special methods for measuring the entities and phenomena of the social world.
Following are just a few examples of factual questions that social science can help answer. These questions seem inherently interesting or are important from the standpoint of public policy, and the answers to them are not likely to be evident without sophisticated inquiry. From economics: What types of economic systems produce the most robust economic growth? Is the economy currently shrinking or growing? What is the current unemployment rate? Has the income of the median worker in European Union member states increased in the past decade, and, if so, by how much? Has social mobility increased or decreased in advanced industrial societies? From political science: Which nations enjoy the most political freedom? Has political freedom throughout the world increased in recent decades? Has warfare? How popular is the current U.S. president with the American people? Is political discourse getting more sophisticated or less? From sociology: Have community ties grown stronger our weaker in Western societies in the past century? Are people in societies with individualistic values happier than those in communitarian societies? From criminology: Has crime increased in recent decades? If so, what kinds of communities have seen the biggest increases? From social psychology: How many people in the Western world suffer from clinical depression? Has this number increased or decreased recently? We can also include among the facts uncovered by social inquiry the thick descriptions of cultures and practices that interpretive inquiry can produce.
Of course, what counts as a fact will be a partly interpretive matter and thus dependent upon the self-understandings of the persons being studied. How, for example, should we conceptualize and measure freedom or individualism or depression? The definitions of these terms will always be contestable and subject to change. And social scientists will always be vulnerable to the critique, discussed above, that the facts they uncover reflect their own biases, interests or worldviews. Nonetheless, there are facts about the social world, and it seems fatuous to deny that social science at its best has not made us better acquainted with them, even if no purely neutral and objective concepts can be used to describe them. The same is true, after all, for natural science.
A particularly important tool of the social sciences for enhancing understanding of the social world is a host of statistical techniques that can be broadly described as correlation analysis. These statistical innovations were developed by social scientists in the late nineteenth century and came into widespread use beginning in the twentieth. The aim behind their development was to help get a handle on one of the most difficult problems confronting social science: How to account for the often bewildering number of variables that potentially influence social phenomena. As noted above, isolating the effects of particular variables in the social realm presents a formidable challenge to social scientists, owing to the difficulty – and sometimes impossibility – of conducting controlled experiments. Multivariate regression analysis, structural equation modeling and other sophisticated statistical tools address this problem by giving social scientists the ability to gauge with mathematical precision the impact of multiple variables on social phenomena. For example, suppose criminologists wish to shed light on the factors that influence the rate of violent crime. A host of potential social variables might plausibly be thought to do so, including poverty, education, sex, race, population density, gun-control laws, television viewing, and so forth. Multivariate regression, which provides the ability to hold multiple variables artificially constant, allows researchers to determine how strongly each of these variables is associated with violent crime. Such analysis might be able to tell us, for example, that poverty, sex, and education level accounts for 60% of the variance in crime and that gun control laws have no effect. Multivariate regression can even help gauge the interactive effects of various factors, perhaps showing that education level alone has little effect on crime but does have an impact when combined with poverty and high-population density.
Correlation analysis has greatly enhanced social scientists’ understanding of the social world, but it is hampered by serious limitations. In particular, it can never tell researchers whether one variable causes changes in another variable. This is so even if a one-to-one correspondence between variables in uncovered. For it is always possible that there is an unknown third variable that is the true cause behind changes in the variable that investigators seeks to explain. For example, suppose statistical analysis demonstrates a strong and stable correlation between individuals’ average television-viewing hours and violence: the more television individuals watch, the more likely they are to commit violent acts. But such evidence by itself cannot tell researchers whether watching television makes people more inclined to commit acts of violence or whether the violence-prone are more likely to watch television. Perhaps an unaccounted for third factor – say, poor social skills or unemployment – is the true cause of the violence and the increased television viewing. Explaining the cause of some phenomenon requires understanding of the causal mechanism that produces it. This correlation analysis cannot provide. It can, however, tell social scientists when a causal connection does not exist. Correlation does not entail causation, but causal connections always produce correlation. So failure to uncover a correlation between certain variables can inform researchers that there is no causal connection between them. In this way, correlation analysis provides an important tool for falsifying hypotheses.
Some philosophers have argued that the primary explanatory power of social science resides in its ability to identify mechanisms, as opposed to discovery of law-like generalizations. Among the more important advocates of this view is Jon Elster, who defines mechanisms as “frequently occurring and easily recognizable causal patterns that are triggered under unknown conditions or with indeterminate consequences” (1999: 1). Mechanisms, Elster says, “allow us to explain, but not predict.” We may not be able to say precisely under what conditions a mechanism will be triggered or exactly how it will operate in particular circumstances. Nonetheless, we know a mechanism when we see one. Elster denies that social science has uncovered any genuine law-like regularities and doubts that it ever will. However, social scientists can and have identified numerous mechanisms, which produce explanations that go beyond mere description, even if they fall short of explanations grounded in universal laws or theories. Explanation by mechanisms may not always permit us to make predictions, but we can often identify their operation in hindsight. Key aims of social science thus include identifying mechanisms, describing them with greater detail, and, if possible, more precisely identifying the kinds of situations that can trigger them.
With respect to social inquiry, mechanisms can be divided into individual-level and social-level kinds. Individual-level mechanisms describe typical ways in which individuals form desires and beliefs or fall prey to perception or reasoning errors. An important category of these mechanisms has the effect of reducing cognitive dissonance – the uncomfortable psychological stress caused by holding two incompatible beliefs simultaneously. One common mechanism that combats cognitive dissonances is wishful thinking, in which a person represses unpleasant beliefs that he or she knows to be true. The sour-grapes effect, in contrast, works on desires rather than beliefs. This mechanism takes its name from one of Aesop’s fables in which a fox decides that some grapes are undesirable because they are too high atop a vine for him to reach. These psychological mechanisms may be triggered whenever individuals find themselves in a situation that is contrary to the way they would prefer it to be. However, we will generally not be able to predict whether one of these mechanisms will be triggered in such a situation – or, if one is triggered, which one. But we can identify their operation retrospectively, and in this sense they provide some general explanatory power. Elster argues that the works of the ablest social observers in the Western tradition are replete with such mechanisms. Much of his analysis has focused on Alexis de Tocqueville’s Democracy in America and Paul Veyne’s Bread and Circuses, which explore the complex interaction between beliefs, desires and norms in, respectively, nineteenth-century American democracy and the political institutions of classical antiquity. Their insightful use of mechanisms in their explanations allows their work to transcend mere idiographic description and to shed light on contemporary politics.
Social-level mechanisms involve the interaction of individuals. Unveiling them requires untangling such interaction to reveal how it produces social phenomena. Often the most important part of, for example, an economist’s work resides in developing models that show how consumers and producers (or other types of actors) interact with each other to produce particular economic phenomenon. According to this view, the laws of economics and politics discussed above are best understood as typical patterns produced by human interaction rather than genuine law-like regularities. Seen this way, that the law of demand and Michels’ laws, for instance, are exception-ridden and far from universal does not completely vitiate their explanatory power. They still capture important features of human social relations, even if they fail to give social scientists the ability to determine precisely when or under what circumstances such phenomena will occur. Their real value resides not in predicting outcomes but in demystifying an often-opaque social milieu.
Of special interest to social scientists are social-level mechanisms that produce unintended consequences. The paradigmatic case of an unintended consequences explanation is Adam Smith’s invisible hand, a concept developed in his seminal work The Wealth of Nations. The invisible hand occurs when individuals contribute to the public good by pursuing their own, narrow interests. This phenomenon is ubiquitous in a capitalist economy. Firms seek to increase their profit by striving to produce the best goods for the lowest price, and consumers seek to satisfy their own desires by purchasing such goods. But in seeking to advance their own aims, both also at the same time spur economic growth, which reduces unemployment and raises living standards. The unintended – and happy – result of such self-interested behavior is greater overall wealth and prosperity. Sometimes unintended consequences are unwelcome or even disastrous, as in the case of the so-called tragedy of the commons. This phenomena, described by Garrett Hardin in an influential 1968 Science essay, occurs when individuals have free access to some desirable resource and each seeks to maximize his or her take of the resource, resulting in its depletion, which makes everybody worse off. An example is provided by the rapid exhaustion of the ocean’s stock of fish. Commercial fishermen each strive to maximize their haul of fish, leading to the swift decline of the total stock and a reduction in each fisherman’s daily haul. Paradoxically, to increase their take over the long run, fishermen must submit to limits on how much fish they can remove from the sea.
Considering the explanatory practices of some other fields that we are inclined to call sciences lends support to the legitimacy of explanation via mechanisms rather than universal laws. As Roy D’Andrade has noted, the explanations produced by, for example, biology, geology, meteorology and oceanography typically do not rely on universal laws. As in the social world, the regularities and patterns found in these sciences are not timeless and universal. Instead they are contingent and contextual in the sense that they are dependent upon certain historical and environmental factors. Change the conditions and the patterns or regularities may alter or disappear altogether. “The [biologist’s] description of DNA,” D’Andrade notes, is “… not the description of a law, but rather the description of a complex contingent mechanism” (1986: 21, emphasis added). Sciences that explain via identification of such mechanisms, which he dubs the “natural” sciences (as opposed to the “physical” sciences, such as physics, astronomy and chemistry), include, he says, much of psychology, sociology, anthropology, economics and other social sciences. Natural sciences tend to view the objects of their inquiries as machines. The machines of the social sciences (understood as natural sciences in D’Andrade’s sense) would include social structures and institutions, such as markets, bureaucracies and electoral systems. The questions that scientists ask about a machine are: What is it made of? and How does it work? Offering a mechanistic account of the inner workings of machines provides an explanation that offers a degree of generalizable knowledge. However, he adds that in the natural sciences, “[G]eneralizations about how things work are often complex, true only of one particular kind of thing, and usually best stated in a simplified natural language” (1986: 21). This well describes the type of mechanisms discussed above that social science uncovers.
At present there is no agreement about the proper approach to investigating the social world, as this tour through some long-standing issues and debates in the philosophy of social science should have made clear. This lack of consensus is reflected in the methodological pluralism that marks social inquiry as currently practiced. Social scientists in the naturalist mold use various kinds of quantitative analyses, rational choice models (particularly in economics and political science), and experimental research (particularly in psychology) to uncover facts, patterns, and mechanisms in the social realm. Outside the mainstream, various approaches informed by the descriptivist, hermeneutical, critical theory, and postmodern views described in previous sections can be seen. These would include (to name but a few) existential and humanistic psychology; ethnomethodology in anthropology; phenomenology, deconstructionism, and Foucauldian genealogy in sociology; Marxism, constructivism, and critical theory in political science; and different kinds of participatory research in various fields.
It would be facile to suggest that all of these methods and the theories underpinning them can be fully reconciled. But it also seems doubtful that one approach alone (either among those currently in use or one yet to be discovered) could capture the whole of social reality in all its multi-textured dimensions. Thus the present methodological pluralism of social science seems welcome and necessary. That the social world is a meaningful world created by self-interpreting beings, as the interpretive school holds, is undeniable. Thus one of the aims of social inquiry should be to capture that meaning. Also, as the hermeneutical, postmodern and critical theory approaches insist, social inquiry is inherently evaluative. A purely objective, neutral science of the social world is neither possible nor desirable. So, room must be made in social investigation for reflection on the biases, interests and ideologies embedded in various social science methods. And, finally, naturalistic mainstream social scientists are surely right to continue searching for patterns, mechanisms and causal processes in the social world, for they do exist, even if they are only relatively enduring and dependent upon social context, including the shifting self-understandings of human beings.
From this vantage, a kind of unification of the social sciences can be envisioned, though not in the sense advocated by naturalism. Unification in this sense requires, as the hermeneutical approach suggests, that we view social science as social practice. The efforts of social scientists should be seen as part of a wider, on-going human project to better understand ourselves and our world, and to make our world better. The facts, patterns and mechanisms that mainstream social science uncovers, the meanings that descriptivism unveils, and the self-reflective awareness of the values embedded in such inquiry that critical theory and hermeneutics counsel, should all be part of this broader human conversation.
William A. Gorton
U. S. A.
Last updated: August 31, 2010 | Originally published: