Solipsism is sometimes expressed as the view that “I am the only mind which exists,” or “My mental states are the only mental states.” However, the sole survivor of a nuclear holocaust might truly come to believe in either of these propositions without thereby being a solipsist. Solipsism is therefore more properly regarded as the doctrine that, in principle, “existence” means for me my existence and that of my mental states. Existence is everything that I experience — physical objects, other people, events and processes — anything that would commonly be regarded as a constituent of the space and time in which I coexist with others and is necessarily construed by me as part of the content of my consciousness. For the solipsist, it is not merely the case that he believes that his thoughts, experiences, and emotions are, as a matter of contingent fact, the only thoughts, experiences, and emotions. Rather, the solipsist can attach no meaning to the supposition that there could be thoughts, experiences, and emotions other than his own. In short, the true solipsist understands the word “pain,” for example, to mean “my pain.” He cannot accordingly conceive how this word is to be applied in any sense other than this exclusively egocentric one.
No great philosopher has espoused solipsism. As a theory, if indeed it can be termed such, it is clearly very far removed from common sense. In view of this, it might reasonably be asked why the problem of solipsism should receive any philosophical attention. There are two answers to this question. First, while no great philosopher has explicitly espoused solipsism, this can be attributed to the inconsistency of much philosophical reasoning. Many philosophers have failed to accept the logical consequences of their own most fundamental commitments and preconceptions. The foundations of solipsism lie at the heart of the view that the individual gets his own psychological concepts (thinking, willing, perceiving, and so forth.) from “his own cases,” that is by abstraction from “inner experience.”
This view, or some variant of it, has been held by a great many, if not the majority of philosophers since Descartes made the egocentric search for truth the primary goal of the critical study of the nature and limits of knowledge.
In this sense, solipsism is implicit in many philosophies of knowledge and mind since Descartes and any theory of knowledge that adopts the Cartesian egocentric approach as its basic frame of reference is inherently solipsistic.
Second, solipsism merits close examination because it is based upon three widely entertained philosophical presuppositions, which are themselves of fundamental and wide-ranging importance. These are: (a) What I know most certainly are the contents of my own mind – my thoughts, experiences, affective states, and so forth.; (b) There is no conceptual or logically necessary link between the mental and the physical. For example, there is no necessary link between the occurrence of certain conscious experiences or mental states and the “possession” and behavioral dispositions of a body of a particular kind; and (c) The experiences of a given person are necessarily private to that person.
These presuppositions are of unmistakable Cartesian origin, and are widely accepted by philosophers and non-philosophers alike. In tackling the problem of solipsism, one immediately grapples with fundamental issues in the philosophy of mind. However spurious the problem of solipsism per se may strike one, these latter issues are unquestionably important. Indeed, one of the merits of the entire enterprise is the extent that it reveals a direct connection between apparently unexceptionable and certainly widely-held common sense beliefs and the acceptance of solipsistic conclusions. If this connection exists and we wish to avoid those solipsistic conclusions, we shall have no option but to revise, or at least to critically review, the beliefs from which they derive logical sustenance.
In introducing “methodic doubt” into philosophy, René Descartes created the backdrop against which solipsism subsequently developed and was made to seem, if not plausible, at least irrefutable. For the ego that is revealed by the cogito is a solitary consciousness, a res cogitans that is not spatially extended, is not necessarily located in any body, and can be assured of its own existence exclusively as a conscious mind. (Discourse on Method and the Meditations). This view of the self is intrinsically solipsistic and Descartes evades the solipsistic consequences of his method of doubt by the desperate expedient of appealing to the benevolence of God. Since God is no deceiver, he argues, and since He has created man with an innate disposition to assume the existence of an external, public world corresponding to the private world of the “ideas” that are the only immediate objects of consciousness, it follows that such a public world actually exists. (Sixth Meditation). Thus does God bridge the chasm between the solitary consciousness revealed by methodic doubt and the intersubjective world of public objects and other human beings?
A modern philosopher cannot evade solipsism under the Cartesian picture of consciousness without accepting the function attributed to God by Descartes (something few modern philosophers are willing to do). In view of this it is scarcely surprising that we should find the specter of solipsism looming ever more threateningly in the works of Descartes’ successors in the modern world, particularly in those of the British empiricist tradition.
Descartes’ account of the nature of mind implies that the individual acquires the psychological concepts that he possesses “from his own case,” that is that each individual has a unique and privileged access to his own mind, which is denied to everyone else. Although this view utilizes language and employs conceptual categories (“the individual,” “other minds,” and so forth.) that are inimical to solipsism, it is nonetheless fundamentally conducive historically to the development of solipsistic patterns of thought. On this view, what I know immediately and with greatest certainty are the events that occur in my own mind – my thoughts, my emotions, my perceptions, my desires, and so forth. – and these are not known in this way by anyone else. By the same token, it follows that I do not know other minds in the way that I know my own; indeed, if I am to be said to know other minds at all – that they exist and have a particular nature – it can only be on the basis of certain inferences that I have made from what is directly accessible to me, the behavior of other human beings.
The essentials of the Cartesian view were accepted by John Locke, the father of modern British empiricism. Rejecting Descartes’ theory that the mind possesses ideas innately at birth, Locke argued that all ideas have their origins in experience. “Reflection” (that is introspection or “inner experience”) is the sole source of psychological concepts. Without exception, such concepts have their genesis in the experience of the corresponding mental processes. (Essay Concerning Human Understanding II.i.4ff). If I acquire my psychological concepts by introspecting upon my own mental operations, then it follows that I do so independently of my knowledge of my bodily states. Any correlation that I make between the two will be effected subsequent to my acquisition of my psychological concepts. Thus, the correlation between bodily and mental stated is not a logically necessary one. I may discover, for example, that whenever I feel pain my body is injured in some way, but I can discover this factual correlation only after I have acquired the concept “pain.” It cannot therefore be part of what I mean by the word “pain” that my body should behave in a particular way.
What then of my knowledge of the minds of others? On Locke’s view there can be only one answer: since what I know directly is the existence and contents of my own mind, it follows that my knowledge of the minds of others, if I am to be said to possess such knowledge at all, has to be indirect and analogical, an inference from my own case. This is the so-called “argument from analogy” for other minds, which empiricist philosophers in particular who accept the Cartesian account of consciousness generally assume as a mechanism for avoiding solipsism. (Compare J. S. Mill, William James, Bertrand Russell, and A. J. Ayer).
Observing that the bodies of other human beings behave as my body does in similar circumstances, I can infer that the mental life and series of mental events that accompany my bodily behavior are also present in the case of others. Thus, for example, when I see a problem that I am trying unsuccessfully to solve, I feel myself becoming frustrated and observe myself acting in a particular way. In the case of another, I observe only the first and last terms of this three-term sequence and, on this basis, I infer that the “hidden” middle term, the feeling of frustration, has also occurred.
There are, however, fundamental difficulties with the argument from analogy. First, if one accepts the Cartesian account of consciousness, one must, in all consistency, accept its implications. One of these implications, as we have seen above, is that there is no logically necessary connection between the concepts of “mind” and “body;” my mind may be lodged in my body now, but this is a matter of sheer contingency. Mind need not become located in body. Its nature will not be affected in any way by the death of this body and there is no reason in principle why it should not have been located in a body radically different from a human one. By exactly the same token, any correlation that exists between bodily behavior and mental states must also be entirely contingent; there can be no conceptual connections between the contents of a mind at a given time and the nature and/or behavior of the body in which it is located at that time.
This raises the question as to how my supposed analogical inferences to other minds are to take place at all. How can I apply psychological concepts to others, if I know only that they apply to me? To take a concrete example again, if I learn what “pain” means by reference to my own case, then I will understand “pain” to mean “my pain” and the supposition that pain can be ascribed to anything other than myself will be unintelligible to me.
If the relationship between having a human body and a certain kind of mental life is as contingent as the Cartesian account of mind implies, it should be equally easy – or equally difficult – for me to conceive of a table as being in pain as it is for me to conceive of another person as being in pain. The point, of course, is that this is not so. The supposition that a table might experience pain is a totally meaningless one, whereas the ascription of pain to other human beings and animals that, in their physical characteristics and/or behavioral capabilities, resemble human beings is something which even very young children find unproblematic. (Ludwig Wittgenstein, Philosophical Investigations, I. § 284).
How is this to be accounted for? It will not do, in this context, to simply respond that a table does not have the same complex set of physical characteristics as a human body or that it is not capable of the same patterns of behavior as a human body. Because the Cartesian position implies that there is no logical connection between the mental and the physical, between the possession of a body of a particular kind and the capability for consciousness. Physical differentiation can and must be acknowledged, but it can play no role in any explanation of what it is to have a mental life.
I am surrounded by other bodies, some of which are similar to mine, and some of which are different. On Cartesian principles such similarities and such differences are irrelevant. The question as to whether it is legitimate for me to ascribe psychological predicates to entities other than myself, which the argument from analogy is designed to address, cannot hinge on the kind of body that I am confronted at a given time. Malcolm, N. (a)).
Assuming the validity of the Cartesian position, we have to infer that it makes as much or a little sense, on these premises, to attribute any psychological predicate to another human being as it does to attribute it to a table or a rock.
On these premises, it makes no sense to attribute consciousness to another human being at all. Thus on strict Cartesian principles, the argument from analogy will not do the work that is required of it to bridge the gulf between my conscious states and putative conscious states that are not mine. Ultimately, it must be confessed that on these principles I know only my own mental states and the supposition that there are mental states other than my own ceases to be intelligible to me. It is thus that solipsism comes to seem inescapable.
If the above argument is valid, it demonstrates that the acceptance of the Cartesian account of consciousness and the view that my understanding of psychological concepts derives, as do the concepts themselves, from my own case leads inexorably to solipsism. However, it may fairly be said that the argument accomplishes more than just this. It can, and should, be understood as a reductio ad absurdum refutation of these Cartesian principles. Viewed from this perspective, the argument may be paraphrased as follows:
If there is no logical connection between the physical and the mental, if the physical forms no part of the criteria that govern my ascription of psychological predicates, then I would be able to conceive of an inanimate object such as a table as having a soul and being conscious. But I cannot attach any intelligibility to the notion of an inanimate object being conscious. It follows therefore that there is a logical connection between the physical and the mental: the physical does form part of the criteria that govern my ascription of psychological words.
What then is this logical connection between the physical and the mental? This question can best be answered by reflecting, for example, on how a cartoonist might show that a particular table was angry or in pain. As indicated above, it is impossible to attach literal meaning to the assertion that a given inanimate object is angry or in pain, but clearly a certain imaginative latitude may be allowed for specific purposes and a cartoonist might conceivably want to picture a table as being angry for humorous reasons.
What is significant in this connection, however, is that to achieve this effect, the cartoonist must picture the table as having human features – the pictured table will appear angry to us only to the extent to that it possesses the natural human expression of anger. The concept of anger can find purchase in relation to the table only if it is represented as possessing something like a human form. This example demonstrates a point of quite fundamental importance: so far from being acquired by abstraction from my own case, from my own “inner” mental life, my psychological concepts are acquired in a specifically intersubjective, social, linguistic context and part of their meaning is their primary application to living human beings. To put this slightly differently, a person is a living human being and the human person in this sense functions as our paradigm of that which has a mental life; it is precisely in relation to their application to persons that we learn such concepts as “consciousness,” “pain,” “anger,” and so forth. As such, it is a necessary and antecedent condition for the ascription of psychological predicates such as these to an object that it should “possess” a body of a particular kind.
Wittgenstein articulated this point in one of the centrally important methodological tenets of the Investigations:
Only of a living human being and what resembles (behaves like) a living human being can one say: it has sensations; it sees; is blind; hears; is deaf; is conscious or unconscious. (I. § 281).
Consequently, the belief that there is something problematic about the application of psychological words to other human beings and that such applications are necessarily the products of highly fallible inferences to the “inner” mental lives of others, which require something like the argument from analogy for their justification, turns out to be fundamentally confused. The intersubjective world that we live with other human beings and the public language-system that we must master if we are to think at all are the primary data, the “proto-phenomena,” in Wittgenstein’s phrase. (I. § 654) Our psychological and non-psychological concepts alike are derived from a single linguistic fountainhead. It is precisely because the living human being functions as our paradigm of that which is conscious and has a mental life that we find the solipsistic notion that other human beings could be “automatons,” machines devoid of any conscious thought or experience, bizarre and bewildering. The idea that other persons might all in reality be “automatons” is not one which we can seriously entertain.
We are now in a position to see the essential redundancy of the argument from analogy. First, it is a misconception to think that we need any inferential argument to assure us of the existence of other minds. Such an assurance seems necessary only so long as it is assumed that each of us has to work “outwards” from the interiority of his/her own consciousness, to abstract from our own cases to the “internal” world of others. As indicated above, this assumption is fundamentally wrong – our knowledge that other human beings are conscious and our knowledge of their mental states at a given time is not inferential in nature at all, but is rather determined by the public criteria that govern the application of psychological concepts. I know that a person who behaves in a particular way – who, for example, gets red in the face, shouts, gesticulates, speaks vehemently, and so forth – is angry precisely because I have learned the concept “anger” by reference to such behavioral criteria. There is no inference involved here. I do not reason “he behaves in this way, therefore he is angry” – rather “behaving in this way” is part of what it is to be angry and it does not occur to any sane person to question whether the individual who acts in this way is conscious or has a mental life. (Investigations, I. § 303; II. iv., p. 178).
Second, because the argument from analogy treats the existence of the mental lives of other living human beings as problematic, it seeks to establish that it is legitimate to infer that other living human beings do indeed have mental lives, that each one of us may be said to be justified
in his confidence that he is surrounded by other persons rather than “automatons.” The difficulty here, however, is that the argument presupposes that I can draw an analogy between two things, myself as a person and other living human beings, that are sufficiently similar to permit the analogous comparison and sufficiently different to require it. The question must be faced, however, is how or in what respects am I different from or similar to other human beings? The answer is that I am neither. I am a living human being, as are these others. I see about me living human beings and the argument from analogy is supposed to allow me to infer that these are persons like myself. However, the truth is that I have no criterion for discriminating living human beings from persons, for the very good reason that persons are living human beings – there is no conceptual difference between the two. Since the argument acknowledges that I know living human beings directly, it thereby implicitly acknowledges that I know other persons directly, thus making itself functionally redundant. (Malcolm, N. op. cit.).
A final, frequently-encountered objection to the argument from analogy derives from the work of Strawson and Malcolm: the argument attempts to move inferentially from my supposed direct knowledge of my own mental life and “inner” states to my indirect knowledge of the mental states of others. It thus presupposes that I know what it means to assign mental states to myself without necessarily knowing what it means to ascribe them to others. This is incoherent. To speak of certain mental states as being mine in the first place is to discriminate them from mental states that are not mine and these, by definition, are the mental states of others. It follows, therefore, that in a fundamental sense the argument from analogy cannot get off the ground: one cannot know how to ascribe mental states to oneself unless one also knows what it means to ascribe mental states to others.
Plausible as this objection seems at first sight, it is (ironically, on Wittgensteinian criteria) quite mistaken. For it is not the case that when I am in pain I first identify the pain and subsequently come to recognize that it is one that I, as distinct from someone else, have. The personal pronoun “I” in the locution “I am in pain” is not the “I” of personal individuation – it does not refer to me or discriminate me as a publicly situated person as distinct from others. (The Blue Book and Brown Books, pp. 67-69; also Investigations, I. § 406). The exponent of the argument from analogy is not guilty of the charge of presupposing the very thing that he is endeavoring to demonstrate, as both Strawson and Malcolm suggest. Wittgenstein in fact considered that there is a genuine asymmetry here, in relation to the ascription of psychological predicates to oneself and to others, which is dimly perceived but misrepresented by those who feel the need of the argument from analogy. Whereas one ascribes psychological states to others by reference to bodily and behavioral criteria, one has and requires no criteria at all to self-ascribe or self-avow them. (Investigations, I. § 289-290).
Thus the exponent of the argument from analogy sees, quite correctly, that present-tense, first-person psychological assertions such as “I am in pain” differ radically from third-person psychological predicate ascriptions, but thinks of the former as descriptions of “inner” mental states to which he alone has a privileged access. This is crucially wrong. Such uses of the word “I” as occur in present-tense, first-person psychological assertions do not identify a possessor; they do not discriminate one person from amongst a group. As Wittgenstein puts it,
To say “I have pain” is no more a statement about a particular person than moaning is. (The Blue Book and Brown Books, p. 67; also Investigations, I. § 404.).
To ascribe pain to a third party, on the other hand, is to identify a concrete individual as the possessor of the pain. On this point alone Wittgenstein concurs with the exponent of the argument from analogy. However, Wittgenstein here calls attention to the fact that the asymmetry is not one that exists between the supposedly direct and certain knowledge that I have of my own mental states as distinct from the wholly inferential knowledge which, allegedly, I have of the mental states of others. Rather, the asymmetry is that the ascriptions of psychological predicates to others require criterial justificatory grounds, whereas the self-avowals or self-ascriptions of such predicates are criterionless. It thus transpires that the argument from analogy appears possible and necessary only to those who misapprehend the asymmetry between the criterial bases for third-person psychological predicate ascription and the non-criterial right for their self-ascription or self-avowal for a cognitive asymmetry between direct and indirect knowledge of mental states. The Cartesian egocentric view of the mind and of mental events that gives rise both to the specter of solipsism and attempts to evade it by means of the argument from analogy has its origins in this very misapprehension.
What then of solipsism? To what extent does the foregoing undermine it as a coherent philosophical hypothesis, albeit one in which no-one really believes? Solipsism rests upon certain presuppositions about the mind and our knowledge of mental events and processes. Two of these, the thesis that I have a privileged form of access to and knowledge of my own mind and the thesis that there is no conceptual or logically necessary link between the mental and the physical, have been dealt with above. If the foregoing is correct, both theses are false. This leaves us with the final presupposition underlying solipsism, that all experiences are necessarily (that is logically) private to the individual whose experiences they are. This thesis – which, it is fair to say, is very widely accepted – also derives from the Cartesian account of mind and generates solipsistic conclusions by suggesting that experience is something that, because of its “occult” or ephemeral nature, can never literally be shared. No two people can ever be said to have the same experience. This again introduces the problem of how one person can know the experiences of another or, more radically, how one can know that another person has experiences at all.
Wittgenstein offers a comprehensive critique of this view. He attacks the notion that experience is necessarily private. His arguments against this are complex, if highly compressed and rather oracular. (For more detailed accounts, see Kenny, A., Malcolm, N. (b), Vohra, A.).
Wittgenstein distinguishes two senses of the word “private” as it is normally used: privacy of knowledge and privacy of possession. Something is private to me in the first sense if only I can know it; it is private to me in the second sense if only I can have it. Thus the thesis that experience is necessarily private can mean one of two things, which are not always discriminated from each other with sufficient care: (a) only I can know my experiences or (b) only I can have my experiences. Wittgenstein argues that the first of these is false and the second is true in a sense that does not make experience necessarily private, as follows:
Under (a), if we take pain as an experiential exemplar, we find that the assertion “Only I can know my pains” is a conjunction of two separate theses: (i) I (can) know that I am in pain when I am in pain and (ii) other people cannot know that I am in pain when I am in pain. Thesis (i) is, literally, nonsense: it cannot be meaningfully asserted of me that I know that I am in pain. Wittgenstein’s point here is not that I do not know that I am in pain when I am in pain, but rather that the word “know” cannot be significantly employed in this way. (Investigations, I. § 246; II. xi. p. 222). This is because the verbal locution “I am in pain” is usually (though not invariably) an expression of pain – as part of acquired pain-behavior it is a linguistic substitute for such natural expressions of pain as groaning. (I. § 244). For this reason it cannot be governed by an epistemic operator. The prepositional function “I know that x” does not yield a meaningful proposition if the variable is replaced by an expression of pain, linguistic or otherwise. Thus to say that others learn of my pains only from my behavior is misleading, because it suggests that I learn of them otherwise, whereas I don’t learn of them at all – I have them. (I. § 246).
Thesis (ii) – other people cannot know that I am in pain when I am in pain – is false. If we take the word “know” is as it is normally used, then it is true to say that other people can and very frequently do know when I am in pain. Indeed, in cases where the pain is extreme, it is often impossible to prevent others from knowing this even when one wishes to do so. Thus, in certain circumstances, it would not be unusual to hear it remarked of someone, for example, that “a moan of pain escaped him” – indicating that despite his efforts, he could not but manifest his pain to others. It thus transpires that neither thesis (i) nor (ii) is true.
If we turn to (b), we find that “Only I can have my pains” expresses a truth, but it is a truth that is grammatical rather than ontological. It draws our attention to the grammatical connection between the personal pronoun “I” and the possessive “my.” However, it tells us nothing specifically about pains or other experiences, for it remains true if we replace the word “pains” with many other plural nouns (e.g. “Only I can have my blushes”). Another person can have the same pain as me. If our pains have the same phenomenal characteristics and corresponding locations, we will quite correctly be said to have “the same pain.” This is what the expression “the same pain” means. Another person, however, cannot have my pains. My pains are the ones that, if they are expressed at all, are expressed by me. But by exactly the same (grammatical) token, another person cannot have my blushes, sneezes, frowns, fears, and so forth., and none of this can be taken as adding to our stockpile of metaphysical truths. It is true that I may deliberately and successfully keep an experience to myself, in which case that particular experience might be said to be private to me. But I might do this by articulating it in a language that those with whom I was conversing do not understand. There is clearly nothing occult or mysterious about this kind of privacy. (Investigations, II. xi, p. 222). Similarly, experience that I do not or cannot keep to myself is not private. In short, some experiences are private and some are not. Even though some experiences are private in this sense, it does not follow that all experiences could be private. As Wittgenstein points out, “What sometimes happens could always happen” is a fallacy. It does not follow from the fact that some orders are not obeyed that all orders might never be obeyed. For in that case the concept “order” would become incapable of instantiation and would lose its significance. (I. § 345).
With the belief in the essential privacy of experience eliminated as false, the last presupposition underlying solipsism is removed and solipsism is shown as foundationless, in theory and in fact. One might even say, solipsism is necessarily foundationless, for to make an appeal to logical rules or empirical evidence the solipsist would implicitly have to affirm the very thing that he purportedly refuses to believe: the reality of intersubjectively valid criteria and a public, extra-mental world. There is a temptation to say that solipsism is a false philosophical theory, but this is not quite strong or accurate enough. As a theory, it is incoherent. What makes it incoherent, above all else, is that the solipsist requires a language (that is a sign-system) to think or to affirm his solipsistic thoughts at all. Given this, it is scarcely surprising that those philosophers who accept the Cartesian premises that make solipsism apparently plausible, if not inescapable, have also invariably assumed that language-usage is itself essentially private. The cluster of arguments – generally referred to as “the private language argument” – that we find in the Investigations against this assumption effectively administers the coup de grâce to both Cartesian dualism and solipsism. (I. § 202; 242-315). Language is an irreducibly public form of life that is encountered in specifically social contexts. Each natural language-system contains an indefinitely large number of “language-games,” governed by rules that, though conventional, are not arbitrary personal fiats. The meaning of a word is its (publicly accessible) use in a language. To question, argue, or doubt is to utilize language in a particular way. It is to play a particular kind of public language-game. The proposition “I am the only mind that exists” makes sense only to the extent that it is expressed in a public language, and the existence of such language itself implies the existence of a social context. Such a context exists for the hypothetical last survivor of a nuclear holocaust, but not for the solipsist. A non-linguistic solipsism is unthinkable and a thinkable solipsism is necessarily linguistic. Solipsism therefore presupposes the very thing that it seeks to deny. That solipsistic thoughts are thinkable in the first instance implies the existence of the public, shared, intersubjective world that they purport to call into question.
Stephen P. Thornton
University of Limerick
Last updated: October 24, 2004 | Originally published: