The sophists were itinerant professional teachers and intellectuals who frequented Athens and other Greek cities in the second half of the fifth century B.C.E. In return for a fee, the sophists offered young wealthy Greek men an education in aretē (virtue or excellence), thereby attaining wealth and fame while also arousing significant antipathy. Prior to the fifth century B.C.E., aretē was predominately associated with aristocratic warrior virtues such as courage and physical strength. In democratic Athens of the latter fifth century B.C.E., however, aretē was increasingly understood in terms of the ability to influence one’s fellow citizens in political gatherings through rhetorical persuasion; the sophistic education both grew out of and exploited this shift. The most famous representatives of the sophistic movement are Protagoras, Gorgias, Antiphon, Hippias, Prodicus and Thrasymachus.
The historical and philological difficulties confronting an interpretation of the sophists are significant. Only a handful of sophistic texts have survived and most of what we know of the sophists is drawn from second-hand testimony, fragments and the generally hostile depiction of them in Plato’s dialogues.
The philosophical problem of the nature of sophistry is arguably even more formidable. Due in large part to the influence of Plato and Aristotle, the term sophistry has come to signify the deliberate use of fallacious reasoning, intellectual charlatanism and moral unscrupulousness. It is, as the article explains, an oversimplification to think of the historical sophists in these terms because they made genuine and original contributions to Western thought. Plato and Aristotle nonetheless established their view of what constitutes legitimate philosophy in part by distinguishing their own activity – and that of Socrates – from the sophists. If one is so inclined, sophistry can thus be regarded, in a conceptual as well as historical sense, as the ‘other’ of philosophy.
Perhaps because of the interpretative difficulties mentioned above, the sophists have been many things to many people. For Hegel (1995/1840) the sophists were subjectivists whose sceptical reaction to the objective dogmatism of the presocratics was synthesised in the work of Plato and Aristotle. For the utilitarian English classicist George Grote (1904), the sophists were progressive thinkers who placed in question the prevailing morality of their time. More recent work by French theorists such as Jacques Derrida (1981) and Jean Francois-Lyotard (1985) suggests affinities between the sophists and postmodernism.
This article provides a broad overview of the sophists, and indicates some of the central philosophical issues raised by their work. Section 1 discusses the meaning of the term sophist. Section 2 surveys the individual contributions of the most famous sophists. Section 3 examines three themes that have often been taken as characteristic of sophistic thought: the distinction between nature and convention, relativism about knowledge and truth and the power of speech. Finally, section 4 analyses attempts by Plato and others to establish a clear demarcation between philosophy and sophistry.
The term sophist (sophistēs) derives from the Greek words for wisdom (sophia) and wise (sophos). Since Homer at least, these terms had a wide range of application, extending from practical know-how and prudence in public affairs to poetic ability and theoretical knowledge. Notably, the term sophia could be used to describe disingenuous cleverness long before the rise of the sophistic movement. Theognis, for example, writing in the sixth century B.C.E., counsels Cyrnos to accommodate his discourse to different companions, because such cleverness (sophiē) is superior to even a great excellence (Elegiac Poems, 1072, 213).
In the fifth century B.C.E. the term sophistēs was still broadly applied to ‘wise men’, including poets such as Homer and Hesiod, the Seven Sages, the Ionian ‘physicists’ and a variety of seers and prophets. The narrower use of the term to refer to professional teachers of virtue or excellence (aretē) became prevalent in the second half of the fifth century B.C.E., although this should not be taken to imply the presence of a clear distinction between philosophers, such as Socrates, and sophists, such as Protagoras, Gorgias and Prodicus. This much is evident from Aristophanes’ play The Clouds (423 B.C.E.), in which Socrates is depicted as a sophist and Prodicus praised for his wisdom.
Aristophanes’ play is a good starting point for understanding Athenian attitudes towards sophists. The Clouds depicts the tribulations of Strepsiades, an elderly Athenian citizen with significant debts. Deciding that the best way to discharge his debts is to defeat his creditors in court, he attends The Thinkery, an institute of higher education headed up by the sophist Socrates. When he fails to learn the art of speaking in The Thinkery, Strepsiades persuades his initially reluctant son, Pheidippides, to accompany him. Here they encounter two associates of Socrates, the Stronger and the Weaker Arguments, who represent lives of justice and self-discipline and injustice and self-indulgence respectively. On the basis of a popular vote, the Weaker Argument prevails and leads Pheidippides into The Thinkery for an education in how to make the weaker argument defeat the stronger. Strepsiades later revisits The Thinkery and finds that Socrates has turned his son into a pale and useless intellectual. When Pheidippides graduates, he subsequently prevails not only over Strepsiades’ creditors, but also beats his father and offers a persuasive rhetorical justification for the act. As Pheidippides prepares to beat his mother, Strepsiades’ indignation motivates him to lead a violent mob attack on The Thinkery.
Aristophanes’ depiction of Socrates the sophist is revealing on at least three levels. In the first instance, it demonstrates that the distinction between Socrates and his sophistic counterparts was far from clear to their contemporaries. Although Socrates did not charge fees and frequently asserted that all he knew was that he was ignorant of most matters, his association with the sophists reflects both the indeterminacy of the term sophist and the difficulty, at least for the everyday Athenian citizen, of distinguishing his methods from theirs. Secondly, Aristophanes’ depiction suggests that the sophistic education reflected a decline from the heroic Athens of earlier generations. Thirdly, the attribution to the sophists of intellectual deviousness and moral dubiousness predates Plato and Aristotle.
Hostility towards sophists was a significant factor in the decision of the Athenian dēmos to condemn Socrates to the death penalty for impiety. Anytus, who was one of Socrates’ accusers at his trial, was clearly unconcerned with details such as that the man he accused did not claim to teach aretē or extract fees for so doing. He is depicted by Plato as suggesting that sophists are the ruin of all those who come into contact with them and as advocating their expulsion from the city (Meno, 91c-92c). Equally as revealing, in terms of attitudes towards the sophists, is Socrates’ discussion with Hippocrates, a wealthy young Athenian keen to become a pupil of Protagoras (Protagoras, 312a). Hippocrates is so eager to meet Protagoras that he wakes Socrates in the early hours of the morning, yet later concedes that he himself would be ashamed to be known as a sophist by his fellow citizens.
Plato depicts Protagoras as well aware of the hostility and resentment engendered by his profession (Protagoras, 316c-e). It is not surprising, Protagoras suggests, that foreigners who profess to be wise and persuade the wealthy youth of powerful cities to forsake their family and friends and consort with them would arouse suspicion. Indeed, Protagoras claims that the sophistic art is an ancient one, but that sophists of old, including poets such as Homer, Hesiod and Simonides, prophets, seers and even physical trainers, deliberately did not adopt the name for fear of persecution. Protagoras says that while he has adopted a strategy of openly professing to be a sophist, he has taken other precautions – perhaps including his association with the Athenian general Pericles – in order to secure his safety.
The low standing of the sophists in Athenian public opinion does not stem from a single source. No doubt suspicion of intellectuals among the many was a factor. New money and democratic decision-making, however, also constituted a threat to the conservative Athenian aristocratic establishment. This threatening social change is reflected in the attitudes towards the concept of excellence or virtue (aretē) alluded to in the summary above. Whereas in the Homeric epics aretē generally denotes the strength and courage of a real man, in the second half of the fifth century B.C.E. it increasingly became associated with success in public affairs through rhetorical persuasion.
In the context of Athenian political life of the late fifth century B.C.E. the importance of skill in persuasive speech, or rhetoric, cannot be underestimated. The development of democracy made mastery of the spoken word not only a precondition of political success but also indispensable as a form of self-defence in the event that one was subject to a lawsuit. The sophists accordingly answered a growing need among the young and ambitious. Meno, an ambitious pupil of Gorgias, says that the aretē – and hence function – of a man is to rule over people, that is, manage his public affairs so as to benefit his friends and harm his enemies (73c-d). This is a long-standing ideal, but one best realised in democratic Athens through rhetoric. Rhetoric was thus the core of the sophistic education (Protagoras, 318e), even if most sophists professed to teach a broader range of subjects.
Suspicion towards the sophists was also informed by their departure from the aristocratic model of education (paideia). Since Homeric Greece, paideia had been the preoccupation of the ruling nobles and was based around a set of moral precepts befitting an aristocratic warrior class. The business model of the sophists presupposed that aretē could be taught to all free citizens, a claim that Protagoras implicitly defends in his great speech regarding the origins of justice. The sophists were thus a threat to the status quo because they made an indiscriminate promise – assuming capacity to pay fees – to provide the young and ambitious with the power to prevail in public life.
One could therefore loosely define sophists as paid teachers of aretē, where the latter is understood in terms of the capacity to attain and exercise political power through persuasive speech. This is only a starting point, however, and the broad and significant intellectual achievement of the sophists, which we will consider in the following two sections, has led some to ask whether it is possible or desirable to attribute them with a unique method or outlook that would serve as a unifying characteristic while also differentiating them from philosophers.
Scholarship in the nineteenth century and beyond has often fastened on method as a way of differentiating Socrates from the sophists. For Henry Sidgwick (1872, 288-307), for example, whereas Socrates employed a question-and-answer method in search of the truth, the sophists gave long epideictic or display speeches for the purposes of persuasion. It seems difficult to maintain a clear methodical differentiation on this basis, given that Gorgias and Protagoras both claimed proficiency in short speeches and that Socrates engages in long eloquent speeches – many in mythical form – throughout the Platonic dialogues. It is moreover simply misleading to say that the sophists were in all cases unconcerned with truth, as to assert the relativity of truth is itself to make a truth claim. A further consideration is that Socrates is guilty of fallacious reasoning in many of the Platonic dialogues, although this point is less relevant if we assume that Socrates’ logical errors are unintentional.
G.B. Kerferd (1981a) has proposed a more nuanced set of methodological criteria to differentiate Socrates from the sophists. According to Kerferd, the sophists employed eristic and antilogical methods of argument, whereas Socrates disdained the former and saw the latter as a necessary but incomplete step on the way towards dialectic. Plato uses the term eristic to denote the practice – it is not strictly speaking a method – of seeking victory in argument without regard for the truth. We find a representation of eristic techniques in Plato’s dialogue Euthydemus, where the brothers Euthydemus and Dionysiodorous deliberately use egregiously fallacious arguments for the purpose of contradicting and prevailing over their opponent. Antilogic is the method of proceeding from a given argument, usually that offered by an opponent, towards the establishment of a contrary or contradictory argument in such a way that the opponent must either abandon his first position or accept both positions. This method of argumentation was employed by most of the sophists, and examples are found in the works of Protagoras and Antiphon.
Kerferd’s claim that we can distinguish between philosophy and sophistry by appealing to dialectic remains problematic, however. In what are usually taken to be the “early” Platonic dialogues, we find Socrates’ employing a dialectical method of refutation referred to as the elenchus. As Nehamas has argued (1990), while the elenchus is distinguishable from eristic because of its concern with the truth, it is harder to differentiate from antilogic because its success is always dependent upon the capacity of interlocutors to defend themselves against refutation in a particular case. In Plato’s “middle” and “later” dialogues, on the other hand, according to Nehamas’ interpretation, Plato associates dialectic with knowledge of the forms, but this seemingly involves an epistemological and metaphysical commitment to a transcendent ontology that most philosophers, then and now, would be reluctant to uphold.
More recent attempts to explain what differentiates philosophy from sophistry have accordingly tended to focus on a difference in moral purpose or in terms of choices for different ways way of life, as Aristotle elegantly puts it (Metaphysics IV, 2, 1004b24-5). Section 4 will return to the question of whether this is the best way to think about the distinction between philosophy and sophistry. Before this, however, it is useful to sketch the biographies and interests of the most prominent sophists and also consider some common themes in their thought.
Protagoras of Abdera (c. 490-420 B.C.E.) was the most prominent member of the sophistic movement and Plato reports he was the first to charge fees using that title (Protagoras, 349a). Despite his animus towards the sophists, Plato depicts Protagoras as quite a sympathetic and dignified figure.
One of the more intriguing aspects of Protagoras’ life and work is his association with the great Athenian general and statesman Pericles (c. 495-429 B.C.E.). Pericles, who was the most influential statesman in Athens for more than 30 years, including the first two years of the Peloponnesian War, seems to have held a high regard for philosophers and sophists, and Protagoras in particular, entrusting him with the role of drafting laws for the Athenian foundation city of Thurii in 444 B.C.E.
From a philosophical perspective, Protagoras is most famous for his relativistic account of truth – in particular the claim that ‘man is the measure of all things’ – and his agnosticism concerning the Gods. The first topic will be discussed in section 3b. Protagoras’ agnosticism is famously articulated in the claim that ‘concerning the gods I am not in a position to know either that (or how) they are or that (or how) they are not, or what they are like in appearance; for there are many things that prevent knowledge, the obscurity of the matter and the brevity of human life’ (DK, 80B4). This seems to express a form of religious agnosticism not completely foreign to educated Athenian opinion. Despite this, according to tradition, Protagoras was convicted of impiety towards the end of his life. As a consequence, so the story goes, his books were burnt and he drowned at sea while departing Athens. It is perhaps significant in this context that Protagoras seems to have been the source of the sophistic claim to ‘make the weaker argument defeat the stronger’ parodied by Aristophanes.
Plato suggests that Protagoras sought to differ his educational offering from that of other sophists, such as Hippias, by concentrating upon instruction in aretē in the sense of political virtue rather than specialised studies such as astronomy and mathematics (Protagoras, 318e).
Apart from his works Truth and On the Gods, which deal with his relativistic account of truth and agnosticism respectively, Diogenes Laertius says that Protagoras wrote the following books: Antilogies, Art of Eristics, Imperative, On Ambition, On Incorrect Human Actions, On those in Hades, On Sciences, On Virtues, On Wrestling, On the Original State of Things and Trial over a Fee.
Gorgias of Leontini (c.485 – c.390 B.C.E.) is generally considered as a member of the sophistic movement, despite his disavowal of the capacity to teach aretē (Meno, 96c). The major focus of Gorgias was rhetoric and given the importance of persuasive speaking to the sophistic education, and his acceptance of fees, it is appropriate to consider him alongside other famous sophists for present purposes.
Gorgias visited Athens in 427 B.C.E. as the leader of an embassy from Leontini with the successful intention of persuading the Athenians to make an alliance against Syracuse. He travelled extensively around Greece, earning large sums of money by giving lessons in rhetoric and epideictic speeches.
Plato’s Gorgias depicts the rhetorician as something of a celebrity, who either does not have well thought out views on the implications of his expertise, or is reluctant to share them, and who denies his responsibility for the unjust use of rhetorical skill by errant students. Although Gorgias presents himself as moderately upstanding, the dramatic structure of Plato’s dialogue suggests that the defence of injustice by Polus and the appeal to the natural right of the stronger by Callicles are partly grounded in the conceptual presuppositions of Gorgianic rhetoric.
Gorgias’ original contribution to philosophy is sometimes disputed, but the fragments of his works On Not Being or Nature and Helen – discussed in detail in section 3c – feature intriguing claims concerning the power of rhetorical speech and a style of argumentation reminiscent of Parmenides and Zeno. Gorgias is also credited with other orations and encomia and a technical treatise on rhetoric titled At the Right Moment in Time.
The biographical details surrounding Antiphon the sophist (c. 470-411 B.C.) are unclear – one unresolved issue is whether he should be identified with Antiphon of Rhamnus (a statesman and teacher of rhetoric who was a member of the oligarchy which held power in Athens briefly in 411 B.C.E.). However, since the publication of fragments from his On Truth in the early twentieth century he has been regarded as a major representative of the sophistic movement.
On Truth, which features a range of positions and counterpositions on the relationship between nature and convention (see section 3a below), is sometimes considered an important text in the history of political thought because of its alleged advocacy of egalitarianism:
Those born of illustrious fathers we respect and honour, whereas those who come from an undistinguished house we neither respect nor honour. In this we behave like barbarians towards one another. For by nature we all equally, both barbarians and Greeks, have an entirely similar origin: for it is fitting to fulfil the natural satisfactions which are necessary to all men: all have the ability to fulfil these in the same way, and in all this none of us is different either as barbarian or as Greek; for we all breathe into the air with mouth and nostrils and we all eat with the hands (quoted in Untersteiner, 1954).
Whether this statement should be taken as expressing the actual views of Antiphon, or rather as part of an antilogical presentation of opposing views on justice remains an open question, as does whether such a position rules out the identification of Antiphon the sophist with the oligarchical Antiphon of Rhamnus.
The exact dates for Hippias of Elis are unknown, but scholars generally assume that he lived during the same period as Protagoras. Whereas Plato’s depictions of Protagoras – and to a lesser extent Gorgias – indicate a modicum of respect, he presents Hippias as a comic figure who is obsessed with money, pompous and confused.
Hippias is best known for his polymathy (DK 86A14). His areas of expertise seem to have included astronomy, grammar, history, mathematics, music, poetry, prose, rhetoric, painting and sculpture. Like Gorgias and Prodicus, he served as an ambassador for his home city. His work as a historian, which included compiling lists of Olympic victors, was invaluable to Thucydides and subsequent historians as it allowed for a more precise dating of past events. In mathematics he is attributed with the discovery of a curve – the quadratrix – used to trisect an angle.
In terms of his philosophical contribution, Kerferd has suggested, on the basis of Plato’s Hippias Major (301d-302b), that Hippias advocated a theory that classes or kinds of thing are dependent on a being that traverses them. It is hard to make much sense of this alleged doctrine on the basis of available evidence. As suggested above, Plato depicts Hippias as philosophically shallow and unable to keep up with Socrates in dialectical discussion.
Prodicus of Ceos, who lived during roughly the same period as Protagoras and Hippias, is best known for his subtle distinctions between the meanings of words. He is thought to have written a treatise titled On the Correctness of Names.
Plato gives an amusing account of Prodicus’ method in the following passage of the Protagoras:
Prodicus spoke up next: … ‘those who attend discussions such as this ought to listen impartially, but not equally, to both interlocutors. There is a distinction here. We ought to listen impartially but not divide our attention equally: More should go to the wiser speaker and less to the more unlearned … In this way our meeting would take a most attractive turn, for you, the speakers, would then most surely earn the respect, rather than the praise, of those listening to you. For respect is guilelessly inherent in the souls of listeners, but praise is all too often merely a deceitful verbal expression. And then, too, we, your audience, would be most cheered, but not pleased, for to be cheered is to learn something, to participate in some intellectual activity; but to be pleased has to do with eating or experiencing some other pleasure in the body’ (337a-c).
Prodicus’ epideictic speech, The Choice of Heracles, was singled out for praise by Xenophon (Memorabilia, II.1.21-34) and in addition to his private teaching he seems to have served as an ambassador for Ceos (the birthplace of Simonides) on several occasions.
Socrates, although perhaps with some degree of irony, was fond of calling himself a pupil of Prodicus (Protagoras, 341a; Meno, 96d).
Thrasymachus was a well-known rhetorician in Athens in the latter part of the fifth century B.C.E., but our only surviving record of his views is contained in Plato’s Cleitophon and Book One of The Republic. He is depicted as brash and aggressive, with views on the nature of justice that will be examined in section 3a.
The distinction between physis (nature) and nomos (custom, law, convention) was a central theme in Greek thought in the second half of the fifth century B.C.E. and is especially important for understanding the work of the sophists. Before turning to sophistic considerations of these concepts and the distinction between them, it is worth sketching the meaning of the Greek terms.
Aristotle defines physis as ‘the substance of things which have in themselves as such a source of movement’ (Metaphysics, 1015a13-15). The term physis is closely connected with the Greek verb to grow (phuō) and the dynamic aspect of physis reflects the view that the nature of things is found in their origins and internal principles of change. Some of the Ionian thinkers now referred to as presocratics, including Thales and Heraclitus, used the term physis for reality as a whole, or at least its underlying material constituents, referring to the investigation of nature in this context as historia (inquiry) rather than philosophy.
The term nomos refers to a wide range of normative concepts extending from customs and conventions to positive law. It would be misleading to regard the term as referring only to arbitrary human conventions, as Heraclitus’ appeal to the distinction between human nomoi and the one divine nomos (DK 22B2 and 114) makes clear. Nonetheless, increased travel, as exemplified by the histories of Herodotus, led to a greater understanding of the wide array of customs, conventions and laws among communities in the ancient world. This recognition sets up the possibility of a dichotomy between what is unchanging and according to nature and what is merely a product of arbitrary human convention.
The dichotomy between physis and nomos seems to have been something of a commonplace of sophistic thought and was appealed to by Protagoras and Hippias among others. Perhaps the most instructive sophistic account of the distinction, however, is found in Antiphon’s fragment On Truth.
Antiphon applies the distinction to notions of justice and injustice, arguing that the majority of things which are considered just according to nomos are in direct conflict with nature and hence not truly or naturally just (DK 87 A44). The basic thrust of Antiphon’s argument is that laws and conventions are designed as a constraint upon our natural pursuit of pleasure. In a passage suggestive of the discussion on justice early in Plato’s Republic, Antiphon also asserts that one should employ justice to one’s advantage by regarding the laws as important when witnesses are present, but disregarding them when one can get away with it. Although these arguments may be construed as part of an antilogical exercise on nature and convention rather than prescriptions for a life of prudent immorality, they are consistent with views on the relation between human nature and justice suggested by Plato’s depiction of Callicles and Thrasymachus in the Gorgias and Republic respectively.
Callicles, a young Athenian aristocrat who may be a real historical figure or a creation of Plato’s imagination, was not a sophist; indeed he expresses disdain for them (Gorgias, 520a). His account of the relation between physis and nomos nonetheless owes a debt to sophistic thought. According to Callicles, Socrates’ arguments in favour of the claim that it is better to suffer injustice than to commit injustice trade on a deliberate ambiguity in the term justice. Callicles argues that conventional justice is a kind of slave morality imposed by the many to constrain the desires of the superior few. What is just according to nature, by contrast, is seen by observing animals in nature and relations between political communities where it can be seen that the strong prevail over the weak. Callicles himself takes this argument in the direction of a vulgar sensual hedonism motivated by the desire to have more than others (pleonexia), but sensual hedonism as such does not seem to be a necessary consequence of his account of natural justice.
Although the sophist Thrasymachus does not employ the physis/nomos distinction in Book One of the Republic, his account of justice (338d-354c) belongs within a similar conceptual framework. Like Callicles, Thrasymachus accuses Socrates of deliberate deception in his arguments, particularly in the claim the art of justice consists in a ruler looking after their subjects. According to Thrasymachus, we do better to think of the ruler/ruled relation in terms of a shepherd looking after his flock with a view to its eventual demise. Justice in conventional terms is simply a naive concern for the advantage of another. From another more natural perspective, justice is the rule of the stronger, insofar as rulers establish laws which persuade the multitude that it is just for them to obey what is to the advantage of the ruling few
An alternative, and more edifying, account of the relation between physis and nomos is found in Protagoras’ great speech (Protagoras, 320c-328d). According to Protagoras’ myth, man was originally set forth by the gods into a violent state of nature reminiscent of that later described by Hobbes. Our condition improved when Zeus bestowed us with shame and justice; these enabled us to develop the skill of politics and hence civilized communal relations and virtue. Apart from supporting his argument that aretē can be taught, this account suggests a defence of nomos on the grounds that nature by itself is insufficient for the flourishing of man considered as a political animal.
The primary source on sophistic relativism about knowledge and/or truth is Protagoras’ famous ‘man is the measure’ statement. Interpretation of Protagoras’ thesis has always been a matter of controversy. Caution is needed in particular against the temptation to read modern epistemological concerns into Protagoras’ account and sophistic teaching on the relativity of truth more generally.
Protagoras measure thesis is as follows:
A human being is the measure of all things, of those things that are, that they are, and of those things that are not, that they are not (DK, 80B1).
There is near scholarly consensus that Protagoras is referring here to each human being as the measure of what is rather than ‘humankind’ as such, although the Greek term for ‘human’ –hōanthrōpos– certainly does not rule out the second interpretation. Plato’s Theaetetus (152a), however, suggests the first reading and I will assume its correctness here. On this reading we can regard Protagoras as asserting that if the wind, for example, feels (or seems) cold to me and feels (or seems) warm to you, then the wind is cold for me and is warm for you.
Another interpretative issue concerns whether we should construe Protagoras’ statement as primarily ontological or epistemological in intent. Scholarship by Kahn, Owen and Kerferd among others suggests that, while the Greeks lacked a clear distinction between existential and predicative uses of ‘to be’, they tended to treat existential uses as short for predicative uses.
Having sketched some of the interpretative difficulties surrounding Protagoras’ statement, we are still left with at least three possible readings (Kerferd, 1981a, 86). Protagoras could be asserting that (i) there is no mind-independent wind at all, but merely private subjective winds (ii) there is a wind that exists independently of my perception of it, but it is in itself neither cold nor warm as these qualities are private (iii) there is a wind that exists independently of my perception of it and this is both cold and warm insofar as two qualities can inhere in the same mind-independent ‘entity’.
All three interpretations are live options, with (i) perhaps the least plausible. Whatever the exact import of Protagoras’ relativism, however, the following passage from the Theaetetus suggests that it was also extended to the political and ethical realm:
Whatever in any particular city is considered just and admirable is just and admirable in that city, for so long as the convention remains in place (167c).
One difficulty this passage raises is that while Protagoras asserted that all beliefs are equally true, he also maintained that some are superior to others because they are more subjectively fulfilling for those who hold them. Protagoras thus seems to want it both ways, insofar as he removes an objective criterion of truth while also asserting that some subjective states are better than others. His appeal to better and worse beliefs could, however, be taken to refer to the persuasiveness and pleasure induced by certain beliefs and speeches rather than their objective truth.
The other major source for sophistic relativism is the Dissoi Logoi, an undated and anonymous example of Protagorean antilogic. In the Dissoi Logoi we find competing arguments on five theses, including whether the good and the bad are the same or different, and a series of examples of the relativity of different cultural practices and laws. Overall the Dissoi Logoi can be taken to uphold not only the relativity of truth but also what Barney (2006, 89) has called the variability thesis: whatever is good in some qualified way is also bad in another respect and the same is the case for a wide range of contrary predicates.
Understandably given their educational program, the sophists placed great emphasis upon the power of speech (logos). Logos is a notoriously difficult term to translate and can refer to thought and that about which we speak and think as well as rational speech or language. The sophists were interested in particular with the role of human discourse in the shaping of reality. Rhetoric was the centrepiece of the curriculum, but literary interpretation of the work of poets was also a staple of sophistic education. Some philosophical implications of the sophistic concern with speech are considered in section 4, but in the current section it is instructive to concentrate on Gorgias’ account of the power of rhetorical logos.
The extant fragments attributed to the historical Gorgias indicate not only scepticism towards essential being and our epistemic access to this putative realm, but an assertion of the omnipotence of persuasive logos to make the natural and practical world conform to human desires. Reporting upon Gorgias’ speech About the Nonexistent or on Nature, Sextus says that the rhetorician, while adopting a different approach from that of Protagoras, also eliminated the criterion (DK, 82B3). The elimination of the criterion refers to the rejection of a standard that would enable us to distinguish clearly between knowledge and opinion about being and nature. Whereas Protagoras asserted that man is the measure of all things, Gorgias concentrated upon the status of truth about being and nature as a discursive construction.
About the Nonexistent or on Nature transgresses the injunction of Parmenides that one cannot say of what is that it is not. Employing a series of conditional arguments in the manner of Zeno, Gorgias asserts that nothing exists, that if it did exist it could not be apprehended, and if it was apprehended it could not be articulated in logos. The elaborate parody displays the paradoxical character of attempts to disclose the true nature of beings through logos:
For that by which we reveal is logos, but logos is not substances and existing things. Therefore we do not reveal existing things to our comrades, but logos, which is something other than substances (DK, 82B3)
Even if knowledge of beings was possible, its transmission in logos would always be distorted by the rift between substances and our apprehension and communication of them. Gorgias also suggests, even more provocatively, that insofar as speech is the medium by which humans articulate their experience of the world, logos is not evocative of the external, but rather the external is what reveals logos. An understanding of logos about nature as constitutive rather than descriptive here supports the assertion of the omnipotence of rhetorical expertise. Gorgias’ account suggests there is no knowledge of nature sub specie aeternitatis and our grasp of reality is always mediated by discursive interpretations, which, in turn, implies that truth cannot be separated from human interests and power claims.
In the Encomium to Helen Gorgias refers to logos as a powerful master (DK, 82B11). If humans had knowledge of the past, present or future they would not be compelled to adopt unpredictable opinion as their counsellor. The endless contention of astronomers, politicians and philosophers is taken to demonstrate that no logos is definitive. Human ignorance about non-existent truth can thus be exploited by rhetorical persuasion insofar as humans desire the illusion of certainty imparted by the spoken word:
The effect of logos upon the condition of the soul is comparable to the power of drugs over the nature of bodies. For just as different drugs dispel different secretions from the body, and some bring an end to disease and others to life, so also in the case of logoi, some distress, others delight, some cause fear, others make hearers bold, and some drug and bewitch the soul with a kind of evil persuasion (DK, 82B11).
All who have persuaded people, Gorgias says, do so by moulding a false logos. While other forms of power require force, logos makes all its willing slave.
This account of the relation between persuasive speech, knowledge, opinion and reality is broadly consistent with Plato’s depiction of the rhetorician in the Gorgias. Both Protagoras’ relativism and Gorgias’ account of the omnipotence of logos are suggestive of what we moderns might call a deflationary epistemic anti-realism.
The distinction between philosophy and sophistry is in itself a difficult philosophical problem. This closing section examines the attempt of Plato to establish a clear line of demarcation between philosophy and sophistry.
As alluded to above, the terms ‘philosopher’ and ‘sophist’ were disputed in the fifth and fourth century B.C.E., the subject of contention between rival schools of thought. Histories of philosophy tend to begin with the Ionian ‘physicist’ Thales, but the presocratics referred to the activity they were engaged in as historia (inquiry) rather than philosophia and although it may have some validity as a historical projection, the notion that philosophy begins with Thales derives from the mid nineteenth century. It was Plato who first clearly and consistently refers to the activity of philosophia and much of what he has to say is best understood in terms of an explicit or implicit contrast with the rival schools of the sophists and Isocrates (who also claimed the title philosophia for his rhetorical educational program).
The related questions as to what a sophist is and how we can distinguish the philosopher from the sophist were taken very seriously by Plato. He also acknowledges the difficulty inherent in the pursuit of these questions and it is perhaps revealing that the dialogue dedicated to the task, Sophist, culminates in a discussion about the being of non-being. Socrates converses with sophists in Euthydemus, Hippias Major, Hippias Minor, Gorgias, Protagoras and the Republic and discusses sophists at length in the Apology, Sophist, Statesman and Theaetetus. It can thus be argued that the search for the sophist and distinction between philosophy and sophistry are not only central themes in the Platonic dialogues, but constitutive of the very idea and practice of philosophy, at least in its original sense as articulated by Plato.
This point has been recognised by recent poststructuralist thinkers such as Jacques Derrida and Jean Francois-Lyotard in the context of their project to place in question central presuppositions of the Western philosophical tradition deriving from Plato. Derrida attacks the interminable trial prosecuted by Plato against the sophists with a view to exhuming ‘the conceptual monuments marking out the battle lines between philosophy and sophistry’ (1981, 106). Lyotard views the sophists as in possession of unique insight into the sense in which discourses about what is just cannot transcend the realm of opinion and pragmatic language games (1985, 73-83).
The prospects for establishing a clear methodological divide between philosophy and sophistry are poor. Apart from the considerations mentioned in section 1, it would be misleading to say that the sophists were unconcerned with truth or genuine theoretical investigation and Socrates is clearly guilty of fallacious reasoning in many of the Platonic dialogues. In the Sophist, in fact, Plato implies that the Socratic technique of dialectical refutation represents a kind of ‘noble sophistry’ (Sophist, 231b).
This in large part explains why contemporary scholarship on the distinction between philosophy and sophistry has tended to focus on a difference in moral character. Nehamas, for example, has argued that ‘Socrates did not differ from the sophists in method but in overall purpose’ (1990, 13). Nehamas relates this overall purpose to the Socratic elenchus, suggesting that Socrates’ disavowal of knowledge and of the capacity to teach aretē distances him from the sophists. However, this way of demarcating Socrates’ practice from that of his sophistic counterparts, Nehamas argues, cannot justify the later Platonic distinction between philosophy and sophistry, insofar as Plato forfeited the right to uphold the distinction once he developed a substantive philosophical teaching, that is, the theory of forms.
There is no doubt much truth in the claim that Plato and Aristotle depict the philosopher as pursuing a different way of life than the sophist, but to say that Plato defines the philosopher either through a difference in moral purpose, as in the case of Socrates, or a metaphysical presumption regarding the existence of transcendent forms, as in his later work, does not in itself adequately characterise Plato’s critique of his sophistic contemporaries. Once we attend to Plato’s own treatment of the distinction between philosophy and sophistry two themes quickly become clear: the mercenary character of the sophists and their overestimation of the power of speech. For Plato, at least, these two aspects of the sophistic education tell us something about the persona of the sophist as the embodiment of a distinctive attitude towards knowledge.
The fact that the sophists taught for profit may not seem objectionable to modern readers; most present-day university professors would be reluctant to teach pro bono. It is clearly a major issue for Plato, however. Plato can barely mention the sophists without contemptuous reference to the mercenary aspect of their trade: particularly revealing examples of Plato’s disdain for sophistic money-making and avarice are found at Apology 19d, Euthydemus 304b-c, Hippias Major 282b-e, Protagoras 312c-d and Sophist 222d-224d, and this is not an exhaustive list. Part of the issue here is no doubt Plato’s commitment to a way of life dedicated to knowledge and contemplation. It is significant that students in the Academy, arguably the first higher education institution, were not required to pay fees. This is only part of the story, however.
A good starting point is to consider the etymology of the term philosophia as suggested by the Phaedrus and Symposium. After completing his palinode in the Phaedrus, Socrates expresses the hope that he never be deprived of his ‘erotic’ art. Whereas the speechwriter Lysias presents erōs (desire, love) as an unseemly waste of expenditure (Phaedrus, 257a), in his later speech Socrates demonstrates how erōs impels the soul to rise towards the forms. The followers of Zeus, or philosophy, Socrates suggests, educate the object of their erōs to imitate and partake in the ways of the God. Similarly, in the Symposium, Socrates refers to an exception to his ignorance. Approving of the suggestion by Phaedrus that the drinking party eulogise erōs, Socrates states that ta erōtika (the erotic things) are the only subject concerning which he would claim to possess rigorous knowledge (Symposium, 177 d-e). When it is his turn to deliver a speech, Socrates laments his incapacity to compete with the Gorgias-influenced rhetoric of Agathon before delivering Diotima’s lessons on erōs, represented as a daimonion or semi-divine intermediary between the mortal and the divine. Erōs is thus presented as analogous to philosophy in its etymological sense, a striving after wisdom or completion that can only be temporarily fulfilled in this life by contemplation of the forms of the beautiful and the good (204a-b). The philosopher is someone who strives after wisdom – a friend or lover of wisdom – not someone who possesses wisdom as a finished product, as the sophists claimed to do and as their name suggests.
Plato’s emphasis upon philosophy as an ‘erotic’ activity of striving for wisdom, rather than as a finished state of completed wisdom, largely explains his distaste for sophistic money-making. The sophists, according to Plato, considered knowledge to be a ready-made product that could be sold without discrimination to all comers. The Theages, a Socratic dialogue whose authorship some scholars have disputed, but which expresses sentiments consistent with other Platonic dialogues, makes this point with particular clarity. The farmer Demodokos has brought his son, Theages, who is desirous of wisdom, to Socrates. As Socrates questions his potential pupil regarding what sort of wisdom he seeks, it becomes evident that Theages seeks power in the city and influence over other men. Since Theages is looking for political wisdom, Socrates refers him to the statesmen and the sophists. Disavowing his ability to compete with the expertise of Gorgias and Prodicus in this respect, Socrates nonetheless admits his knowledge of the erotic things, a subject about which he claims to know more than any man who has come before or indeed any of those to come (Theages, 128b). In response to the suggestion that he study with a sophist, Theages reveals his intention to become a pupil of Socrates. Perhaps reluctant to take on an unpromising pupil, Socrates insists that he must follow the commands of his daimonion, which will determine whether those associating with him are capable of making any progress (Theages, 129c). The dialogue ends with an agreement that all parties make trial of the daimonion to see whether it permits of the association.
One need only follow the suggestion of the Symposium that erōs is a daimonion to see that Socratic education, as presented by Plato, is concomitant with a kind of ‘erotic’ concern with the beautiful and the good, considered as natural in contrast to the purely conventional. Whereas the sophists accept pupils indiscriminately, provided they have the money to pay, Socrates is oriented by his desire to cultivate the beautiful and the good in promising natures. In short, the difference between Socrates and his sophistic contemporaries, as Xenophon suggests, is the difference between a lover and a prostitute. The sophists, for Xenophon’s Socrates, are prostitutes of wisdom because they sell their wares to anyone with the capacity to pay (Memorabilia, I.6.13). This – somewhat paradoxically – accounts for Socrates’ shamelessness in comparison with his sophistic contemporaries, his preparedness to follow the argument wherever it leads. By contrast, Protagoras and Gorgias are shown, in the dialogues that bear their names, as vulnerable to the conventional opinions of the paying fathers of their pupils, a weakness contributing to their refutation. The sophists are thus characterised by Plato as subordinating the pursuit of truth to worldly success, in a way that perhaps calls to mind the activities of contemporary advertising executives or management consultants.
The overestimation of the power of human speech is the other theme that emerges clearly from Plato’s (and Aristotle’s) critique of the sophists. In the Sophist, Plato says that dialectic – division and collection according to kinds – is the knowledge possessed by the free man or philosopher (Sophist, 253c). Here Plato reintroduces the difference between true and false rhetoric, alluded to in the Phaedrus, according to which the former presupposes the capacity to see the one in the many (Phaedrus, 266b). Plato’s claim is that the capacity to divide and synthesise in accordance with one form is required for the true expertise of logos. Whatever else one makes of Plato’s account of our knowledge of the forms, it clearly involves the apprehension of a higher level of being than sensory perception and speech. The philosopher, then, considers rational speech as oriented by a genuine understanding of being or nature. The sophist, by contrast, is said by Plato to occupy the realm of falsity, exploiting the difficulty of dialectic by producing discursive semblances, or phantasms, of true being (Sophist, 234c). The sophist uses the power of persuasive speech to construct or create images of the world and is thus a kind of ‘enchanter’ and imitator.
This aspect of Plato’s critique of sophistry seems particularly apposite in regard to Gorgias’ rhetoric, both as found in the Platonic dialogue and the extant fragments attributed to the historical Gorgias. In response to Socratic questioning, Gorgias asserts that rhetoric is an all-comprehending power that holds under itself all of the other activities and occupations (Gorgias, 456a). He later claims that it is concerned with the greatest good for man, namely those speeches that allow one to attain freedom and rule over others, especially, but not exclusively, in political settings (452d). As suggested above, in the context of Athenian public life the capacity to persuade was a precondition of political success. For present purposes, however, the key point is that freedom and rule over others are both forms of power: respectively power in the sense of liberty or capacity to do something, which suggests the absence of relevant constraints, and power in the sense of dominion over others. Gorgias is suggesting that rhetoric, as the expertise of persuasive speech, is the source of power in a quite comprehensive sense and that power is ‘the good’. What we have here is an assertion of the omnipotence of speech, at the very least in relation to the determination of human affairs.
The Socratic position, as becomes clear later in the discussion with Polus (466d-e), and is also suggested in Meno (88c-d) and Euthydemus (281d-e), is that power without knowledge of the good is not genuinely good. Without such knowledge not only ‘external’ goods, such as wealth and health, not only the areas of expertise that enable one to attain such so-called goods, but the very capacity to attain them is either of no value or harmful. This in large part explains the so-called Socratic paradox that virtue is knowledge.
Plato’s critique of the sophists’ overestimation of the power of speech should not be conflated with his commitment to the theory of the forms. For Plato, the sophist reduces thinking to a kind of making: by asserting the omnipotence of human speech the sophist pays insufficient regard to the natural limits upon human knowledge and our status as seekers rather than possessors of knowledge (Sophist, 233d). This critique of the sophists does perhaps require a minimal commitment to a distinction between appearance and reality, but it is an oversimplification to suggest that Plato’s distinction between philosophy and sophistry rests upon a substantive metaphysical theory, in large part because our knowledge of the forms for Plato is itself inherently ethical. Plato, like his Socrates, differentiates the philosopher from the sophist primarily through the virtues of the philosopher’s soul (McKoy, 2008). Socrates is an embodiment of the moral virtues, but love of the forms also has consequences for the philosopher’s character.
There is a further ethical and political aspect to the Platonic and Aristotelian critique of the sophists’ overestimation of the power of speech. In Book Ten of Nicomachean Ethics, Aristotle suggests that the sophists tended to reduce politics to rhetoric (1181a12-15) and overemphasised the role that could be played by rational persuasion in the political realm. Part of Aristotle’s point is that there is an element to living well that transcends speech. As Hadot eloquently puts it, citing Greek and Roman sources, ‘traditionally people who developed an apparently philosophical discourse without trying to live their lives in accordance with their discourse, and without their discourse emanating from their life experience, were called sophists’ (2004, 174).
The testimony of Xenophon, a Greek general and man of action, is instructive here. In his treatise on hunting, (Cynēgeticus, 13.1-9), Xenophon commends Socratic over sophistic education in aretē, not only on the grounds that the sophists hunt the young and rich and are deceptive, but also because they are men of words rather than action. The importance of consistency between one’s words and actions if one is to be truly virtuous is a commonplace of Greek thought, and this is one important respect in which the sophists, at least from the Platonic-Aristotelian perspective, fell short.
One might think that a denial of Plato’s demarcation between philosophy and sophistry remains well-motivated simply because the historical sophists made genuine contributions to philosophy. But this does not entail the illegitimacy of Plato’s distinction. Once we recognise that Plato is pointing primarily to a fundamental ethical orientation relating to the respective personas of the philosopher and sophist, rather than a methodological or purely theoretical distinction, the tension dissolves. This is not to deny that the ethical orientation of the sophist is likely to lead to a certain kind of philosophising, namely one which attempts to master nature, human and external, rather than understand it as it is.
Sophistry for Socrates, Plato and Aristotle represents a choice for a certain way of life, embodied in a particular attitude towards knowledge which views it as a finished product to be transmitted to all comers. Plato’s distinction between philosophy and sophistry is not simply an arbitrary viewpoint in a dispute over naming rights, but is rather based upon a fundamental difference in ethical orientation. Neither is this orientation reducible to concern with truth or the cogency of one’s theoretical constructs, although it is not unrelated to these. Where the philosopher differs from the sophist is in terms of the choice for a way of life that is oriented by the pursuit of knowledge as a good in itself while remaining cognisant of the necessarily provisional nature of this pursuit.
Translations are from the Cooper collected works edition of Plato and the Sprague edition of the sophists unless otherwise indicated. The reference list below is restricted to a few basic sources; readers interested to learn more about the sophists are advised to consult the excellent overviews by Barney (2006) and Kerferd (1981a) for a more comprehensive list of secondary literature.
Last updated: March 24, 2012 | Originally published: