British philosopher and sociologist, Herbert Spencer was a major figure in the intellectual life of the Victorian era. He was one of the principal proponents of evolutionary theory in the mid nineteenth century, and his reputation at the time rivaled that of Charles Darwin. Spencer was initially best known for developing and applying evolutionary theory to philosophy, psychology and the study of society — what he called his “synthetic philosophy” (see his A System of Synthetic Philosophy, 1862-93). Today, however, he is usually remembered in philosophical circles for his political thought, primarily for his defense of natural rights and for criticisms of utilitarian positivism, and his views have been invoked by ‘libertarian’ thinkers such as Robert Nozick.
Spencer was born in Derby, England on 27 April 1820, the eldest of nine children, but the only one to survive infancy. He was the product of an undisciplined, largely informal education. His father, George, was a school teacher, but an unconventional man, and Spencer’s family were Methodist ‘Dissenters,’ with Quaker sympathies. From an early age, Herbert was strongly influenced by the individualism and the anti-establishment and anti-clerical views of his father, and the Benthamite radical views of his uncle Thomas. Indeed, Spencer’s early years showed a good deal of resistance to authority and independence.
A person of eclectic interests, Spencer eventually trained as a civil engineer for railways but, in his early 20s, turned to journalism and political writing. He was initially an advocate of many of the causes of philosophic radicalism and some of his ideas (e.g., the definition of ‘good’ and ‘bad’ in terms of their pleasurable or painful consequences, and his adoption of a version of the ‘greatest happiness principle’) show similarities to utilitarianism.
From 1848 to 1853, Spencer worked as a writer and subeditor for The Economist financial weekly and, as a result, came into contact with a number of political controversialists such as George Henry Lewes, Thomas Carlyle, Lewes’ future lover George Eliot (Mary Ann Evans [1819-1880])–with whom Spencer had himself had a lengthy (though purely intellectual) association–and T.H. Huxley (1825-1895). Despite the diversity of opinions to which he was exposed, Spencer’s unquestioning confidence in his own views was coupled with a stubbornness and a refusal to read authors with whom he disagreed.
In his early writings, Spencer defended a number of radical causes– particularly on land nationalization, the extent to which economics should reflect a policy of laissez-faire, and the place and role of women in society–though he came to abandon most of these causes later in his life.
In 1851 Spencer’s first book, Social Statics, or the Conditions Essential to Human Happiness appeared. (‘Social statics’–the term was borrowed from Auguste Comte–deals with the conditions of social order, and was preliminary to a study of human progress and evolution–i.e., ‘social dynamics.’) In this work, Spencer presents an account of the development of human freedom and a defense of individual liberties, based on a (Lamarckian-style) evolutionary theory.
Upon the death of his uncle Thomas, in 1853, Spencer received a small inheritance which allowed him to devote himself to writing without depending on regular employment.
In 1855, Spencer published his second book, The Principles of Psychology. As in Social Statics, Spencer saw Bentham and Mill as major targets, though in the present work he focussed on criticisms of the latter’s associationism. (Spencer later revised this work, and Mill came to respect some of Spencer’s arguments.) The Principles of Psychology was much less successful than Social Statics, however, and about this time Spencer began to experience serious (predominantly mental) health problems that affected him for the rest of his life. This led him to seek privacy, and he increasingly avoided appearing in public. Although he found that, because of his ill health, he could write for only a few hours each day, he embarked upon a lengthy project–the nine-volume A System of Synthetic Philosophy (1862- 93)–which provided a systematic account of his views in biology, sociology, ethics and politics. This ‘synthetic philosophy’ brought together a wide range of data from the various natural and social sciences and organized it according to the basic principles of his evolutionary theory.
Spencer’s Synthetic Philosophy was initially available only through private subscription, but he was also a contributor to the leading intellectual magazines and newspapers of his day. His fame grew with his publications, and he counted among his admirers both radical thinkers and prominent scientists, including John Stuart Mill and the physicist, John Tyndall. In the 1860s and 1870s, for example, the influence of Spencer’s evolutionary theory was on a par with that of Charles Darwin.
In 1883 Spencer was elected a corresponding member of philosophical section of the French academy of moral and political sciences. His work was also particularly influential in the United States, where his book, The Study of Sociology, was at the center of a controversy (1879-80) at Yale University between a professor, William Graham Sumner, and the University’s president, Noah Porter. Spencer’s influence extended into the upper echelons of American society and it has been claimed that, in 1896, “three justices of the Supreme Court were avowed ‘Spencerians’.” His reputation was at its peak in the 1870s and early 1880s, and he was nominated for the Nobel Prize for Literature in 1902. Spencer, however, declined most of the honors he was given.
Spencer’s health significantly deteriorated in the last two decades of his life, and he died in relative seclusion, following a long illness, on December 8, 1903.
Within his lifetime, some one million copies of his books had been sold, his work had been translated into French, German, Spanish, Italian, and Russian, and his ideas were popular in a number of other countries such as Poland (e.g., through the work of the positivist, Wladyslaw Kozlowski). Nevertheless, by the end of his life, his political views were no longer as popular as they had once been, and the dominant currents in liberalism allowed for a more interventionist state.
Spencer’s method is, broadly speaking, scientific and empirical, and it was influenced significantly by the positivism of Auguste Comte. Because of the empirical character of scientific knowledge and because of his conviction that that which is known–biological life–is in a process of evolution, Spencer held that knowledge is subject to change. Thus, Spencer writes, “In science the important thing is to modify and change one’s ideas as science advances.” As scientific knowledge was primarily empirical, however, that which was not ‘perceivable’ and could not be empirically tested could not be known. (This emphasis on the knowable as perceivable led critics to charge that Spencer fails to distinguish perceiving and conceiving.) Nevertheless, Spencer was not a skeptic.
Spencer’s method was also synthetic. The purpose of each science or field of investigation was to accumulate data and to derive from these phenomena the basic principles or laws or ‘forces’ which gave rise to them. To the extent that such principles conformed to the results of inquiries or experiments in the other sciences, one could have explanations that were of a high degree of certainty. Thus, Spencer was at pains to show how the evidence and conclusions of each of the sciences is relevant to, and materially affected by, the conclusions of the others.
In the first volume of A System of Synthetic Philosophy, entitled First Principles (1862), Spencer argued that all phenomena could be explained in terms of a lengthy process of evolution in things. This ‘principle of continuity’ was that homogeneous organisms are unstable, that organisms develop from simple to more complex and heterogeneous forms, and that such evolution constituted a norm of progress. This account of evolution provided a complete and ‘predetermined’ structure for the kind of variation noted by Darwin–and Darwin’s respect for Spencer was significant.
But while Spencer held that progress was a necessity, it was ‘necessary’ only overall, and there is no teleological element in his account of this process. In fact, it was Spencer, and not Darwin, who coined the phrase “survival of the fittest,” though Darwin came to employ the expression in later editions of the Origin of Species. (That this view was both ambiguous –for it was not clear whether one had in mind the ‘fittest’ individual or species–and far from universal was something that both figures, however, failed to address.)
Spencer’s understanding of evolution included the Lamarckian theory of the inheritance of acquired characteristics and emphasized the direct influence of external agencies on the organism’s development. He denied (as Darwin had argued) that evolution was based on the characteristics and development of the organism itself and on a simple principle of natural selection.
Spencer held that he had evidence for this evolutionary account from the study of biology (see Principles of Biology, 2 vols. [1864-7]). He argued that there is a gradual specialization in things–beginning with biological organisms–towards self-sufficiency and individuation. Because human nature can be said to improve and change, then, scientific–including moral and political– views that rested on the assumption of a stable human nature (such as that presupposed by many utilitarians) had to be rejected. ‘Human nature’ was simply “the aggregate of men’s instincts and sentiments” which, over time, would become adapted to social existence. Spencer still recognized the importance of understanding individuals in terms of the ‘whole’ of which they were ‘parts,’ but these parts were mutually dependent, not subordinate to the organism as a whole. They had an identity and value on which the whole depended–unlike, Spencer thought, that portrayed by Hobbes.
For Spencer, then, human life was not only on a continuum with, but was also the culmination of, a lengthy process of evolution. Even though he allowed that there was a parallel development of mind and body, without reducing the former to the latter, he was opposed to dualism and his account of mind and of the functioning of the central nervous system and the brain was mechanistic.
Although what characterized the development of organisms was the ‘tendency to individuation’ (Social Statics , p. 436), this was coupled with a natural inclination in beings to pursue whatever would preserve their lives. When one examines human beings, this natural inclination was reflected in the characteristic of rational self-interest. Indeed, this tendency to pursue one’s individual interests is such that, in primitive societies, at least, Spencer believed that a prime motivating factor in human beings coming together was the threat of violence and war.
Paradoxically, perhaps, Spencer held an ‘organic’ view of society. Starting with the characteristics of individual entities, one could deduce, using laws of nature, what would promote or provide life and human happiness. He believed that social life was an extension of the life of a natural body, and that social ‘organisms’ reflected the same (Lamarckian) evolutionary principles or laws as biological entities did. The existence of such ‘laws,’ then, provides a basis for moral science and for determining how individuals ought to act and what would constitute human happiness.
As a result of his view that knowledge about phenomena required empirical demonstration, Spencer held that we cannot know the nature of reality in itself and that there was, therefore, something that was fundamentally “unknowable.” (This included the complete knowledge of the nature of space, time, force, motion, and substance.)
Since, Spencer claimed, we cannot know anything non-empirical, we cannot know whether there is a God or what its character might be. Though Spencer was a severe critic of religion and religious doctrine and practice–these being the appropriate objects of empirical investigation and assessment–his general position on religion was agnostic. Theism, he argued, cannot be adopted because there is no means to acquire knowledge of the divine, and there would be no way of testing it. But while we cannot know whether religious beliefs are true, neither can we know that (fundamental) religious beliefs are false.
Spencer saw human life on a continuum with, but also as the culmination of, a lengthy process of evolution, and he held that human society reflects the same evolutionary principles as biological organisms do in their development. Society–and social institutions such as the economy–can, he believed, function without external control, just as the digestive system or a lower organism does (though, in arguing this, Spencer failed to see the fundamental differences between ‘higher’ and ‘lower’ levels of social organization). For Spencer, all natural and social development reflected ‘the universality of law’. Beginning with the ‘laws of life’, the conditions of social existence, and the recognition of life as a fundamental value, moral science can deduce what kinds of laws promote life and produce happiness. Spencer’s ethics and political philosophy, then, depends on a theory of ‘natural law,’ and it is because of this that, he maintained, evolutionary theory could provide a basis for a comprehensive political and even philosophical theory.
Given the variations in temperament and character among individuals, Spencer recognized that there were differences in what happiness specifically consists in (Social Statics , p. 5). In general, however, ‘happiness’ is the surplus of pleasure over pain, and ‘the good’ is what contributes to the life and development of the organism, or–what is much the same–what provides this surplus of pleasure over pain. Happiness, therefore, reflects the complete adaptation of an individual organism to its environment–or, in other words, ‘happiness’ is that which an individual human being naturally seeks.
For human beings to flourish and develop, Spencer held that there must be as few artificial restrictions as possible, and it is primarily freedom that he, contra Bentham, saw as promoting human happiness. While progress was an inevitable characteristic of evolution, it was something to be achieved only through the free exercise of human faculties (see Social Statics).
Society, however, is (by definition, for Spencer) an aggregate of individuals, and change in society could take place only once the individual members of that society had changed and developed (The Study of Sociology, pp. 366-367). Individuals are, therefore, ‘primary,’ individual development was ‘egoistic,’ and associations with others largely instrumental and contractual.
Still, Spencer thought that human beings exhibited a natural sympathy and concern for one another; there is a common character and there are common interests among human beings that they eventually come to recognize as necessary not only for general, but for individual development. (This reflects, to an extent, Spencer’s organicism.) Nevertheless, Spencer held that ‘altruism’ and compassion beyond the family unit were sentiments that came to exist only recently in human beings.
Spencer maintained that there was a natural mechanism–an ‘innate moral sense’–in human beings by which they come to arrive at certain moral intuitions and from which laws of conduct might be deduced (The Principles of Ethics, I , p. 26). Thus one might say that Spencer held a kind of ‘moral sense theory’ (Social Statics, pp. 23, 19). (Later in his life, Spencer described these ‘principles’ of moral sense and of sympathy as the ‘accumulated effects of instinctual or inherited experiences.’) Such a mechanism of moral feeling was, Spencer believed, a manifestation of his general idea of the ‘persistence of force.’ As this persistence of force was a principle of nature, and could not be created artificially, Spencer held that no state or government could promote moral feeling any more than it could promote the existence of physical force. But while Spencer insisted that freedom was the power to do what one desired, he also held that what one desired and willed was wholly determined by “an infinitude of previous experiences” (The Principles of Psychology, pp. 500-502.) Spencer saw this analysis of ethics as culminating in an ‘Absolute Ethics,’ the standard for which was the production of pure pleasure–and he held that the application of this standard would produce, so far as possible, the greatest amount of pleasure over pain in the long run.
Spencer’s views here were rejected by Mill and Hartley. Their principal objection was that Spencer’s account of natural ‘desires’ was inadequate because it failed to provide any reason why one ought to have the feelings or preferences one did.
There is, however, more to Spencer’s ethics than this. As individuals become increasingly aware of their individuality, they also become aware of the individuality of others and, thereby, of the law of equal freedom. This ‘first principle’ is that ‘Every man has freedom to do all that he wills, provided he infringes not the equal freedom of any other man’ (Social Statics, p. 103). One’s ‘moral sense,’ then, led to the recognition of the existence of individual rights, and one can identify strains of a rights-based ethic in Spencer’s writings.
Spencer’s views clearly reflect a fundamentally ‘egoist’ ethic, but he held that rational egoists would, in the pursuit of their own self interest, not conflict with one another. Still, to care for someone who has no direct relation to oneself–such as supporting the un- and under employed–is, therefore, not only not in one’s self interest, but encourages laziness and works against evolution. In this sense, at least, social inequity was explained, if not justified, by evolutionary principles.
Despite his egoism and individualism, Spencer held that life in community was important. Because the relation of parts to one another was one of mutual dependency, and because of the priority of the individual ‘part’ to the collective, society could not do or be anything other than the sum of its units. This view is evident, not only in his first significant major contribution to political philosophy, Social Statics, but in his later essays–some of which appear in later editions of The Man versus the State.
As noted earlier, Spencer held an ‘organic’ view of society, Nevertheless, as also noted above, he argued that the natural growth of an organism required ‘liberty’–which enabled him (philosophically) to justify individualism and to defend the existence of individual human rights. Because of his commitment to the ‘law of equal freedom’ and his view that law and the state would of necessity interfere with it, he insisted on an extensive policy of laissez faire. For Spencer, ‘liberty’ “is to be measured, not by the nature of the government machinery he lives under [...] but by the relative paucity of the restraints it imposes on him” (The Man versus the State , p. 19); the genuine liberal seeks to repeal those laws that coerce and restrict individuals from doing as they see fit. Spencer followed earlier liberalism, then, in maintaining that law is a restriction of liberty and that the restriction of liberty, in itself, is evil and justified only where it is necessary to the preservation of liberty. The only function of government was to be the policing and protection of individual rights. Spencer maintained that education, religion, the economy, and care for the sick or indigent were not to be undertaken by the state.
Law and public authority have as their general purpose, therefore, the administration of justice (equated with freedom and the protection of rights). These issues became the focus of Spencer’s later work in political philosophy and, particularly, in The Man versus the State. Here, Spencer contrasts early, classical liberalism with the liberalism of the 19th century, arguing that it was the latter, and not the former, that was a “new Toryism”–the enemy of individual progress and liberty. It is here as well that Spencer develops an argument for the claim that individuals have rights, based on a ‘law of life’. (Interestingly, Spencer acknowledges that rights are not inherently moral, but become so only by one’s recognition that for them to be binding on others the rights of others must be binding on oneself–this is, in other words, a consequence of the ‘law of equal freedom.’) He concluded that everyone had basic rights to liberty ‘in virtue of their constitutions’ as human beings (Social Statics, p. 77), and that such rights were essential to social progress. (These rights included rights to life, liberty, property, free speech, equal rights of women, universal suffrage, and the right ‘to ignore the state’–though Spencer reversed himself on some of these rights in his later writings.) Thus, the industrious–those of character, but with no commitment to existing structures except those which promoted such industry (and, therefore, not religion or patriotic institutions)–would thrive. Nevertheless, all industrious individuals, Spencer believed, would end up being in fundamental agreement.
Not surprisingly, then, Spencer maintained that the arguments of the early utilitarians on the justification of law and authority and on the origin of rights were fallacious. He also rejected utilitarianism and its model of distributive justice because he held that it rested on an egalitarianism that ignored desert and, more fundamentally, biological need and efficiency. Spencer further maintained that the utilitarian account of the law and the state was also inconsistent—that it tacitly assumed the existence of claims or rights that have both moral and legal weight independently of the positive law. And, finally, Spencer argues as well against parliamentary, representative government, seeing it as exhibiting a virtual “divine right”—i.e., claiming that “the majority in an assembly has power that has no bounds.” Spencer maintained that government action requires not only individual consent, but that the model for political association should be that of a “joint stock company”, where the ‘directors’ can never act for a certain good except on the explicit wishes of its ‘shareholders’. When parliaments attempt to do more than protect the rights of their citizens by, for example, ‘imposing’ a conception of the good–be it only on a minority–Spencer suggested that they are no different from tyrannies.
Spencer has been frequently accused of inconsistency; one finds variations in his conclusions concerning land nationalization and reform, the rights of children and the extension of suffrage to women, and the role of government. Moreover, in recent studies of Spencer’s theory of social justice, there is some debate whether justice is based primarily on desert or on entitlement, whether the ‘law of equal freedom’ is a moral imperative or a descriptive natural law, and whether the law of equal freedom is grounded on rights, utility, or, ultimately, on ‘moral sense’. Nevertheless, Spencer’s work has frequently been seen as a model for later ‘libertarian’ thinkers, such as Robert Nozick, and he continues to be read–and is often invoked–by ‘libertarians’ on issues concerning the function of government and the fundamental character of individual rights.
St. Francis Xavier University
Last updated: October 22, 2004 | Originally published: