Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Benedict de Spinoza: Political Philosophy

spinozaThe body of Benedict de Spinoza’s writings on political philosophy in the 17th century should be seen as a paradigmatic species of European Enlightenment Philosophy. Spinoza rejected the teleological account of human nature and its implications to political societies in favor of rational, scientific understanding with its contractual implications. Hence, political societies to Spinoza are not natural organisms but artificial entities “designed” and “manufactured” by human beings for certain ends. Such designs are, however, constrained by an understanding of human nature. It is, indeed, Spinoza’s conception of human nature that forms the foundation for his political philosophy.One of the aims of Spinoza’s political writings is to demonstrate that, given the central role played by emotions in human motivations, political authority is a necessary evil. Human beings, as they are, are not the kind of beings capable of surviving without it. In addition, Spinoza does not think that politics are good for much more besides keeping us from chaos, murder, anarchy. In this, he is in agreement with Thomas Hobbes. On the other hand, if Spinoza affirms security as the fundamental political value, as will be argued, he does not necessarily think that such a value is consistent only with a certain form of government. In this he differs from Hobbes.

It is only once we understand Spinoza’s picture of what human beings are like, particularly the source of their motivations, that we are in a position to derive the ends of political societies, which in turn leads us to explain the sources and justification of political authority, and why Spinoza is ultimately non-committal as to the kind of political form best embodying the endorsed fundamental political values.

Table of Contents

  1. Human Nature
    1. Interpretation of the Conatus Principle
    2. Ethical Egoism and the Salience of Passions
  2. The Necessity for Political Authority: State of Nature
    1. Objective Account
    2. Psychological Account
  3. The Transition from State of Nature to Political Authority: The Social Contract
    1. Civil vs. Natural Rights in Locke
    2. Civil vs. Natural Rights in Spinoza
    3. Transfer of Powers or Abilities
  4. Obligations
    1. Citizens
    2. Sovereign
  5. The Purpose and Preferred Form of Political Authority
  6. Conclusion
  7. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Human Nature

Spinoza’s political philosophy proceeds from the idea, also found in Hobbes, that political ends, or goals, should be derived from understanding human nature such as it is, and not as it should or could be. This fundamental starting point can be contrasted with a utopian tradition of political philosophy emblematic, for example, in Plato’s Republic and the early writings of Karl Marx. While utopian political philosophers argue that correct political institutions can transform human nature into something more desirable or virtuous than its current state, Spinoza instead commences with a contrarian conviction, by and large rejecting such a possibility. This conviction proceeds from Spinoza’s interpretation of human nature.

a. Interpretation of the Conatus Principle

Human nature, according to Spinoza, must be studied and understood just like the nature of any other organism in the universe, in the following sense; human beings are subsumed in nature along with all other natural organisms and cannot thus transcend, and are therefore subject to, natural laws. This includes our nature as physiological beings and as psychological and cognitive beings. Furthermore, the laws of nature are to be understood, according to Spinoza, in a non-teleological fashion. Nature/God does not act with an end in view; hence, human nature cannot be derived from any such purposes. Instead, the most fundamental principle guiding all organisms, and therefore also human beings is what Spinoza calls the Conatus Principle:

Each thing, as far as it can by its own power, strives to persevere in being. (E:III:P6)

While it is not immediately obvious how Spinoza intends to support this principle when it comes to the kinds of organisms called human beings—particularly in the context of political philosophy—it later becomes clear that the principle, in its current and descriptive, form, is intended epistemologically as an a priori analytic proposition, or a necessary truth:

Since reason demands nothing contrary to Nature, it demands that everyone love himself, seek his own advantage, what is really useful to him, want what will really lead a man to greater perfection, and absolutely, that everyone should strive to preserve his own being as far as he can. This, indeed, is as necessarily true as that the whole is greater than its part. (E: IV:P18S)

Hence, the Conatus principle, when applied in the context of human beings, appears to describe human beings as egoistic beings. This, as stated, is intended as a truth not based upon empirical observation or self-reflection, but put forth as a necessary truth—a truth as necessary as the truth that the whole is greater than its part. According to the descriptive interpretation of the principle (E:III:P6), we are necessarily egoistic creatures. However, the quoted passage from (E:IV:P18S) also gives credence to a prescriptive understanding of the Conatus principle, for Spinoza says that “everyone should strive to preserve his own being as far as he can.” On this reading, we should always act according to our self-interest. This position is known as ethical egoism since it urges us to be egoists rather than describing us as already being egoists.

Now, if both of these interpretations of the Conatus Principle are plausible, then we need an answer to the following question: If the descriptive interpretation tells us that we are necessarily actuated by the Principle, then why bother prescribing this action as desirable? That is, if we already necessarily act in accordance with the descriptive version of the Conatus Principle, then why are we also urged to act this way? Urging us to do something we already necessarily do is surely redundant.

One way out of this dilemma might be to say that the prescriptive version of the Conatus Principle is necessary because we do not, in fact, in all circumstances, act in accordance with our self-interest. Because we do not do so, Spinoza is urging us to do so. This interpretation would certainly be in agreement with the empirical reality of human motivations. We certainly do not always act in ways that are conducive to the sustenance and enhancement of our being. Self-sacrificing behavior, such as sacrificing one’s life for one’s family, friend, or nation is all too familiar. Surely Spinoza was aware of such actions. But if this is true, then why advance the descriptive version of the Conatus Principle at all? After all, if it can be refuted through empirical counterexamples, then isn’t this enough to show that this version of the principle is simply false? But Spinoza does not, as we have seen, advance the principle as an a posteriori truth, but as an a priori truth. Hence offering empirical counterexamples appears to be beside the point, and offering this way out of the dilemma will thus not do. But if it is indeed true, that we do not always act in accordance with our self-interest, then just what is the force and the meaning of the a priori descriptive version of the Conatus principle?

Perhaps the solution is to say that the prescriptive version of the Conatus principle is intended to us human beings as empirical, affective beings while the descriptive version of the principle is intended for what humanity could look like, if ideally rational. So, on this reading, Spinoza is urging us to act according to the dictates of ethical egoism since we, as empirical beings primarily motivated by our desires, sometimes fail to do so. This does not change the fact that we do act according to the principles of self-interest more often than not; it simply means that we do not always know what is in our best interest—since we are not ideally rational.

If this is plausible, then the descriptive version of the principle could indeed be interpreted as a metaphysical truth necessarily true for ideal humans, and not as a psychological truth. Fully rational individuals will never fail to seek whatever aids or enhances their being. But this would not be the case for beings like us, who need to be exhorted into self-interested behavior. If this is correct, the descriptive version of the principle describes human beings in their ideal state while the prescriptive version of the principle is designed for humans in their current state. Therefore, it is the prescriptive version of the Conatus Principle that is mainly of importance for the purposes of political philosophy.

b. Ethical Egoism and the Salience of Passions

If the prescriptive interpretation of the Conatus Principle is correct for all imperfect human beings, then Spinoza is pressing us to act in accordance with our best interests. This is not, however, tantamount to telling us to act selfishly or to see ourselves as individualistic, non-social beings. In fact, it is Spinoza’s thesis that acting in a selfish or individualistic manner is not in our best interest and hence a violation of the dictates of the Conatus Principle. And the reason why humans do not see what is in their best interests is due to the centrality of passions in their very being:

But human nature is framed in a different fashion: every one, indeed, seeks his own interest, but does not do so in accordance with the dictates of sound reason, for most men’s ideas of desirability and usefulness are guided by their fleshly instincts and emotions, which take no thought beyond the present and immediate object. (TP: V:72-73)

On the other hand, acting according to the Conatus Principle—and hence in one’s best interest–is to act in accordance with the dictates of sound reason. And to act in accordance with the dictates of sound reason is to realize the impossibility of persevering in one’s being without mutual assistance. Providing mutual assistance is in the best interest of human beings. Indeed, Spinoza argues that it is necessary for even providing the basic needs for survival (TP:V:73). Spinoza wants us to act in accordance with the principle of ethical egoism while arguing that it is precisely this that we are not capable of doing because of our “fleshy instincts and emotions” which run fundamentally counter to the social dictates of reason.

The anti-social nature of our passions is also an inevitable source of conflict:

In so far as men are tormented by anger, envy, or any passion implying hatred, they are drawn asunder and made contrary one to another, and therefore are so much the more to be feared, as they are more powerful, crafty, and cunning than the other animals. And because men are in the highest degree liable to these passions, therefore men are naturally enemies. (PT: II: 296)

This emphasis on the passions as the cause for conflict implies that ideally, if guided by full reason, human beings might be capable of avoiding conflict. Again, to act fully in accordance with the dictates of reason is to avoid conflict as was demonstrated above. Conflict does not enhance one’s being; quite to the contrary—it can annihilate one’s being. So, the emphasis on Spinoza’s ethical egoism is on the “ethical” since such behavior, instead of resulting in conflict, would embrace the social values of stability and harmony.

2. The Necessity for Political Authority: State of Nature

a. Objective Account

Spinoza’s description of human beings as “natural enemies,” and the consequent inevitability of conflict is an account of the human condition in a state of nature. This is mostly a non-historical, “conceptual device” used to depict the human condition in the absence of political authority. While Spinoza’s use of it is unsystematic compared to Hobbes and Locke, he nevertheless presumes something like it, and argues, along with Hobbes and Locke, that political authority is necessary for the survival of human societies: “[n]o society can exist without government, and force, and laws to restrain and repress men’s desires and immoderate impulses.” (TP:V: 74). Again, it is our affective nature that gets us into trouble. Since human beings are motivated by their self-interested desires for which they seek immediate gratification, they cannot exist without government. Thus, Spinoza rejects the possibility of anarchism for human beings primarily motivated by their desires as we have seen, this is not necessarily the case for fully rational beings).

Spinoza’s account here closely resembles that of Hobbes who similarly argued that human life without political authority would be undesirable due to the nature of human desires. Famously, such a life would be “solitary, poor, nasty, brutish, and short.” (Leviathan: I: xiii, p. 76). Spinoza also significantly agrees with Hobbes that it is the individual who decides what is in his or her best interest in a given situation and can hence procure his or her interests by force, cunning, entreaty or any other means (TP: XVI: 202).

b. Psychological Account

Third-person explanations of why political authority would be necessary for creatures like us has not yet to offer a first-person explanation, from the point of view of the very individuals in state of nature, of why they would actually prefer living under conditions of political authority rather than under the conditions of anarchy. Spinoza’s explanation of this proceeds from what he regards as self-evident, axiomatic laws of human psychology.

Spinoza argues that no one ever neglects what he regards as good, except with the hope of gaining something even better, or for the fear of some greater evil; and no one ever endures and evil, except for the sake of even greater evil, or gaining something good (TP: XVI: 203). The corollary of this is that all of us, given a choice of two goods, choose the one we think is the greatest and, given a choice of two evils, choose the least evil. When we combine this axiom with the Conatus Principle, we can see that we determine what is good and what is evil for us by judging what is most or least conducive to our survival.

Now, Spinoza argues, based upon this psychological axiom, that we would forsake the state of nature in favor of some form of political authority, because we would judge the situation under political authority to be a greater good (or a lesser evil) than the state of nature. But why would we judge the affair this way? Why not favor the state of nature over political authority? While Spinoza is not explicit regarding this matter, he nevertheless alludes to the fact that it is worse—again, from the point of view of our survival—to be at the mercy of innumerable individuals than at the mercy of one single entity: the state (TP: XVI: 202-3). Admittedly, this seems far from obvious as Locke argued later, but Spinoza might defend this conclusion on the grounds that dispersion of potential evil is more difficult to countenance than a concentration of potential evil. At least, in this way, while one may not necessarily be able to do anything about it, one can at least know where the potential evil is coming from.

3. The Transition from State of Nature to Political Authority: The Social Contract

It is clear, from the foregoing, that Spinoza’s rejection of anarchy is based upon the conjunction of the Conatus Principle and his psychological axiom. It is also clear that political authority for Spinoza is not something intrinsically good or desirable, but a necessary evil. It is the least evil choice of two evils. By utilizing the “state of nature” device, Spinoza is also implicitly conceding that the state is not a natural organism but an artificial entity “designed” and “manufactured” by human beings. While these considerations answer the ontological status of the state and why political authority is necessary at all, it is still necessary to see what Spinoza’s view is on the transfer of power from the state-of-nature-individuals to the state. Here it is perhaps useful to illuminate Spinoza’s position by briefly contrasting it to another social contract theorist, John Locke.

a. Civil vs. Natural Rights in Locke

Locke held that the state of nature was conditioned by what he called “law of nature” and that these natural laws could be discovered by reason. Two of the most important natural laws for our comparative purposes, mentioned by Locke, were (a) that no one ought to harm another in his or her life, health, liberty, or possessions; and (b) that should such violations occur, everyone had the right to punish the transgressor(s). The first of these laws indicate that human beings in state of nature possess rights to life, health, liberty, and possessions, and that it is wrong to violate such rights. So, while the state of nature for Locke is non-political, it is far from being non-moral: moral terms and actions are applicable in the non-political, state-of-nature realm. Now, while human beings can and do sometimes act morally in the state of nature, Locke also recognizes that often this will not be the case, and because of this, the survival of the individual is much more likely under a political authority which would possess a monopoly on punishment. So, according to Locke, humans still retain their rights to life, health, liberty, and possessions (this is collective called “property” in Locke’s theory) in the political realm. Such natural rights are now expressed through the form of civil rights in positive law. So, the distinction between natural and civil rights in Locke is derived from the distinction between natural law and positive law. Furthermore, it is clear that Locke regards such rights as moral constraints on the political realm; there are natural moral limits to what the state can do.

In contrast to our retention of the natural rights to property expressed through civil laws, we do not retain our right to punish the transgressors of property rights according to Locke. Instead, it is precisely our abrogation of the right to punish which is transferred to a state that makes the political realm possible.

b. Civil vs. Natural Rights in Spinoza

Unlike Locke, Spinoza makes no distinction between natural law and civil law, nor the corollary derivatives of natural rights and civil rights. Spinoza undermines such distinctions by arguing that “right” is simply synonymous with any agent’s “power” or “ability.” So, for Spinoza, to say that someone has a natural right to life, liberty, health, and possessions, is just to say that someone has a power to preserve their life, liberty, health, and possessions—to the best of their ability. In other words, our “right” to self-preservation is coextensive with our “power” or with our “ability” for self-preservation; “…the rights of an individual extend to the utmost limits of its power as it has been conditioned [by nature].” (TP: XVI: 200)

Denying such a distinction already foreshadows Spinoza’s refusal to regard the state of nature in Lockean terms, as a non-political but moral sphere. Instead, Spinoza is insistent that the state of nature is both a non-political and a non-moral sphere; “The state of nature…must be conceived as without either religion or law, and consequently without sin or wrong” (TP: XVI: 210). So, moral terms proper, such as “right,” “wrong,” “just,” and “unjust” are inconceivable in the state of nature. It is not just that there are no limits to what we can do to one another in state of nature; it is also the case that ordinary moral terms do not possess any meaning. Hence, it follows from that that “the right and ordinance of nature, under which all men are born, and under which they mostly live, only prohibits such things as no one desires, and no one can attain: it does not forbid strife, nor hatred, nor anger, nor deceit, nor indeed, any of the means suggested by desire…” (TP: XVI: 202).

To use Spinoza’s parlance, everyone has a “right” to act deceitfully, angrily, discordantly, violently, etc. towards others, or in general, in whatever manner they see fit as long as they are able to do so; their rights are only limited by their ability. As such, the only things we do not have a “right” to in the state of nature are things that none of us wants anyway, or things that are impossible for us to attain.

c. Transfer of Powers or Abilities

Although Spinoza would agree with Locke that the reasons for forsaking the state of nature comes from potentially enhanced capacities for self-preservation under political authority, it is less clear how Spinoza accounts for this transition. At first blush, it looks as if Spinoza is simply offering a story very similar to Locke’s: the political realm is made possible by the transference of our natural rights to punish. In this case, the use of force would belong solely to the state, just as it does in Locke’s account. However, as explained earlier, this right is conceived by Spinoza in manner very different from that of Locke. For while Locke thinks that the right to punish the transgressor of one’s rights is a natural, moral right, having nothing necessarily to do with whether one in fact is capable of punishing or not, in Spinoza’s conceptual apparatus this right is, once again, synonymous with one’s power or ability to punish the transgressor. One only has the “right” to the extent that one possesses the power. In other words, no ability or capacity, no “right.” Due to Spinoza’s identification of “right” and “power,” the transition from the non-political and the non-moral-state-of-nature to the political and moral sphere of the state does not appear to take place through the abrogation of our “right” to punish, as it does in Locke. Rather, if the interpretation is correct, Spinoza is committed to the position that, instead of our natural moral rights, we are in fact transferring our powers or capacities.

But there is a sense in which this is hardly intelligible. For one can argue that “powers” or “abilities” or “capacities” are not the kinds of things that is possible to transfer. One’s capacity to walk, for example, cannot be transferred to another in the sense that once the transfer has taken place, the agent having transferred the capacity no longer is able to walk while the agent having received the capacity now is able to walk. One can only lose one’s capacity (for example, when one is dead) but not transfer it. The same considerations are applicable to one’s capacity to defend oneself: one can lose that capacity but not transfer it. So, Spinoza’s identification of “right” with one’s power or ability does not seem to allow him to make the concept of transferring this “right” intelligible.

A distinction between “power” and the “use-of-power” is necessary. With such a distinction, Spinoza could make the transition from state of nature to a political sphere more plausible since he could now concede that while one cannot indeed transfer “powers” or “capacities,” one can nevertheless transfer one’s use of those powers and capacities. On this interpretation, the Lockean rights to life, liberty, health, and possession, would be understood by Spinoza not as one’s ability to defend or enhance one’s rights, liberties, health, and possessions, but instead as the actual use of that ability.

4. Obligations

The notion of obligations in Spinoza is relevant only in the political realm, not in the state of nature since, as we have seen, the state of nature for Spinoza is not only a nonpolitical but also a non-moral realm. The orthodox story about obligations tells us they are customarily derived from either voluntary agreements or someone having certain rights. Thus, if two parties voluntary agree to a contract, e.g. marriage, then the two parties incur obligations stipulated in the contract; or, for example, if someone has a right to free speech, then it is everybody’s obligation not to interfere with that someone’s right. That is the traditional story. But since Spinoza has argued that rights are synonymous with power, his story about obligations is anything but traditional. We shall take a look at obligations with respect to the relation between citizens and the sovereign.

a. Citizens

Spinoza stated that all contracts or promises derive their obligations from utility. Utility or disutility of a contract, in turn, is decided by the application of the aforementioned psychological axiom which tells us that no one ever neglects what he regards as good, except with the hope of gaining something even better, or for the fear of some greater evil; and no one ever endures and evil, except for the sake of even greater evil, or gaining something good. According to Spinoza, we have an obligation to fulfill a contract only if the violation of the contract would not gain us something better, or if the violation of the contract would result in a greater evil. If either or both conditions hold, then we a “right” to violate the contract (TP:XVI:203-205). The implication of such an analysis is, at the very least, that all contracts are revocable at any time, subject to the kind of analysis stated.

Now, with respect to the specific contract in question here, the contract to transfer our use of power to a given political authority, the implication is clear: the citizen’s “obligation” to obey the authority is also contingent on the psychological axiom. “It is…foolish to ask a man to keep his faith with us forever, unless we also endeavour that the violation of the compact we enter into shall involve for the violator more harm than good” (TP:XVI:204). Spinoza, then, offers a decisive “right” to rebellion for citizens.

Spinoza’s equation of “right” to power also has implications to the issue of citizens’ obligations. If the “right” of the sovereign is also coextensive to its power, then it would seem to follow that the citizens’ obligations extend only so far as the power of the sovereign. One is “obligated” to obey the sovereign only if one does not have the power to disobey it.

b. Sovereign

Presumably the obligations and the rights of the sovereign (there is here no presupposition as to the preferred form of government—that topic is discussed later—so that by “sovereign” one could mean a democracy, monarchy, oligarchy, etc.) is subject to similar analysis as the obligations and rights of the citizens. Since the citizens’ “rights” are coextensive with their power, the sovereign’s “obligations” to the citizens are limited only by the power of both parties. On the other hand, the sovereign’s “rights” are also only limited by the powers of the respective parties. Hence, the sovereign has the right to do whatever it wants, and wherever it meets the counterforce of the citizens, there lay its obligations. Furthermore, Spinoza is also clear that the sovereign’s power is not limited by laws, but only by its intellectual and physical abilities. There are no constitutional limitations to the sovereign’s actions.

Needless to say, these are devastating implications from the point of view of individual freedom, but Spinoza is quick to point out that both the citizens and the sovereign are constrained by the Conatus Principle as well. Therefore, a sovereign concerned to advance its being will rarely impose “irrational” commands toward the citizens, because…”they are bound to consult their own interests, and retain their power by consulting the public good and acting according to the dictates of reason…(TP:XVI:205). Presumably, similar things can be asserted about the citizenry, given the caveat that they also act in accordance with the dictates of reason. However, the problem with this sort of argument is that we have already seen Spinoza’s reservations regarding the ability of humans to act in accordance with the dictates of reason, and even if this was plausible, the force of Spinoza’s argument here is purely speculative. In other words, Spinoza is not making a principled point but arguing, instead, that the kinds of irrational commands (perhaps “tyrannical” would be better) would not likely occur since the sovereign will act in accordance with his or her best interests. But this sort of argument can surely only be assessed through empirical means by consulting the available historical record regarding the purported rationality of sovereigns’ behavior, and such a record has not been kind to Spinoza’s speculative point.

These kinds of considerations demonstrate, among other things, Spinoza’s unorthodox and perhaps incoherent use of the concepts like “rights,” “obligations,” and even “contract.” After all, what exactly does the social contract that Spinoza employs accomplish since its force does not come from the contract itself but rather from the kind of cost-benefit analysis carried out by the psychological axiom? What exactly would be lost from Spinoza’s political philosophy if the notion of contract and its correlative notions were simply omitted?

5. The Purpose and Preferred Form of Political Authority

Explaining Spinoza’s political philosophy has so far concentrated on his view of the relevant features of human psychology to political theory. Humans are creatures driven by passions and desires for survival that will always be characterized by hope for something better and fear for something worse. Hence, as has been explained, none of us ever neglects what he regards as good, except with the hope of gaining something even better, or for the fear of some greater evil; and none of us ever endures an evil, except for the sake of even greater evil, or gaining something good (TP: XVI: 203). Because of these fundamental features of human psychology, we would judge the state of nature to be a greater evil, or as something worse, than living under political authority. But what exactly does the political realm offer us that we cannot enjoy without it? What is the purpose of the political realm?

One answer to this question can be gathered from the account so far. We enter into the political realm in order to secure/enhance our existence better than we could without it—given the central role of passions in our nature. This is no less than a Hobbesian answer; the purpose of the political realm is escaping perpetual war in order to secure our lives and material possessions. Spinoza confirms this view: “…for the ends of every social organization and commonwealth are…security and comfort” (TP: III: 47). To reiterate, a good society is one which will be “most secure, most stable, and least liable to reverses…” (TP: III: 46). Spinoza appears to assert security as the fundamental political value. Such an affirmation can be contrasted, on the one hand, with political thinkers like Plato, Aristotle, and Hegel, all of whom saw the realm of politics as essential to the moral realization of the individual and, on the other hand, with thinkers like Locke and Kant who emphasized the instrumental nature of the state in guaranteeing individual freedom.

In spite of these explicit pronouncements on behalf of security by Spinoza, the issue of the purpose of political authority remains controversial in Spinoza scholarship. There are many commentators who do not interpret Spinoza as a Hobbesian with respect to the ends of political authority, but instead read him either as an advocate of individual freedom or moral perfection, or perhaps as both. One of the common threads to all of these accounts is Spinoza’s alleged preference for democracy as a political form. It is argued that because Spinoza advocates democracy and the democratic political rule is most conducive to freedom or perhaps virtue, that Spinoza is therefore affirming either freedom or virtue as the fundamental political value.

There is some textual as well as inferential evidence for such views. For example, Spinoza explicitly announces democracy as the most consonant with individual liberty; “I think I have now shown sufficiently clearly the basis of a democracy: I have especially desired to do so, for I believe it to be of all forms of government the most natural, and the most consonant with individual liberty” (TP: XVI: 207). Also, because Spinoza sees only de facto human beings as motivated by their passions and self-interested desires, and claims that human beings are potentially capable of being guided by reason which dictates cooperative behavior, perhaps it is the role of politics to nudge us from the irrational, passionate creatures to rational creatures by inculcation of virtue. Either way, the argument goes, security for Spinoza is only an instrumental value, or a necessary condition for the true political ends of individual freedom or virtue.

However, while commenting on the absolute obligation to obey existing laws, Spinoza entertains an objection that his philosophy is turning subjects into slaves which sheds light to the controversy at hand. Spinoza rejects the objection as unfounded because real—or true—freedom is not freedom from the laws of the sovereign, no matter how oppressive such laws might be, but real freedom is to live “under the entire guidance of reason” (TP: XVI: 206). Indeed, Spinoza claims that freedom is specifically a private, not a political virtue while “…the virtue of the state is its security” (PT: I: 290).

But to live under the entire guidance of reason is, at least minimally, to control one’s unruly passions, whatever else it may also be. However, if this is the case, then the pressing political question must be to ask, what political form, if any, is best for achieving this kind of liberation? And the suggestion here is that there is no obvious answer to this question. One might, for example, think that an authoritarian regime might be able to restrain humans’ irrational desires more effectively than a democratic one. Or, alternatively, one might think that no political regime of any kind is necessary or sufficient for this kind of realization. So, one cannot easily claim that because Spinoza is an advocate of democracy, he is thereby accepting freedom or virtue as the fundamental political end.

There is also textual evidence for the view that Spinoza does not reject other forms of government in favor of democracy. One of the central aims of A Political Treatise is precisely to demonstrate how different forms of governments can meet the fundamental political value of stability. For example, Spinoza explains that, historically, monarchies have enjoyed the most stability of any form of government (PT: VI:317), and that their potential instability results from the divergent interests between the sovereign and the citizens. In light of this, Spinoza advises the sovereign to act in his or her own interests which is to act in the interests of the citizensIn the case of aristocracy, instability is said to result from inequality of political power among the ruling aristocrats, the remedy for which consists of equalizing such power as far as possible. Spinoza’s considered thoughts on the stability of democracy were interrupted by his untimely death, but while he thought it most consistent with freedom, he nevertheless regarded it as the most unstable of all political forms. Indeed, Spinoza comments that democracies naturally evolve into aristocracies, and aristocracies naturally evolve into monarchies. At least on one understanding of “natural,” democracies may be interpreted as less natural than aristocracies and monarchies (PT: VIII: 351).

If stability, as has been argued, is the fundamental political value for Spinoza, then many forms of government are consistent with it, and monarchies and aristocracies appear more stable than democracies.

6. Conclusion

Spinoza’s political philosophy is a logical extension of his view of human nature. To understand ends, sources, and justification of political authority, one does well to begin with the Conatus Principle and the associated psychological axioms employed by Spinoza. The source of problems for Spinoza’s political theory, specifically the moral notions of “contract,” “rights,” and “obligations” can also be traced to his view of human nature. But what needs to be adjusted? Are the problems in the political theory an indication that Spinoza’s view of human nature needs to amended, or is his view of humanity unassailable and the problems in political theory simply a part of the package?

7. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

  • Hobbes, Thomas, Leviathan, ed. Edwin Curley, Indianapolis: Hackett, 1994.
  • Locke, John, Second Treatise of Government, ed. C.B. Macpherson, Indianapolis: Hackett, 1980.
  • Spinoza, Benedict de, A Theologico-Political Treatise and A Political Treatise, trans. R.H.M. Elwes, New York: Dover, 1951.
    • The references to the first work cited in the text as TP, chapter, page. References to the second work cited as PT, chapter, page.
  • Spinoza, Benedict de, Ethics, trans. R.H.M Elwes, New York: Dover, 1955.
    • All references to this work cited in the text as E, part, proposition.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Feuer, Lewis Samuel, Spinoza and the Rise of Liberalism, New Brunswick: Transaction Books, 1958.
  • McShea, Robert J, The Political Philosophy of Spinoza, New York: Columbia University, 1968.
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Author Information

Jari Niemi
Email: Jniemi@fau.edu
Florida Atlantic University
U. S. A.

Last updated: February 1, 2009 | Originally published: