Baruch (or, in Latin, Benedict) de Spinoza (1632-1677) was one of the most important rationalist philosophers in the early modern period, along with Descartes, Leibniz, and Malebranche. Spinoza is also the most influential “atheist” in Europe during this period. “Atheist” at the time meant someone who rejects the traditional Biblical views concerning God and his relation to nature. In his most important book, titled Ethics Demonstrated in a Geometrical Manner, Spinoza argues for a radically new picture of the universe to rival the traditional Judeo-Christian one. Using a geometrical method similar to Euclid’s Elements and later Newton’s Principia, he argues that there is no transcendent and personal God, no immortal soul, no free will, and that the universe exists without any ultimate purpose or goal. Instead, Spinoza argues the whole of the natural world, including human beings, follows one and the same set of natural laws (so, humans are not special), that everything that happens could not have happened differently, that the universe is one inherently active totality (which can be conceived of as either “God” or “Nature”), and that the mind and the body are one and the same thing conceived in two ways.
Spinoza’s Ethics appeared provocative to his contemporaries. First, many of them found his arguments clear and compelling. Spinoza begins Ethics by defining key terms and identifying his assumptions. Most of these would have seemed commonplace to Spinoza’s contemporaries. He then derives theorems, which he calls “propositions,” on the basis of this foundation. Many of the philosophers and theologians who first read Spinoza’s Ethicsn found these definitions and assumptions unproblematic, but were horrified by the theorems which Spinoza proved on the basis of them. Second, by all accounts Spinoza was an especially good man who lived a modest and virtuous life. The mere possibility of a “virtuous atheist,” however, severed one of the most popular arguments in favor of traditional Biblical religion: that without it, living a moral life was impossible.
This article examines some fundamental issues of Spinoza’s new “atheistic” metaphysics, and it focuses on three of the most important and difficult aspects of Spinoza’s metaphysics: his theory of substance monism, his theory of attributes, and his theory of conatus.
The Ethics is broken into five parts:
Part I concerns issues in general metaphysics (the existence of God, free will, the nature of bodies and minds, etc.) Part II concerns two issues related to the mind: (i) what the mind is and how it relates to the body, and (ii) a general theory of knowledge. In Part III, Spinoza presents his theory of emotions (which he calls “affects”) and a fully deterministic human psychology. In Parts IV and V, Spinoza presents his ethical theory.
Each part of the Ethics is broken into definitions of key terms, axioms (assumptions),
propositions (theorems proven on the basis of the definitions, axioms, and the previous propositions), demonstrations (proofs), corollaries (where Spinoza often draws attention to other claims which can be proven on the basis of his propositions, but which are not part of his main argument), and scholia (where Spinoza breaks out of his rigorous structure to comment, argue, or restate the demonstrated material in a more easily accessible way.)
To this classic geometrical structure, Spinoza adds three additions to the Ethics. (1) Spinoza ends Parts I and IV with appendices. In these appendices he comments on the previous part, clarifies his position, and adds new arguments. (2) In Part II and after proposition 13, Spinoza interrupts his argument to include a short discussion on physics and the laws of motion. This part of the Ethics is sometimes called the “Physical Digression,” “Physical Interlude,” or the “Short Treatise on Bodies.” (3) At the end of Part III Spinoza includes an organized list of the definition of the affects (emotions) as argued for in Part III.
When citing the Ethics begin with the Part number, then use the following shorthand:
For example, to cite the demonstration of the 14th proposition of Part III one would write “3p14d.” A number of minor variations exist. Some authors also put an “E” at the beginning of the citation to stand for “Ethics” to distinguish the Ethics from Spinoza’s other book written in a geometrical manner, the Principles of Cartesian Philosophy Demonstrated in a Geometrical Manner (1663). For example, the demonstration of the 14th proposition of Part III is often cited as “E3p14d.” Other scholars mark the part number with Roman numerals, thus citing the proposition as “IIIp14d” or “EIIIp14d.”
So why does Spinoza utilize this cumbersome method of proof in the Ethics? Scholars have given a number of different answers to this question. One common explanation concerns how people thought about science in this period. In the 17th century, mathematics was the paradigmatic science. It was widely admired for offering conclusive and incontrovertible proofs which no rational person (who understood them) could reject. Many philosophers attempted to replicate Euclid’s success in other areas and so found other sciences as conclusive and demonstrable as mathematical science. For example, Hobbes attempted to organize political concepts “geometrically” in his Leviathan. Descartes also considered the possibility of organizing his entire philosophy geometrically in the Second Replies, though he never made a serious attempt to do so.) Spinoza, however, geometrically reorganized the first two books of Descartes’ Principles (along with other original material) in his first published book: Principles of Cartesian Philosophy Demonstrated in a Geometrical Manner (1663).
Other scholars argue that there is a deeper reason for Spinoza’s use of the geometrical method. The goal of the Ethics, Spinoza says, is to prove those things that can “lead us, by the hand, as it were, to the knowledge of the human mind and its highest blessedness” (Preface to Part II). Ethics is supposed to be a philosophical therapy which helps its readers to overcome their passions and superstitions and become more rational. Working through the proofs, Spinoza promotes these goals by forcing us to think carefully, and so promotes the therapeutic aim of his book. For more on the purpose of the geometrical method see Wolfson 1958, I 3-32; Bennett 1988, 16-28; Garrett 2003; Nadler 2006, 35-51.
According to Spinoza, everything that exists is either a substance or a mode (E1a1). A substance is something that needs nothing else in order to exist or be conceived. Substances are independent entities both conceptually and ontologically (E1d3). A mode or property is something that needs a substance in order to exist, and cannot exist without a substance (E1d5). For example, being furry, orange, hungry, angry, etc. are modes that need a substance which is furry, orange, hungry, angry, etc. Hunger and patches of orange color cannot exist floating around on their own, but rather, hunger and patches of orange color need something (namely, a substance) to be hungry and have the orange color. Hunger and colors are, therefore, dependent entities or modes.
According to almost all of Spinoza’s predecessors (including Aristotle and Descartes) there are lots of substances in the universe, each with their own modes or properties. For example, according to Descartes a cat is a substance which has the modes or properties of being furry, orange, soft, etc. (Though some have argued that Descartes cannot actually individuate multiple extended substances. See Curley 1988, 15-19; 141-2 n. 9.) Spinoza, however, rejects this traditional view and argues instead that there is only one substance, called “God” or “Nature.” Cats, dogs, people, rocks, etc. are not substances in Spinoza’s view, but rather, cats, dogs, people, rocks, etc. are just modes or properties of one substance. This one substance is simply people-like in places, rock-like in other places, chair-like in still other places, etc.
One can think of substance as an infinite space. Some regions of this one space are hard and brown (rocks), other regions of space are green, juicy, and soft (plants), while still other regions are furry, orange, and soft (cats), etc. As a cat walks across the room all that happens in Spinoza’s view is that different regions of space become successively furry, orange, and soft (See Bennett 1984: 88-92 for more on space and the extended substance in Spinoza).
This one substance has an infinite number of attributes. An attribute is simply an essence; a “what it is to be” that kind of thing. According to Descartes, every substance has only one attribute: bodies have only the attribute of extension, and minds have only the attribute of thought. Spinoza, however, argues against this claim that the one substance is absolutely infinite and so it must exist in every way that something can exist. Thus, he infers that the one substance must have an infinite number of attributes (E1p9). An attribute, according to Spinoza, is just the essence of substance under some way of conceiving or describing the substance (E1d4). When we consider substance one way, then we conceive of its essence as extension. When we consider substance another way, then we conceive of its essence as thought. (See Della Rocca 1996a: 164-167.) While substance has an infinite number of different attributes, Spinoza argues that human beings only know about two of them: extension and thought.
The most distinctive aspect of Spinoza’s system is his substance monism; that is, his claim that one infinite substance—God or Nature—is the only substance that exists. His argument for this monism is his first argument in Part I of the Ethics. The basic structure of the argument is as follows:
That is, there is only one substance (called “God” or “Nature”) which has all possible attributes. No other substance can exist because if it existed it would have to share an attribute with God, but it is impossible for two different substances to both have the same attribute. Spinoza defends each of his four assumptions as follows:
The Argument for Premise One (E1d4)
If a substance existed which did not have any attributes, then (by Spinoza’s definition of attribute at E1d4) the substance would not have an essence. However, according to Spinoza, it makes no sense to claim that something exists which does not have an essence. Thus, every substance has at least one attribute. This premise is not particularly controversial.
The Argument for Premise Two (E1p5)
Spinoza’s argument for the second premise (“Two substances cannot share the same nature or attribute”) is much more controversial. Here Spinoza argues that if two substances share one and the same attribute, then there is no way to tell the two substances apart. If substance A and substance B both have attribute 1 as their nature, then in virtue of what are there two different substances here? Why aren’t A and B just one substance? Since no cause can be given to explain their distinctness, Spinoza infers that they must actually be the same. Formally, the argument is as follows:
The Arguments for Premise Four (E1p11)
In the demonstration of E1p11, Spinoza explicitly provides a number of different proofs for the existence of a substance with infinite attributes (namely, God.) One proof is a version of the Ontological Argument also used by Anselm and Descartes. Spinoza’s argument is interesting, however, because he provides a very different reason for claiming that the essence of each substance includes existence. Spinoza’s Ontological Argument, once unpacked, is as follows:
This argument differs from the Ontological Arguments offered by Anselm and Descartes in that (i) Spinoza does not infer the existence of God from the claim that our idea of God involves existence and (ii) Spinoza does not assume that existence is a perfection (and so a property). Spinoza’s argument, therefore, can avoid some of the more common objections to the Ontological proofs as formulated by Descartes and Anselm. See Earle 1973a and Earle 1973b for a partial defense of Spinoza’s Ontological Argument.
Spinoza’s Argument for Substance Monism is generally deemed a failure by contemporary philosophers. There are a number of ways to attack the argument. The most common way is to reject Spinoza’s second premise (E1p5: “That two substances cannot share the same nature or attribute.”) One of the most popular arguments against this promise was first presented by Leibniz. Leibniz argued that whereby it might be impossible for two substances to have all of their attributes in common (because then they would be indistinguishable), it may be possible for two substances to share an attribute and yet differ by each having another attribute that is not shared. For example, one substance may have attributes A and B and another substance has attributes A and C. The two substances would be distinguishable because each has an attribute the other lacks, but both substances would nevertheless share an attribute. This objection was first presented by Leibniz to Spinoza himself. Though Spinoza did not find the objection persuasive, he never offered an explicit reply. See Della Rocca 2002: 17-22 for a plausible solution on Spinoza’s behalf based upon the conceptual independence of the attributes.
If Spinoza’s Substance Monism Argument were sound, it would prove that the only substance which exists is God or Nature (a substance with an infinite number of attributes). But why does this one substance have any finite modes (properties)? Spinoza provides an answer at E1p16. Here Spinoza argues that “from the necessity of the divine nature there must follow infinitely many things in infinitely many ways (that is, everything which can fall under an infinite intellect)” (E1p16). Spinoza argues that the greater something is, the greater the number of properties which follow from its nature or essence. For example, it follows from the nature of a triangle that it has three sides. Why do triangles have interior angles of 180 degrees? Because of the kind of things that they are (that is, because of their essence.)
The greater the essence of the thing, the more properties that follow from it. God’s essence is the greatest possible essence. Thus, the greatest possible number of properties (that is, an infinite number) must follow from God’s essence or nature. Thus, an infinite number of finite modes must follow from the essence of God in just the way that certain properties of triangles (having interior angles of 180 degrees, for example) follow from the essence of a triangle. Because a triangle’s essence is finite only a finite number of properties follow from it; because God’s essence is infinite an infinite number of properties follow from it. Human beings, chairs, tables, cats, dogs, trees, etc. are some of the properties that follow from God’s essence or nature.
Spinoza claims that one important consequence of this proof is that modes are properties of substance. The view that modes are properties of substance has been denied by at least one prominent interpreter of Spinoza (Curley 1988: 31-39). Curley’s view has, however, proven unpopular (See Carriero 1999; Malamed 2009.) The dominant interpretation today is that modes are properties of the one substance.
Spinoza’s theory of the attributes (extension, thought, etc.) is the most original, difficult, and controversial aspect of his metaphysics. According to Descartes, the attribute of a substance is simply the substance’s essence (Principles I.53.) Given this definition, Descartes infers that each substance has only one attribute. Spinoza modifies Descartes’s definition at E1d4 and states that “by attribute I understand what the intellect perceives of a substance as constituting its essence.” The Latin here is “per attributum intelligo id, quod intellectus de substantia percipit, tanquam ejusdem essentiam constituens.” Spinoza then claims that the one substance (“God” or “Nature”) has an infinite number of attributes (E1d6.) A number of scholars have found it hard to understand how one substance could have multiple attributes each one of which is “what the intellect perceives … as constituting its essence.” Either Spinoza is claiming that the one substance has multiple essences, or that the attributes are not really the essence of the substance but only seem to be.
The interpretive problems with Spinoza’s theory of attributes begin with his definition. In the definition he uses the word ‘tanquam’ which can be correctly translated into English both as ‘as if’ and as ‘as.’ If ‘tanquam’ is translated as ‘as if’, then that translation suggests that the attributes are not really the essence of substance but only seem to be the essence of substance. If, however, ‘tanquam’ is translated as ‘as’, then that translation would seem to indicate that each attribute really is the essence of substance. The problem is then to explain how we can have one substance with more than one essence. Thus, the first problem with Spinoza’s theory of attributes is to explain the relation between the attributes and the essence of substance.
According to some scholars (often called “subjectivists”) each attribute is not really the essence of substance but merely seems to be. According to these scholars, substance’s essence is in some way “hidden” from the intellect and “unthinkable.” All we can know is how the essence of the one substance appears to the intellect (either as extension or as thought.) According to other scholars (often called “objectivists”) each attribute really is the essence of substance. The problem is then to explain how one substance can have multiple essences and still remain one substance.
The second problem with Spinoza’s theory of attributes is to explain how the attributes are related to one other. If each attribute really is the essence of the one substance, then how do they relate to each other? Are they identical? Or is each attribute really different from every other attribute? If they are identical, then why does the intellect distinguish them? If they are different, then how can one substance have more than one essence? Some subjectivists (such as Wolfson 1958: 142 ff.) argue that there is really only one attribute which is distinguished wrongly into numerous attributes by the intellect. Objectivists, on the other hand, argue that there is more than one attribute and that they are really distinct from each other.
In summary, there are two major problems with Spinoza’s theory of attributes:
The most influential defense of the “Subjectivist” interpretation of the attributes is presented by Wolfson 1958 Vol. 1: 142-157. Wolfson argues that
the two attributes appear to the mind as being distinct from each other. In reality, however, they are one. For by [E1p10], attributes, like substance, are summa genera (“conceived through itself”.) The two attributes must therefore be one and identical with substance. Furthermore, the two attributes have not been acquired by substance after it had been without them, nor are they conceived by the mind one after the other or deduced one from the other. They have always been in substance together, and are conceived by our mind simultaneously. Hence, the attributes are only different words expressing the same reality and being of substance (Wolfson 1958 Vol. 1: 156.)
That is, substance has only one essence and that essence is the sum total of all of its attributes. The attributes are all identical (and also identical with the substance itself). The attributes are distinguished from one another merely conceptually (“only different words expressing the same reality”), but in reality the attributes are all one and the same. The essence of substance is therefore the one attribute extension-thought-etc. This one attribute cannot be thought as it is, but is instead mentally broken into pieces and considered only partially. Wolfson thus explicitly provides answers to both the Attribute-Essence Problem and to the Attribute-Attribute Problem. In both cases Wolfson claims that the relation is identity. Each attribute is identical to every other attribute (in reality, there is only one “super attribute”) and the essence of substance is this one unthinkable “super attribute.” Wolfson goes further, however, and also argues that substance is identical to this one unthinkable “super attribute.”
A very different theory of attributes, which also goes by the name of “Subjectivism,” is offered by Bennett. Bennett argues that the attributes do not constitute the essence of substance at all. Instead the essence of substance is really the infinite series of finite modes. The attributes merely appear to constitute the essence of substance. Bennett disagrees with Wolfson in that Bennett believes “that Nature really has extension and thought, which really are distinct from one another, but that they are not really fundamental properties, although they must be perceived as such by any intellect” (Bennett 1984: 147.) Thus, Bennett’s solution to the Attribute-Essence Problem is to claim that the essence and attributes are distinct. But he differs from Wolfson in regard to the Attribute-Attribute Problem. Here Bennett argues that the attributes are not identical (as Wolfson claims.)
One thing to note here is the looseness of the term “Subjectivism.” Both Bennett and Wolfson are considered “Subjectivists” because they each deny at least one of the following two claims:
Wolfson denies both; Bennett denies only the second.
There are significant problems with both Wolfson’s and Bennett’s “Subjectivism.” The problem is that there is strong textual evidence in favor of the two claims:
The argument in favor of (i) is that Spinoza claims at E1p10d that all intellects can conceive of the attributes as really distinct (that is, one without the help of the other.) Thus, even the infinite intellect (that is, God’s Mind) must conceive of the attributes as really distinct. But the infinite intellect understands everything exactly as it is
(E1p32). Therefore, the attributes must be really distinct. This argument has persuaded almost all recent scholars that (i) is true.
The argument in favor of (ii) also relies on the infinite intellect. Spinoza claims at E2p3 that the infinite intellect has an adequate and true idea of God’s essence. But on both Wolfson’s and Bennett’s subjectivist accounts that is not true. On Wolfson’s account the infinite intellect cannot have an adequate idea of the one “super attribute” extension-thought-etc. The infinite intellect can only have an idea of the different fragmented pieces, namely, extension, thought, etc. On Bennett’s account the essence of substance isn’t even an attribute. Both scholars have to admit that the infinite intellect does not have an adequate idea of the essence of substance, which contradicts Spinoza’s claim at E2p3. See Della Rocca 1996a: 157-171 for more on the case against Subjectivism.
If both claims (i) and (ii) are true on Spinoza’s view, then the attributes are really distinct, and yet each one constitutes the essence of substance. This is a significant problem. How can there be only one substance if this substance has multiple distinct essences? Edwin Curley answers this question by claiming both that “the attributes of substance satisfy the definition of substance” (Curley 1988: 29) and that the attributes come together to form one essence because “this particular complex is a complex of very special elements” (Curley 1988: 30.) The attributes on Curley’s view are a collection of an infinite number of substances that come together in much the same way that numbers come together to form a number line. The number line is a unity composed of an infinite amount of very special elements.
Thus, Curley’s solution to the Attribute-Essence Problem is to claim that each attribute pertains to the essence of substance. Concerning the Attribute-Attribute Problem, Curley claims that the attributes are really distinct from each other. A similar view may also have been held by Gueroult 1968 Vol. 1. Objectivism is often characterized by three theses:
The third claim, however, has been disputed by some more recent Objectivists. Della Rocca in his 1996 book Representation and the Mind-Body Problem in Spinoza offers what is currently the most influential objectivist interpretation of Spinoza’s theory of the attributes. Della Roccca accepts claims (i) and (ii), but rejects the idea that attributes are themselves substances. Della Rocca’s interpretation centers on the idea of “referential opacity.” Della Rocca claims that “a context is referentially opaque if the truth value of the sentence resulting from completing the context does depend on which particular term is used to refer to that object” (Della Rocca 1996a, 122.) That is, the truth value of a particular sentence depends upon how the objects in the sentence are described. If the description changes, then the truth value of the sentence may change too. For example, consider the morning star and the evening star. The following sentence is true: Bob believes that the morning star rises in the morning. However, if you replace ‘the morning star’ without another equally correct description of the same object, then the sentence turns out false. Because Bob does not know that the morning star and evening star are actually the same thing (namely, Venus) the following sentence is false: Bob believes that the evening star rises in the morning. Because the truth-value of the sentence depends upon the description of Venus used in the sentence, this context is referentially opaque.
Della Rocca provides the example of a spy. One may know that there is a spy in the community and even hate this spy, without knowing that the spy is one’s brother. In this case the truth-value of sentences such as I hate the spy, I believe that the spy is a spy, etc. all depend upon the term used to pick out the spy. If we replace ‘the spy’ with the term ‘my brother,’ the truth value of these two sentences changes: I hate my brother, I believe that my brother is a spy. Because the truth-value changes when the term used to pick out the person changes, these contexts are referentially opaque.
Della Rocca believes that referential opacity is the key to understanding Spinoza’s theory of attributes. The idea here is to understand that attribute contexts are referentially opaque. So, the sentence “the essence of substance is thought” and the sentence “the essence of substance is extension” are referentially opaque contexts. Della Rocca claims that Spinoza’s definition of attribute should be interpreted as saying: “by attribute I understand that which constitutes the essence of a substance under some description or way of conceiving that substance” (Della Rocca 1996a, 166.) When substance is considered in one way, then the essence of substance is thought; when substance is considered in another way, then the essence of substance is extension. What the essence of substance is taken to be will depend upon how the substance is being considered.
By arguing that attribute contexts are referentially opaque, Della Rocca believes that he can avoid the central problem of Subjectivism: the claim that God misunderstands his own essence (contra E2p3). Thus, though Della Rocca’s view may at first sound like a form of Subjectivism, it avoids the central problem. The attributes are really distinct on Della Rocca’s interpretation in that each attribute is the essence of substance under some description of that substance: each really distinct description gives one a different essence. The attributes also constitute the essence of substance on this view, so long as we add the phrase “under some description or way of conceiving of that substance” to the end. Della Rocca, however, does not have to accept that attributes are themselves substances. An attribute is not a substance according to this view (contra Curley); an attribute is simply the essence of a substance under some description or way of conceiving of that substance.
How one interprets Spinoza’s theory of attributes will significantly affect the rest of his metaphysics. For example, one of Spinoza’s most important claims is that “the order and connection of ideas is the same as the order and connection of things” (E2p7.) That is, the order of modes under the attribute of extension is the same as the order of modes under the attribute of thought. Spinoza explains this idea in an important and controversial scholium. He claims that
a circle existing in nature and the idea of the existing circle, which is also in God, are one and the same thing, which is explained through different attributes. Therefore, whether we conceive nature under the attribute of Extension, or under the attribute of Thought, or under any other attribute, we shall find one and the same order, or one and the same connection of causes, i.e., that the same things follow one another (E2p7s.)
The view that one and the same order exists under each of the attributes is called ‘modal parallelism.’ The word ‘parallelism’ is used because not all scholars believe that the relationship between a body and the mind of that body is identity. How one interprets modal parallelism in Spinoza will depend upon one’s interpretation of Spinoza’s theory of the attributes. Two of the most developed and influential recent interpretations of Spinoza’s parallelism are Bennett 1984 (who argues that the mind and body are not identical) and Della Rocca 1996a (who argues that the mind and body are identical).
Bennett and others reject the numerical identity interpretation of parallelism on the grounds that it commits Spinoza to a contradiction. Spinoza claims that there is no causal interaction between minds and bodies at E3p2. If he then claimed (so the argument goes) that minds and bodies are identical, then he would seemingly be committed to the following contradiction: if mind M causally interacts with mind N and body 1 is identical with mind M, then it seems as though body 1 must also causally interact with mind N (thus violating Spinoza’s explicit claims at E3p2.) This argument is presented by both Bennett 1984, 141 and Delahunty 1985, 197 to argue against the identity of minds and bodies in Spinoza.
But Spinoza does say that the mind and the body are “one and the same thing” conceived in two ways (E2p7s). What could that mean if not that minds and bodies are identical? Bennett argues that in Spinoza a mind and a body merely share a part (which he calls a “trans-attribute mode”). Minds and bodies are not fully identical. (See Bennett 1984, 141). One “trans-attribute mode” can combine both with the attribute of thought (creating a mind) and the attribute of extension (creating a body) at the same time. Thus, my body is a trans-attribute mode combined with the attribute of extension; my mind is that same trans-attribute mode combined with the attribute of thought. Bennett thus rejects the interpretation of parallelism whereby a body and a mind are one and the same thing. A body and its parallel mind merely share a part (namely, a trans-attribute mode).
By contrast Della Rocca argues that minds and bodies in Spinoza are fully identical. Della Rocca argues that the notion of referential opacity (see the Objectivism section above) can allow Spinoza to accept both the identity of minds and bodies without accepting that minds and bodies causally interact. Della Rocca claims that causal contexts in Spinoza are referentially opaque. That is, x is the cause of y only under certain descriptions or ways of thinking about x. It is not the case that the sentence “x causes y” is true under all possible ways of describing or conceiving of x. For example, “x under a mental description caused y” can be true while “x under a physical description caused y” is false. Thus, Della Rocca argues that the claim that minds and bodies are identical does not entail that minds and bodies causally interact because whether x caused y or not depends upon how x is described. (See Della Rocca 1996a, 118-140, 157-167.)
In Part III of the Ethics, Spinoza argues that each mode (that is, every physical and mental thing) “strives to persevere in its being” (E3p6.) The word translated into English as “strives” is the Latin “conatus.” (“Conatus” is also sometimes translated as “endeavor.”) From the claim that every mode strives to persevere in its being, Spinoza infers that each mode’s conatus is the actual essence (E3p7.) That is, what it is to be a cat is just to strive in a certain cat-like way. What it is to be a desk is for the complex body to strive in a certain desk-like way. Every thing that exists—every particle, rock, plant, animal, planet, solar system, idea, mind, etc.—is striving to survive. From the claim that the essence of every mode is its striving to persist Spinoza derives much of his physics, psychology, moral philosophy, and political theory in Parts III, IV, and V of the Ethics.
Despite the importance of Spinoza’s theory of conatus, there are a number of interpretive and philosophical difficulties with it and Spinoza’s argument for it. First, there is the widely debated issue of whether Spinoza’s theory of conatus should be interpreted teleologically or non-teleologically. Is each mode trying to survive? Are modes goal-oriented things? Or is Spinoza simply claiming that everything that modes do helps them to survive (while not claiming that modes are acting purposively)?
Second, Spinoza’s argument for the theory of conatus (which takes place in Part III of the Ethics from propositions 4 to 6) has been subject to considerable scrutiny and many scholars have argued that it is multiply invalid. A few recent scholars have, however, attempted to defend Spinoza’s argument for his conatus theory against the charge of invalidity. Garrett 2002, for example, provides an influential defense of the validity of the argument. Likewise, Waller (2009) provides a partial defense of the first third of the argument.
Spinoza clearly denies the claim that God or Nature has a purpose or plan for the universe. The universe simply exists because it could not fail to exist. God did not make the universe with any predetermined goal or plan in mind; instead the universe simply follows from God’s essence in just the way that the properties of a triangle follow from the essence of the triangle (E1p16, E1p32c1, E1p33). In the Appendix to Part I of the Ethics Spinoza claims that
[People] find—both in themselves and outside themselves—many means that are very helpful in seeking their own advantage, for example, eyes for seeing, teeth for chewing, plants and animals for food, the sun for light, the sea for supporting fish. Hence, they consider all natural things as means to their own advantage. And knowing that they had found these means, not provided them for themselves, they had reason to believe that there was someone else who had prepared the means for their use … And since they had never heard anything about the temperament of these rules, they had to judge from themselves. Hence, they maintained that the gods direct all things for the use of men in order to bind men to them and be held by men in the highest honor. … But while they sought to show that Nature does nothing in vain (that is, nothing not of use to men), they seem to have shown only that Nature and the gods are as mad as man. … Not many words will be required to show that Nature has no end set before it, and that all final causes are nothing but human fictions (Ethics Part I, Appendix.)
The earth does not exist so that we may live on it. The universe is not designed for the good of human beings. The universe has no purpose; it simply exists. These ideas were revolutionary in the seventeenth century and remain controversial even today.
But some scholars (most influentially, Bennett 1984) argue that Spinoza’s rejection of purpose or goals in nature goes much further than a simple rejection of Divine purposes or goals—Bennett argue that Spinoza rejects all purposive or goal directed activities whatsoever, including human purposive action. The claim that human actions are not purposive or goal-oriented is startling and presents us with a very different theory of what human beings are.
To understand the impact of this claim, consider the following example: if I walk across the room to get a drink of water, we might believe that this activity is purposive or goal-oriented. I am walking across the room in order to get a glass of water. My behavior is partly explained in the common sense view by my goal or purpose (that is, getting a drink of water.) Bennett 1984, 240-251, however, claims that according to Spinoza this explanation of my behavior must be wrong. According to Bennett’s Spinoza, I do not walk across the room in order to get water. Rather I walk across the room because my organs were organized in a certain way such that when light strikes my eyes, it moves certain parts of my brain, which in turn moves certain tendons in my legs, which in turn causes my legs to move back and forth in certain ways, carrying my body to the counter, moving my hand toward the water fountain, etc. That is, my behavior can be fully and completely understood mechanistically, just like a watch. The springs inside a watch do not move so that the watch may indicate the correct time, rather the clock indicates the correct time because the springs and levers move in a certain way. Similarly with human beings, they do not walk in order to get to certain places; they get to certain places because they walk. (When considering a human being under the attribute of thought, Spinoza would claim that certain ideas follow logically from other ideas in just the way that certain effects follow necessarily from certain causes in the physical world.) In just the way that the universe exists without any purpose or goal, so every action performed by every human similarly is done for no purpose or goal. We do what we do simply because we could not fail to—our actions simply follow from the organization of our many complex parts.
Bennett’s interpretation of Spinoza as denying all purposive or goal-oriented action is controversial because Spinoza does claim in a number of different places that while the whole of nature has no purpose or ultimate goal, individuals do act purposively. In the Appendix to Part I, where Spinoza makes his clearest claims against Divine purposes, he also claims that “men act always on account of an end.” This passage and other similar ones have been a problem for Bennett’s interpretation. (See Curley 1990 and Bennett 1990 for more on this debate.)
The issue of whether purposive action is possible is important to the interpretation of Spinoza’s theory of conatus. Does Spinoza’s theory of conatus entail that every physical thing—every animal, plant, rock, planet, solar system, idea, and mind—acts in order to persevere in its own being? Is all of nature goal-oriented, even though the whole of nature is not? Some (including Garrett 1999) think so. If Garrett is right, then Spinoza’s physical theory may be a lot closer to Aristotle’s than it is to Descartes’. Spinoza does not seem fully consistent on the point. In the words of one recent scholar, Spinoza is “having trouble getting the blind efficient causality of the new science and the end-governed efficient causality of human activity into the same frame, so to speak” (Carriero 2005, 146.) When Spinoza attempts to treat all of nature, including human behavior and emotions, in a completely deterministic scientific way—as if human beings were just complicated clocks—he struggles to remain consistent.
The argument for Spinoza’s claim that everything strives to persevere in its own being is found at the very beginning of Part III of the Ethics. The argument is usefully summarized by Garrett 2002 as follows:
That is, Spinoza begins by arguing that no thing can destroy itself (E3p4). He argues for this claim on the basis of the claim that the definition affirms and does not deny the thing’s essence. From the claim that no thing can destroy itself, Spinoza then infers that no two things which can destroy each other can be parts of the same whole (E3p5.) From this claim Spinoza infers that each thing must strive to persevere in its own being (E3p6).
There seem to be numerous invalid inferences here. The first occurs right at the beginning of the argument. In the first three lines, Spinoza infers that since a definition of something does not contain anything inconsistent with the thing, that a thing contains nothing contrary to its own nature. But this inference seems invalid. If we understand a definition to be a statement of a thing’s essence (see E2d2), then it does validly follow that the essence includes nothing inconsistent with itself (if the essence were internally inconsistent, then it could not exist.) But it does not follow that a thing cannot have certain accidental properties (not mentioned in the definition) which are capable of destroying the thing. Thus, Spinoza seems to mistakenly infer a claim about the whole thing (both essential and accidental properties) from a premise which merely concerns the essence. (See Bennett 1984, 234-237; Della Rocca 1996b, 202-206. For a recent defense of Spinoza’s argument see Waller forthcoming.)
Another invalid inference occurs toward the end of the argument in lines 6 and 11. Spinoza infers that since two things cannot both be parts of the same whole, they must actively oppose one another. However, perhaps they could simply be in a passive relation to one another. It is one thing to passively resist, and it is quite another to actively resist. (See Garber 1994, 61-63 for more on this objection and its roots in Leibniz.) A few recent scholars have attempted to respond to these charges on Spinoza’s behalf. See, for example, Garrett 2002.
Eastern Illinois University
Last updated: July 1, 2009 | Originally published: July 1, 2009
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