Benedict de Spinoza was among the most important of the post-Cartesian philosophers who flourished in the second half of the 17th century. He made significant contributions in virtually every area of philosophy, and his writings reveal the influence of such divergent sources as Stoicism, Jewish Rationalism, Machiavelli, Hobbes, Descartes, and a variety of heterodox religious thinkers of his day. For this reason he is difficult to categorize, though he is usually counted, along with Descartes and Leibniz, as one of the three major Rationalists. Given Spinoza’s devaluation of sense perception as a means of acquiring knowledge, his description of a purely intellectual form of cognition, and his idealization of geometry as a model for philosophy, this categorization is fair. But it should not blind us to the eclecticism of his pursuits, nor to the striking originality of his thought.
Among philosophers, Spinoza is best known for his Ethics, a monumental work that presents an ethical vision unfolding out of a monistic metaphysics in which God and Nature are identified. God is no longer the transcendent creator of the universe who rules it via providence, but Nature itself, understood as an infinite, necessary, and fully deterministic system of which humans are a part. Humans find happiness only through a rational understanding of this system and their place within it. On account of this and the many other provocative positions he advocates, Spinoza has remained an enormously controversial figure. For many, he is the harbinger of enlightened modernity who calls us to live by the guidance of reason. For others, he is the enemy of the traditions that sustain us and the denier of what is noble within us. After a review of Spinoza’s life and works, this article examines the main themes of his philosophy, primarily as they are set forth in the Ethics.
Spinoza came into the world a Jew. Born in 1632, he was the son of Marrano parents. They had immigrated to Amsterdam from Portugal in order to escape the Inquisition that had spread across the Iberian Peninsula and live in the relatively tolerant atmosphere of Holland. Spinoza’s father, Michael, was a successful merchant and a respected member of the community. His mother, Hanna, the second of Michael’s three wives, died in 1638, just before Spinoza was to turn six.
The young Spinoza, given the name Baruch, was educated in his congregation’s academy, the Talmud Torah school. There he received the kind of education that the community deemed necessary to constitute one as an educated Jew. This largely consisted of religious study , including instruction in Hebrew, liturgy, Torah, prophetic writings, and rabbinical commentaries. Although Spinoza no doubt excelled in these, he did not move on to the higher levels of study which focused on the Talmud and were typically undertaken by those preparing for the rabbinate. Whether by desire or by necessity, Spinoza left the school in order to work in his father’s business, which he eventually took over with his half-brother, Gabriel.
The Jewish community in Amsterdam was by no means a closed one , but Spinoza’s commercial activities put him in touch with more diverse currents of thought than those to which he had hitherto been exposed. Most significantly, he came into contact with so-called ‘free-thinking’ Protestants – dissenters from the dominant Calvinism – who maintained a lively interest in a wide range of theological issues, as well as in the latest developments in philosophy and science. This naturally included the work of Descartes, which was regarded by many in Holland to be the most promising of several alternatives to scholasticism that had emerged in recent decades. In order to discuss their interests, these free-thinkers organized themselves into small groups, they called colleges, which met on a regular basis. Spinoza may have attended such meetings as early as the first half of the 1650′s, and it is most likely here that he received his first exposure to Cartesian thought.
This is not to say that Spinoza ceased to mine the resources of his own tradition – he became steeped, for example, in the writings of such philosophically important figures as Maimonides and Gersonides – but his intellectual horizons were expanding and he was experiencing a restlessness that drove him to look further afield. It was at this time that he placed himself under the tutelage of an ex-Jesuit, Franciscus Van den Enden, who had recently set up a Latin school in Amsterdam. Van den Enden turned out to be the perfect teacher for Spinoza. In addition to having an excellent reputation as a Latinist, he was a medical doctor who kept abreast of all that was new in the sciences. He was also notorious for his allegedly irreligious cast of mind, and he was a passionate advocate of democratic political ideals. It is safe to say that Spinoza’s studies with Van den Enden included more than lessons on how to decline nouns.
Spinoza’s intellectual reorientation, however, came at a cost . His increasingly unorthodox views and, perhaps, laxity in his observance of the Jewish law strained his relations with the community. Tensions became so great that, in 1656, the elders of the synagogue undertook proceedings to excommunicate him. Without providing details, the writ of excommunication accuses him of ‘abominable heresies’ and ‘monstrous deeds’. It then levels a series of curses against him and prohibits others from communicating with him, doing business with him, reading anything he might write, or even coming into close proximity with him. Spinoza may still have been a Jew, but he was now an outcast.
Little is known about Spinoza’s activities in the years immediately following his excommunication. He continued his studies with Van den Enden and occasionally took up residence in his teacher’s home. As it was now impossible for him to carry on in commerce, it was most likely at this time that he took up lens grinding as an occupation. There is also evidence that he traveled periodically to Leiden to study at the university. There he would have received formal instruction in Cartesian philosophy and become familiar with the work of prominent Dutch Cartesians. In 1661, he settled near Leiden, in the town of Rijnsburg.
It was during this same period, in the late 1650′s, that Spinoza embarked upon his literary career. His first work, the Treatise on the Emendation of the Intellect, is an attempt to formulate a philosophical method that would allow the mind to form the clear and distinct ideas that are necessary for its perfection. It contains, in addition, reflection upon the various kinds of knowledge, an extended treatment of definition, and a lengthy analysis of the nature and causes of doubt. For reasons that are unknown, theTreatise was left unfinished, though it appears that Spinoza always intended to complete it. Shortly thereafter, while in Rijnsburg, Spinoza set to work on his Short Treatise on God, Man, and His Well-Being. This work, circulated privately among friends, foreshadows many of the themes of his mature work, the Ethics. Most notably, it contains an unambiguous statement of the most famous of Spinoza’s theses – the identity of God and Nature.
Spinoza’s stay in Rijnsburg was brief. In 1663 he moved to the town of Voorburg, not far from The Hague, where he settled into a quiet, but busy, life. At the behest of friends, he immediately set about preparing for publication a set of lessons that he had given to a student in Leiden on Descartes’sPrinciples of Philosophy. The result was the only work that he was to publish under his own name, now Latinized to Benedict: René Descartes’s Principles of Philosophy, Parts I and II, Demonstrated According to the Geometric Method by Benedict de Spinoza of Amsterdam. As a condition of publication, Spinoza had his friend, Lodewijk Meyer, write a preface to the work, warning the reader that his aim was exposition only and that he did not endorse all of Descartes’s conclusions. He also appended a short piece, entitled Metaphysical Thoughts, in which he sketched some of his own views. Despite his admiration for Descartes, Spinoza did not want to be seen as a Cartesian.
Spinoza’s work on Descartes shows him to have been interested from early on in the use of geometric method in philosophy. In addition to putting parts of the Principles into geometric form, he began experimenting with geometric demonstrations of material taken from his own Short Treatise. It was out of this experimentation that the idea arose for a fully geometric presentation of his thought. He began work on this sometime in the early 1660′s, and by 1665 substantial portions of what was to become theEthics were circulating in draft form among his friends back in Amsterdam. Though he was well into the project by then, the political and religious climate of the day made Spinoza hesitant to complete it . He chose to exercise caution and suspended work on it, turning instead to a book that would prepare an audience receptive to the Ethics. This was the Theological-Political Treatise, which he completed and published anonymously in 1670.
Spinoza’s aim in the Theological-Political Treatise was to argue that the stability and security of society is not undermined but, rather, enhanced by freedom of thought, meaning primarily the freedom to philosophize. As is clear from the text, he considered the primary threat to this freedom emanated from the clergy, whom he accused of playing upon the fears and superstitions of people in order to maintain power. His solution was to divest the clergy of all political power, even to the point of placing authority over the practice of religion in the hands of the sovereign. The sovereign, Spinoza argued, should extend broad liberties within this domain, requiring adherence to no more than a minimal creed that was neutral with respect to competing sects and the meaning of which was open to a variety of interpretations. This, he hoped, would allow philosophers the freedom to do their work unencumbered by the constraints of sectarianism.
As was to be expected, the Theological-Political Treatise was met with a firestorm of criticism. It was condemned as a work of evil, and its author was accused of having nefarious intentions in writing it. Even some of Spinoza’s closest friends were deeply unsettled by it. Though he had assiduously tried to avoid it, Spinoza found himself embroiled in heated religious controversy and saddled with a reputation for atheism, something he greatly resented.
Spinoza’s last move, in 1670, was to The Hague, where he was to live out his remaining years. Besides having to deal with fallout from his Theological-Political Treatise, he witnessed a political revolution that culminated in the murder of the Grand Pensionary of Holland, Jan De Witt, along with his brother, Cornelius, by an angry mob of Orangist-Calvinists. Spinoza admired De Witt for his liberal policies and was horrified at the murder. With the ascent of the Orangist-Calvinist faction, he felt his own situation to be tenuous.
Despite these distractions, Spinoza pressed on. He undertook new projects, including the writing of a Hebrew grammar, and he turned back to work on the Ethics. Given the hostility with which theTheological-Political Treatise was met and the realities of the new political landscape, he must have done so with a deep sense of pessimism about its chances for success. By 1675 it was complete. As he perceived his enemies to have grown in influence and opportunity, however, Spinoza decided against publishing it. Public viewing of the definitive statement of his philosophy would have to wait until after his death.
By this time Spinoza was in a state of failing health. Weakened by a respiratory illness, he devoted the last year of his life to writing a work of political philosophy, his Political Treatise. Though left unfinished at his death, Spinoza’s intention was to show how governments of all types could be improved and to argue for the superiority of democracy over other forms of political organization. Following the lead of Machiavelli and Hobbes, his argument was to be non-utopian, based on a realistic assessment of human nature drawn from the psychological theory set forth in the Ethics. In the part he did finish, Spinoza showed himself to be an astute analyst of diverse constitutional forms and an original thinker among liberal social contract theorists.
Spinoza died peacefully in his rented room in The Hague in 1677. He left no will, but the manuscripts of his unpublished works – the Treatise on the Emendation of the Intellect, the Ethics, the Hebrew Grammar, and the Political Treatise – along with his correspondence were found in in his desk. These were immediately shipped to Amsterdam for publication, and in short order they appeared in print as B.D.S. Opus Posthuma. But even in death Spinoza could not escape controversy; in 1678, these works were banned throughout Holland.
Upon opening Spinoza’s masterpiece, the Ethics, one is immediately struck by its form. It is written in the style of a geometrical treatise, much like Euclid’s Elements, with each book comprising a set of definitions, axioms, propositions, scholia, and other features that make up the formal apparatus of geometry. One wonders why Spinoza would have employed this mode of presentation. The effort it required must have been enormous, and the result is a work that only the most dedicated of readers can make their way through.
Some of this is explained by the fact that the seventeenth century was a time in which geometry was enjoying a resurgence of interest and was held in extraordinarily high esteem, especially within the intellectual circles in which Spinoza moved. We may add to this the fact that Spinoza, though not a Cartesian, was an avid student of Descartes’s works. As is well known, Descartes was the leading advocate of the use of geometric method within philosophy, and his Meditations was written more geometrico, in the geometrical style. In this respect the Ethics can be said to be Cartesian in inspiration.
While this characterization is true, it needs qualification. The Meditations and the Ethics are very different works, not just in substance, but also in style. In order to understand this difference one must take into account the distinction between two types of geometrical method, the analytic and the synthetic. Descartes explains this distinction as follows:
Analysis shows the true way by means of which the thing in question was discovered methodically and as it were a priori, so that if the reader is willing to follow it and give sufficient attention to all points, he will make the thing his own and understand it just as perfectly as if he had discovered it for himself. . . . . Synthesis, by contrast, employs a directly opposite method where the search is, as it were, a posteriori . . . . It demonstrates the conclusion clearly and employs a long series of definitions, postulates, axioms, theorems and problems, so that if anyone denies one of the conclusions it can be shown at once that it is contained in what has gone before, and hence the reader, however argumentative or stubborn he may be, is compelled to give his assent. (CSM II,110-111)
The analytic method is the way of discovery. Its aim is to lead the mind to the apprehension of primary truths that can serve as the foundation of a discipline. The synthetic method is the way of invention. Its aim is to build up from a set of primary truths a system of results, each of which is fully established on the basis of what has come before. As the Meditations is a work whose explicit aim is to establish the foundations of scientific knowledge, it is appropriate that it employs the analytic method. The Ethics, however, has another aim, one for which the synthetic method is appropriate.
As its title indicates, the Ethics is a work of ethical philosophy. Its ultimate aim is to aid us in the attainment of happiness, which is to be found in the intellectual love of God. This love, according to Spinoza, arises out of the knowledge that we gain of the divine essence insofar as we see how the essences of singular things follow of necessity from it. In view of this, it is easy to see why Spinoza favored the synthetic method. Beginning with propositions concerning God, he was able to employ it to show how all other things can be derived from God. In grasping the order of propositions as they are demonstrated in the Ethics, we thus attain a kind of knowledge that approximates the knowledge that underwrites human happiness. We are, as it were, put on the road towards happiness. Of the two methods it is only the synthetic method that is suitable for this purpose.
Although the Ethics is not principally a work of metaphysics, the system it lays out stands as one of the great monuments in the tradition of grand metaphysical speculation. What is perhaps most noteworthy about this system is that it is a species of monism – the doctrine that all of reality is in some significant sense one. In Spinoza’s case, this is exemplified by the claim that there is one and only one substance. This substance he identifies as God. While monism has had its defenders in the west, they have been few and far between. Spinoza is arguably the greatest among them.
Spinoza builds his case for substance monism in a tightly reasoned argument that culminates in IP14. We may best follow the course of this argument by taking it in three parts. First, we examine four definitions that play a crucial role in the argument. Second, we look at two propositions to which the demonstration of IP14 appeals. And third, we turn to the demonstration of IP14 itself.
Among the eight definitions that open Book One of the Ethics, the following four are most important to the argument for substance monism:
ID3: By substance I understand what is in itself and is conceived through itself, that is, that whose concept does not require the concept of another thing, from which it must be formed.
This definition has two components. First, a substance is what exists in itself. This is to say that it is an ultimate metaphysical subject. While other things may exist as features of a substance, substance does not exist as a feature of anything else. Second, a substance is what is conceived through itself. This is to say that the idea of a substance does not involve the idea of any other thing. Substances are both ontologically and conceptually independent.
ID4: By attribute I understand what the intellect perceives of a substance, as constituting its essence.
An attribute is not just any property of a substance – it is its very essence. So close is the association of an attribute and the substance of which it is an attribute that Spinoza denies that there is a real distinction between them.
ID5: By mode I understand the affections of a substance, or that which is in another through which it is also conceived.
A mode is what exists in another and is conceived through another. Specifically, it exists as a modification or an affection of a substance and cannot be conceived apart from it. In contrast to substances, modes are ontologically and conceptually dependent.
ID6: By God I understand a being absolutely infinite, that is, a substance consisting of an infinity of attributes, of which each one expresses an eternal and infinite essence.
God is an infinite substance. By this Spinoza means both that the number of God’s attributes is unlimited and that there is no attribute that God does not possess. As we make our way through the Ethics, we learn that only two of these attributes can be known by the human mind. These are thought and extension.
Spinoza moves from these definitions to demonstrate a series of propositions concerning substance in general and God in particular on the basis of which he will demonstrate that God is the one and only substance. The following two propositions are landmarks in the overall argument and are explicitly invoked in the demonstration of IP14:
IP5: In Nature there cannot be two or more substances of the same nature or attribute.
In support of this proposition, Spinoza argues that if two or more substances were to exist they would be differentiated either by a difference in modes or by a difference in attributes. However, they could not be differentiated by a difference in modes, for substances are prior in nature to their modes. Thus, they would have to be differentiated by a difference in attributes. Controversially, Spinoza takes this to entail that no two substances can have exactly the same set of attributes, nor can they have a common attribute. Substances must be entirely dissimilar to one another.
IP11: God, or a substance consisting of infinite attributes, each of which expresses eternal and infinite essence, necessarily exists.
In support of this proposition, Spinoza offers a variant of the so-called Ontological Argument. The basic consideration upon which this variant rests is that it pertains to the nature of substance to exist. Spinoza establishes this earlier, in IP7, by appealing to the fact that substances, being entirely dissimilar to one another, cannot produce one another. Since nothing else can produce a substance, substances must be self-caused, which is to say that it pertains to the nature of substance to exist. To imagine that God does not exist is thus absurd. As a substance consisting of infinite attributes, it pertains to the divine nature to exist.
With these propositions in place, Spinoza has everything he needs to demonstrate that there is one and only one substance and that this substance is God:
IP14: Except God, no substance can be or be conceived.
The demonstration of this proposition is exceedingly simple. God exists (by IP11). Since God possesses every attribute (by ID6), if any substance other than God were to exist, it would possess an attribute in common with God. But, since there cannot be two or more substances with a common attribute (by IP5), there can be no substance other than God. God is the one and only substance.
The implications of this proposition are startling, and Spinoza can be seen to be working them out through the remainder of the Ethics. Most obviously, this proposition marks a break with the substance pluralism advocated by the majority of philosophers in the west. Even Descartes, from whom Spinoza learned much in the area of metaphysics, posited a plurality of mental and physical substances, along with God, whom he regarded as the paradigm of a substance. More importantly, it signals a rejection of classical theism, the idea that God is the creator of the universe who remains ontologically distinct from it and governs it according to his sovereign will. Spinoza has nothing but scorn for this idea and dismisses it as a product of the imagination. How it is that he reconceptualizes the relation between God, the infinite substance, and the order of finite things, becomes clear only as we turn to his account of the modal system.
In line with his rejection of classical theism, Spinoza famously identifies God with Nature. Nature is no longer seen as a power that is distinct from and subordinate to God, but as a power that is one and the same with divine power. Spinoza’s phrase ‘Deus sive Natura’ (‘God or Nature’) captures this identification and is justly celebrated as a succinct expression of his metaphysics. In isolation, however, the phrase is relatively uninformative. It tells us nothing about how Spinoza, having rejected the creator/creation relation posited by the classical model, conceives of the relation between God and the system of modes.
To fill out his thoughts on this matter, Spinoza distinguishes between Nature taken in its active or productive aspect, which he identifies with God or the divine attributes, and Nature taken in its derivative or produced aspect, which he identifies with the system of modes. The former he calls Natura naturans(literally: Nature naturing) and the latter he calls Natura naturata (literally: Natura natured). Spinoza’s use of these formulas is revealing in two respects. First, his double employment of ‘Natura‘ signals the ontological unity that exists between God and the system of modes. Each mode within the system is a modification of nothing other than the very substance that is God. Second, his employment of the active ‘naturans‘ in the first and the passive ‘naturata‘ in the second signals a causal relation between God and the modal system. God is not merely the subject of modes; he is an active power that produces and sustains them.
In view of the ontological unity that exists between God and the modal system, Spinoza is careful to specify that the divine causality is immanent rather that transitive. What this means is that God’s causal activity does not pass outside of the divine substance to produce external effects, as it would if God were a creator in the traditional sense. Rather, it remains wholly within the divine substance to produce the multitude of modes that constitute the modal system. Spinoza likens this to the way in which the nature of a triangle is productive of its own essential properties: “From God’s supreme power, or infinite nature, infinitely many things in infinitely many modes, that is, all things, have necessarily flowed, or always follow, by the same necessity and in the same way as from the nature of a triangle it follows, from eternity and to eternity, that its three angles are equal to two right angles” (IP17S1). The entire modal system, Natura naturata, follows immanently from the divine nature, Natura naturans.
Into this relatively simple picture, Spinoza introduces a complication. There are, he says, two types of mode. The first consists in what he calls infinite and eternal modes. These are pervasive features of the universe, each of which follows from the divine nature insofar as it follows from the absolute nature of one or another of God’s attributes. Examples include motion and rest under the attribute of extension and infinite intellect under the attribute of thought. The second consists in what may be called finite and temporal modes, which are simply the singular things that populate the universe. Modes of this type follow from the divine nature as well, but do so only as each follows from one or another of God’s attributes insofar as it is modified by a modification that is itself finite and temporal. Examples include individual bodies under the attribute of extension and individual ideas under the attribute of thought.
Unfortunately, Spinoza does little to explain either what these infinite and eternal modes are or what relation they have to finite and temporal modes. Taking their cue from a statement in the Treatise on the Emendation of the Intellect that the laws of nature are embedded in the infinite and eternal modes, many commentators have suggested that Spinoza thought of these modes as governing the manner in which finite modes affect one another. For example, if laws of impact are somehow embedded in the infinite and eternal mode motion and rest, then the outcome of any particular collision will be determined by that mode together with the relevant properties (speed, direction, size, etc) of the bodies involved. If this is correct, then Spinoza envisions every finite mode to be fully determined by intersecting lines of causality: a horizontal line that stretches back through the series of antecedent finite modes and a vertical line that moves up through the series of infinite modes and terminates in one or another of the attributes of God.
However it may be that Spinoza ultimately conceives of the relation between infinite and finite modes, he is clear about one thing – the system of modes is an entirely deterministic system in which everything is fully determined to be and to act:
IP29: In nature there is nothing contingent, but all things have been determined from the necessity of the divine nature to exist and produce an effect in a certain way.
Spinoza reminds us that God’s existence is necessary. It pertains to the very nature of substance to exist. Furthermore, since each and every mode follows from the necessity of the divine nature, either from the absolute nature of one or another of God’s attributes, as is the case with the infinite and eternal modes, or from one or another of God’s attributes insofar as it is modified by a modification that is finite, as is the case with the finite modes, they are all necessary as well. Since there is nothing other than the divine substance and its modes, there is nothing that is contingent. Any appearance of contingency is the result of a defect in knowledge, either of God or of the order of causes. Accordingly, Spinoza makes it central to his theory of knowledge that to know a thing adequately is to know it in its necessity, as it has been fully determined by its causes.
An obvious question to ask at this point is whether it is possible for finite modes falling under one attribute to act upon and determine finite modes falling under another attribute. Spinoza’s answer is an unambiguous no. Causal relations exist only among modes falling under the same attribute. His explanation for this may be traced back to an axiom set forth at the beginning of Book One:
IA4: The knowledge of an effect depends on, and involves, the knowledge of its cause.
Given this axiom, if a finite mode falling under one attribute were to have God as its cause insofar as he is considered under a different attribute, i.e., if it were to be caused by a finite mode falling under a different attribute, then the knowledge of that mode would involve the knowledge of that other attribute. Since it does not, that mode cannot have God as its cause insofar as he is considered under some other attribute. In other words, it cannot be caused by a finite mode falling under some other attribute.
When applied to modes falling under those attributes of which we have knowledge – thought and extension – this has an enormously important consequence. There can be no causal interaction between ideas and bodies. This does not mean that ideas and bodies are unrelated to one another. Indeed, it is one of the best-known theses in the Ethics that the lines of causation that run among them are strictly parallel:
IIP7: The order and connection of ideas is the same as the order and connection of things.
In the demonstration of this proposition Spinoza says that it is a consequence of IA4 and leaves it at that. Nevertheless, it is apparent that this proposition has deep foundations in his substance monism. As thought and extension are not attributes of distinct substances, so ideas and bodies are not modes of distinct substances. They are “one and the same thing, but expressed two ways” (IIP7S). If ideas and bodies are one and the same thing, however, their order and connection must be the same. The doctrine of substance monism in this way insures that ideas and bodies, though causally independent, are causally parallel.
It is at this point that Spinoza’s metaphysics touches upon his theory of mind and yields some of its most profound consequences. Most obviously, substance monism prohibits him from affirming the kind of dualism that Descartes affirmed, one in which mind and body are conceived as distinct substances. What is more, his contention that modes falling under different attributes have no causal interaction but are causally parallel to one another prohibits him from affirming that mind and body interact. Because he takes seriously the reality of the mental while rejecting dualism and eliminating interaction, Spinoza’s views on the mind are generally given a sympathetic hearing in a way that Descartes’s views are not.
To understand Spinoza’s account of the mind we must begin with IIP7. This proposition, together with its scholium, commits him to the thesis that for each finite mode of extension there exists a finite mode of thought that corresponds to it and from which it is not really distinct. More elaborately, it commits him to the thesis that (1) for each simple body there exists a simple idea that corresponds to it and from which it is not really distinct and (2) for each composite body there exists a composite idea that corresponds to it and from which it is not really distinct, composed, as it were, of ideas corresponding to each of the bodies of which the composite body is composed. Spinoza counts all of these ideas, whether simple or composite, as minds. In this respect he does not consider the human mind to be unique. It is simply the idea that corresponds to the human body.
In taking this position, Spinoza does not mean to imply that all minds are alike. As minds are expressions of the bodies to which they correspond in the domain of thought, some have abilities that others do not. Simply put, the greater the capacity of a body for acting and being acted upon, the greater the capacity of the mind that corresponds to it for perception. Spinoza elaborates:
[I]n proportion as a body is more capable than others of doing many things at once, or being acted on in many ways at once, so its mind is more capable than others of perceiving many things at once. And in proportion as the actions of a body depend more on itself alone, and as other bodies concur with it less in acting, so its mind is more capable of understanding distinctly. And from these [truths] we know the excellence of one mind over the others. (IIP13S)
Herein lies the explanation of the excellence of the human mind. The human body, as a highly complex composite of many simple bodies, is able to act and be acted upon in myriad ways that other bodies cannot. The human mind, as an expression of that body in the domain of thought, mirrors the body in being a highly complex composite of many simple ideas and is thus possessed of perceptual capacities exceeding those of other, non-human minds. Only a mind that corresponds to a body of complexity comparable to that of the human body can have perceptual abilities comparable to those of the human mind.
A perceptual ability that is of particular interest to Spinoza is imagination. This he takes to be a general capacity of representing external bodies as present, whether they are actually present or not. Imagination thus includes more than the capacity to form those mental constructs that we normally consider to be imaginative. It includes memory and sense perception as well. Since it is clearly impossible to get around in the world without this, Spinoza concedes that it is “in this way [that] I know almost all the things that are useful in life” (TIE 22).
That being said, Spinoza consistently opposes imagination to intellect and views it as providing no more than confused perception. To use his preferred terminology, the ideas of the imagination are inadequate. They may be essential for getting around in the world, but they give us a distorted and incomplete picture of the things in it. To understand why, it is useful to begin with sense perception. This is the most important form of imaginative perception, and it is from this form that all others derive.
On Spinoza’s account, sense perception has its origin in the action of an external body upon one or another of the sensory organs of one’s own body. From this there arises a complex series of changes in what amounts to the body’s nervous system. As the mind is the idea of the body, it will represent these changes. This, Spinoza contends, is what constitutes sense perception.
In order to explain how this act of representation yields perception of an external body, Spinoza appeals to the fact that the changed state of one’s body is a function both of the nature of one’s body and the nature of the external body that caused that state. Because of this, the mind’s representation of that state will express something more than the nature of one’s own body. It will express the nature of the external body as well:
IIP16: The idea of any mode in which the human body is affected by external bodies must involve the nature of the human body and at the same time the nature of the external body.
It is this feature of the mind’s act of representation – that it expresses the nature of an external body – that explains how such an act constitutes sense perception.
In view of this it is not difficult to see why Spinoza judges sense perception to be inadequate. Grounded as it is in the mind’s representation of the state of one’s own body rather than in the direct representation of external bodies, sense perception is indirect. Since this goes for all imaginative ideas, the problem with them all is the same:
IIP16C2: It follows, second, that the ideas which we have of external bodies indicate the condition of our own body more than the nature of the external bodies.
It is because of this that Spinoza refers to the ideas of the imagination as confused. The vision they give of external bodies is unavoidably colored, so to speak, by the lens of one’s own body.
Confusion, however, is just one aspect of the inadequacy of imaginative ideas. Such ideas are also mutilated. The reason for this lies in IA4, which states that the knowledge of an effect depends upon and involves the knowledge of its causes. This is a condition that imaginative ideas can never satisfy. The mind may contain the idea of an external body, but it cannot contain ideas of all of the causes of that body. These, being infinite, fall outside of its scope and are fully contained only in God’s infinite intellect. God’s ideas of bodies may be adequate, but ours are not. They are cut off from those ideas that are necessary in order to render them adequate.
Although imaginative ideas of external bodies are the most important examples of inadequate ideas, they are not the only examples. Spinoza goes on to show that the mind’s ideas of the body, its duration, and its parts are all inadequate. So too is the mind’s idea of itself. Even so, he remains optimistic about the possibility of adequate ideas.
This optimism becomes evident as Spinoza shifts his attention from imaginative ideas of singular things to intellectual ideas of common things. These common things are things that are either common to all bodies or common to the human body and certain bodies by which the human body is regularly affected. Spinoza tells us little else about these common things, except to say that they are fully present in the whole and in each of the parts of every body in which they are present. Nevertheless, it is fairly certain that the class of things common to all bodies includes the attribute of extension and the infinite and eternal mode of motion and rest. What is included in the class of things common to the human body and those bodies by which the human body is regularly affected is not so certain. Whatever they turn out to be, however, Spinoza assures us that our ideas of them can only be adequate.
To see why, consider some thing, A, that is common to the human body and some body by which the human body is affected. A, Spinoza contends, will be fully present in the affection that arises in the human body as a result of the action of the external body, just as it is in the two bodies themselves. As a result, the mind, in possessing the idea of that affection, not only will have the idea of A, but its idea will be neither confused nor mutilated. The mind’s idea of A will be adequate.
This result is of utmost importance. Because any idea that follows from an adequate idea is itself adequate, these ideas, appropriately called common notions, can serve as axioms in a deductive system. When working out this system, the mind engages in a fundamentally different kind of cognition than when it engages in any of the various forms of imaginative perception. In all forms of imaginative perception the order of ideas mirrors the order of bodily affections, and this order, depending as it does upon the chance encounters of the body with external bodies, is entirely fortuitous. By contrast, the derivation of adequate ideas from common notions within a deductive system follows a wholly different order. This Spinoza calls the order of reason. The paradigm case is geometry.
With this distinction between adequate and inadequate perception in place, Spinoza introduces a set of further distinctions. He begins with inadequate perception, which he now calls knowledge of the first kind, and divides it into two parts. The first consists of knowledge from random experience (experientia vaga). This is knowledge “from singular things which have been represented to us through the senses in a way which is mutilated, confused, and without order for the intellect”(P40S2). The second consists of knowledge from signs (ex signis), “for example, from the fact that, having heard or read certain words, we recollect things, and form certain ideas of them, like those through which we imagine the things”(P40S2). What links both of these forms of knowledge is that they lack a rational order. It is obvious that knowledge from random experience follows the order of the affections of the human body, but so does knowledge from signs. A Roman who hears the word ‘pomum‘, for instance, will think of an apple, not because there is any rational connection between the word and the object, but only because they have been associated in his or her experience.
When we reach what Spinoza calls the second kind of knowledge, reason (ratio), we have ascended from an inadequate to an adequate perception of things. This type of knowledge is gained “from the fact that we have common notions and adequate ideas of the properties of things” (P40S2). What Spinoza has in mind here is what was just indicated, namely, the formation of adequate ideas of the common properties of things and the movement by way of deductive inference to the formation of adequate ideas of other common properties. Unlike in the case of knowledge of the first kind, this order of ideas is rational.
We might think that in attaining this second kind of knowledge we have attained all that is available to us. However, Spinoza adds a third type, which he regards as superior. He calls this intuitive knowledge (scientia intuitiva) and tells us that it “proceeds from an adequate idea of the formal essence of certain attributes of God to the adequate knowledge of the [formal] essence of things”(P40S2). Unfortunately, Spinoza is once again obscure at a crucial junction, and it is difficult to know what he has in mind here. He seems to be envisioning a type of knowledge that gives insight into the essence of some singular thing together with an understanding of how that essence follows of necessity from the essence of God. Furthermore, the characterization of this kind of knowledge as intuitive indicates that the connection between the individual essence and the essence of God is grasped in a single act of apprehension and is not arrived at by any kind of deductive process. How this is possible is never explained.
Problems of obscurity aside, we can still see something of the ideal at which Spinoza is aiming. Inadequate ideas are incomplete. Through them we perceive things without perceiving the causes that determine them to be, and it is for this reason that we imagine them to be contingent. What Spinoza is offering with the third kind of knowledge is a way of correcting this. It is important to note, however, that he is not proposing that we can have this knowledge with respect to the durational existence of any particular item. As we have already seen, this would require having ideas of all of the temporal causes of a thing, which are infinite. Rather, he is proposing that we can have it with respect to the essence of a singular thing as it follows from the essence of God. To have this kind of knowledge is to understand the thing as necessary rather than contingent. It is, to use Spinoza’s famous phrase, to regard it sub quadam specie aeternitatis, under a certain aspect of eternity.
One of the most interesting but understudied areas of Spinoza’s thought is his psychology, the centerpiece of which is his theory of the affects. Spinoza, of course, was not the first philosopher to take an interest in the affects. He had only to look to the work of Descartes and Hobbes in the previous generation and to the work of the Stoics before them to find sustained discussions of the topic. His own work shows that he learned much from these thinkers.
Despite his debts, Spinoza expressed deep dissatisfaction with the views of those who had preceded him. His dissatisfaction reflects the naturalistic orientation that he wished to bring to the subject:
Most of those who have written about the affects, and men’s way of living, seem to treat, not of natural things, which follow the common laws of Nature, but of things which are outside Nature. Indeed they seem to conceive man in Nature as a dominion within a dominion. For they believe that man disturbs, rather than follows, the order of Nature, that he has absolute power over his actions, and that he is determined only by himself. (III Preface)
In opposition to what he saw as a tendency on the part of previous philosophers to treat humans as exceptions to the natural order, Spinoza proposes to treat them as subject to the same laws and causal determinants as everything else. What emerges can best be described as a mechanistic theory of the affects.
In working out this new perspective, the first thing on Spinoza’s agenda is to clear away what he sees as the most pervasive confusion that we as humans have about ourselves. This is the belief in free-will. Spinoza has nothing but scorn for this belief and treats it as a delusion that arises from the fact that the ideas we have of our actions are inadequate. “[M]en believe themselves to be free,” he writes, “because they are conscious of their own actions and are ignorant of the causes by which they are determined” (IIIP2S). If we were to acquire adequate ideas of our actions, since these would carry with them knowledge of their causes, we would immediately see this belief as the delusion that it is.
Spinoza’s position on this matter is quite obviously dictated by the determinism of his metaphysics. The mind, as a finite mode, is fully determined to be and to act by other finite modes. To posit a faculty of will by which it is made autonomous and independent of external causal determinants is to remove it from nature. Spinoza will have none of this. As it is fully part of nature, the mind must be understood according to the same principles that govern all modes.
The first and most important of these principles is what has come to be known as the Conatus Principle:
IIIP6: Each thing, as far as it can by its own power, strives to persevere in being.
The correct interpretation of this principle is far from clear, but it appears to posit a kind of existential inertia within modes. Each mode, to the extent of its power, so acts as to resist the destruction or diminution of its being. Spinoza expresses this by saying that each mode has an innate striving (conatus) to persevere in being. This striving is so central to what a mode is that he identifies it as a mode’s very essence:
IIIP7: The striving by which each thing strives to persevere in its being is nothing but the actual essence of the thing.
Though a bit mysterious as to what it means to say that the striving of a mode is its essence, this identification will play a key role in Spinoza’s ethical theory. Among other things, it will provide the basis upon which he can determine what is involved in living by the guidance of reason.
Spinoza begins his account of the affects with those that result from the action of external causes upon the mind. These are the passive affects, or passions. He identifies three as primary – joy, sadness, and desire – and characterizes all others as involving a combination of one or more of these together with some kind of cognitive state. Love and hate, for example, are joy and sadness coupled with an awareness of their respective causes. Longing, for example, is desire coupled with a memory of the desired object and an awareness of its absence. All remaining passions are characterized in a similar fashion.
Although joy, sadness, and desire are primitive, they are each defined in relation to the mind’s striving for perseverance. Joy is that affect by which the mind passes to a greater perfection, understood as an increased power of striving. Sadness is that affect by which the mind passes to a lesser perfection, understood as a decreased power of striving. And desire is the striving for perseverance itself insofar as the mind is conscious of it. Because all passions are derived from these primary affects, the entire passional life of the mind is thus defined in relation to the striving for perseverance.
This may seem paradoxical. Insofar as the mind strives to persevere in being it would appear to be active rather than passive. This is true, but we must realize that the mind strives both insofar as it has adequate ideas and insofar as it has inadequate ideas. The passions are defined only in relation to the mind’s striving insofar as it has inadequate ideas. In fact, the passions are themselves a species of inadequate ideas. And since all inadequate ideas are caused from without, so too are the passions. It is in this respect that they must be considered to be passive rather than active.
This, however, is not the case with those affects that are defined in relation to the mind’s striving insofar as it has adequate ideas. All such affects, being themselves a species of adequate ideas, are active. Mirroring his analysis of the passions, Spinoza takes two of these as primitive – active joy and active desire – and treats the remainder as derivative. (He does not acknowledge the possibility of an active form of sadness, since the diminishment of the mind’s perfection, which is what is involved in sadness, can only occur through the action of external causes.) In doing so, he posits an element within the affective life that is not only active, but, because it is grounded in the mind’s striving insofar as it has adequate ideas, is fully rational. It is a central concern of Spinoza’s ethical program to maximize this element.
That Spinoza would wish to maximize the active affects is understandable in light of his characterization of life led under the sway of the passions. Such a life is one in which the individual exercises little effective self-control and is buffeted by external circumstances in ways that are largely random. “The man who is subject to the [passive] affects,” Spinoza writes, “is under the control, not of himself, but of fortune, in whose power he so greatly is that often, though he sees the better for himself, he is still forced to follow the worse” (IV Preface). Life under the sway of the passions is a life of bondage.
Unfortunately, the extent to which we can extricate ourselves from the sway of the passions is limited. There are two reasons for this. The first is that the mind is a mode of limited power, yet it is inserted into an order of nature in which there exists an infinite number of modes whose power surpasses its own. To think that the mind can exist unaffected within this order is to assume, falsely, that it is endowed with infinite power or that nothing in nature acts upon it. The second, which is a specification of the first, is that an affect is not restrained merely because it is opposed by reason. It must be opposed by an affect that is stronger than it. The trouble is that reason often lacks this affective power. This is because the strength of the active affects, which pertain to reason, is a function of the strength of the mind alone, whereas the strength of the passive affects, the passions, is a function of the strength of their external causes, which in many cases is greater. In such cases reason is unable to overrule passion and is impotent as a guide. “With this,” Spinoza concludes, “I have shown the cause why men are moved more by opinion than by true reason, and why the true knowledge of good and evil arouses disturbances of the mind, and often yields to lust of every kind” (IV17S). Such is the life of bondage.
It is from this rather pessimistic diagnosis of the human condition that Spinoza’s ethical theory takes off. In view of this, it is not at all surprising that his ethics is largely one of liberation, a liberation that is directly tied to the cultivation of reason. In this respect, Spinoza’s ethical orientation is much more akin to that of the ancients than to that of his fellow moderns. Like the ancients, he sought not so much to analyze the nature and source of moral duty as to describe the ideal human life. This is the life that is lived by the so-called ‘free-man’. It is a life of one who lives by the guidance of reason rather than under the sway of the passions.
In the opening propositions of Book Five, Spinoza lists a number of respects in which the mind, despite its condition of bondage, is able to weaken the hold that the passions have over it. Generally speaking, it is able to do this insofar as it acquires adequate ideas. This, Spinoza tells us, is due to the fact that “the power of the mind is defined by knowledge alone, whereas lack of power, or passion, is judged solely by the privation of knowledge, that is, by that through which ideas are called inadequate” (VP20S). Two examples illustrate this liberating power of adequate ideas.
First, Spinoza claims that the mind is able to form adequate ideas of its affects. It can thus form adequate ideas of the passions, which are themselves inadequate ideas. Since there is no real distinction between an idea and the idea of that idea, those passions of which the mind forms adequate ideas are thereby dissolved.
Second, the effect of a thing upon the mind is lessened to the extent that it is understood to be necessary rather than contingent. We tend, for example, to be saddened less by the loss of a good when we understand that its loss was inevitable. Similarly, we tend to be angered less by another person’s actions when we understand that he or she could not have done otherwise. Since adequate ideas present things as necessary rather than as contingent, the acquisition of such ideas thereby lessens their effect upon the mind.
As these examples illustrate, the mind’s power over the passions is a function of the adequate ideas that it possess. Liberation lies in the acquisition of knowledge, which empowers the mind and renders it less susceptible to external circumstances. In taking this position, Spinoza places himself in a long tradition that stretches back to the Stoics and ultimately to Socrates.
Spinoza tells us that the model human life – the life lived by the ‘free-man’ – is one that is lived by the guidance of reason rather than under the sway of the passions. This tells us very little, however, unless we know what it is that reason prescribes. In order to make this determination, Spinoza falls back upon the mind’s striving for perseverance:
Since reason demands nothing contrary to Nature, it demands that everyone love himself, seek his own advantage, what is really useful to him, want what will really lead a man to greater perfection, and absolutely, that everyone should strive to preserve his own being as far as he can. This, indeed, is as necessarily true as that the whole is greater than its part. (IVP18S)
Reason’s prescription is egoistic. We are to act in accordance with our nature. But since our nature is identical to our striving to persevere in being, reason prescribes that we do whatever is to our advantage and seek whatever aids us in our striving. To act this way, Spinoza insists, is to act virtuously.
This does not mean that in living by the guidance of reason we necessarily place ourselves at odds with others. Reason prescribes that individuals seek whatever aids in the striving for perseverance. But since the goods that are necessary in order to persevere in being are attainable only within the context of social life, reason dictates that we act in ways that are conducive to the stability and harmony of society. Spinoza goes so far as to say that in a society in which everyone lives by the guidance of reason, there would be no need of political authority to restrict action. It is only insofar as individuals live under the sway of the passions that they come into conflict with one another and are in need of political authority. Those who live by the guidance of reason understand this and recognize that authority as legitimate.
Spinoza’s contention that those who live by the guidance of reason will naturally live in harmony with one another receives some support from his view of the highest good for a human. This is the knowledge of God. Since this knowledge can be possessed equally by all who seek it, it can be sought by all without drawing any into conflict.
To establish that the knowledge of God is the highest good, Spinoza again appeals to the fact that the mind’s striving is its essence. Since what follows from the mind’s essence alone are adequate ideas, this allows him to construe the mind’s striving as a striving for adequate ideas. It is a striving for understanding:
IVP26: What we strive for from reason is nothing but understanding; nor does the mind, insofar as it uses reason, judge anything else useful to itself except what leads to understanding.
From here it is but an easy step to show that the knowledge of God is the mind’s greatest good. As an infinite substance, God is the greatest thing that can be conceived. Moreover, since everything other than God is a mode of God, and since modes can neither be nor be conceived without the substance of which they are modes, nothing else can be or be conceived apart from God. Spinoza concludes:
IVP28: Knowledge of God is the mind’s greatest good: its greatest virtue is to know God.
The knowledge of God is the fulfillment of the mind’s striving to persevere in being.
In elaborating this thesis, Spinoza specifies this knowledge as knowledge of the third kind. This is the knowledge that proceeds from the adequate idea of one or another of God’s attributes to the adequate idea of the formal essence of some singular thing that follows from that attribute. When we possess knowledge of the third kind, we possess adequate perception of God’s essence considered not only in itself, but as the immanent causal power of the particular modifications to which it is subject. Knowledge of the first kind, because it is inadequate, and knowledge of the second kind, because it is restricted to the common properties of things, both fail to give us this.
In attaining the third kind of knowledge the mind passes to the highest state of perfection that is available to it. As a result, it experiences active joy to the greatest possible degree. More importantly, since it is by this kind of knowledge that the mind understands God to be the cause of its own perfection, it gives rise to an active love for God as well. This Spinoza refers to as the intellectual love of God. It is the affective correlate to the third kind of knowledge.
The intellectual love of God turns out to have a great many unique properties. Among other things, it is entirely constant, it has no contraries, and it is the very love by which God loves himself. Most significantly, it constitutes the blessedness of the one who possesses it. When such a love dominates one’s affective life, one attains the serenity and freedom from passion that is the mark of wisdom. Spinoza thus writes of the person who has attained this love that he “is hardly troubled in spirit, but being, by a certain eternal necessity, conscious of himself, and of God, and of things, he never ceases to be, but always possess true peace of mind” (VP42S). This is human blessedness.
Spinoza’s comment that a person who has attained the intellectual love of God “never ceases to be” is perplexing to say the least. It signals a commitment to the view that in some fashion or another the mind, or some part of it, survives the death of the body:
VP23: The human mind cannot be absolutely destroyed with the body, but something of it remains which is eternal.
At first sight, this appears to be in violation of Spinoza’s anti-dualist contention that mind and body are one and the same thing conceived under two different attributes. On the basis of this contention, one would expect him to reject the survival of the mind in any fashion. That he asserts it instead has understandably been a source of great controversy among his commentators.
At least some of the problem can be cleared away by taking account of a crucial distinction that Spinoza makes between the existence of the body and its essence. The existence of the body is its actual duration through time. This involves its coming to be, the changes it undergoes within its environment, and its eventual destruction. By contrast, the essence of the body is non-durational. It is grounded in the timeless essence of God, specifically as one among the innumerable particular ways of being extended.
The importance of this distinction lies in the fact that, by appealing to the parallelism doctrine, Spinoza can conclude that there is a corresponding distinction with respect to the mind. There is an aspect of the mind that is the expression of the existence of the body, and there is an aspect of the mind that is the expression of the essence of the body. Spinoza readily concedes that the aspect of the mind that expresses the existence of the body cannot survive the destruction of the body. It is destroyed with the destruction of the body. Such, however, is not the fate of the aspect of the mind that expresses the essence of the body. Like its object, this aspect of the mind is non-durational. Since only what is durational ceases to be, this aspect of the mind is unaffected by the destruction of the body. It is eternal.
Here we must be careful not to misunderstand what Spinoza is saying. In particular, we should not take him to be offering anything approaching a full-blooded doctrine of personal immortality. In fact, he dismisses the belief in personal immortality as arising from confusion: “If we attend to the common opinion of men, we shall see that they are indeed conscious of the eternity of their mind, but that they confuse it with duration, and attribute it to the imagination, or memory, which they believe remains after death” (VP34S). Individuals have some awareness of the eternity of their own minds. But they mistakenly believe that this eternity pertains to the durational aspect of the mind, the imagination. As it is the imagination, inclusive of memory, that constitutes one’s unique identity as a person, the belief in personal immortality is similarly mistaken.
None of this is to say that Spinoza’s doctrine of the eternity of the mind has no relevance to ethics. Although the imagination is not eternal, the intellect is. And since the intellect is constituted by the mind’s store of adequate ideas, the mind is eternal precisely to the extent that it has these ideas. As a consequence, a person whose mind is constituted largely by adequate ideas participates more fully in eternity than a person whose mind is constituted largely by inadequate ideas. So, while Spinoza offers us no hope of personal immortality, we may take consolation in the fact that “death is less harmful to us, the greater the mind’s clear and distinct knowledge, and hence, the more the mind loves God” (VP38S).
Spinoza does not pretend that any of this is easy. The acquisition of adequate ideas, especially those by which we attain knowledge of the third kind, is difficult, and we can never completely escape the influence of the passions. Nevertheless, Spinoza holds out to those who make the effort the promise, not of personal immortality, but of participation in eternity within this life. He closes the Ethics with these words:
If the way I have shown to lead to these things now seems very hard, still, it can be found. And of course, what is found so rarely must be hard. For if salvation were at hand, and could be found without great effort, how could nearly everyone neglect it? But all things excellent are as difficult as they are rare. (VP42S)
All passages from the texts of Spinoza are taken from the translations appearing in The Collected Works of Spinoza. Vol.I. Edited and translated by Edwin Curley. (Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1985). Passages from the Ethics are cited according to Book (I – V), Definition (D), Axiom (A), Proposition (P), Corollary (C), and Scholium (S). (IVP13S) refers to Ethics, Book IV, Proposition 13, Scholium. Passages from the Treatise on the Emendation of the Intellect are cited according to paragraph number. (TIE 35) refers to Treatise on the Emendation of the Intellect, paragraph 35.
All passages from the texts of Descartes are taken from the translations appearing in The Philosophical Writings of Descartes. 2 Vols. Edited and translated by John Cottingham, Robert Stoothoff & Dugald Murdoch (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1985). Passages are cited according to volume and page number. (CSM II,23) refers to Cottingham, Stoothoff & Murdoch, Volume II, page 23.
Blake D. Dutton
Loyola University Chicago
Last updated: July 7, 2005 | Originally published: