Elizabeth Cady Stanton was one of the most influential public figures in nineteenth-century America. She was one of the nation’s first feminist theorists and certainly one of its most productive activists. She was in the tradition of Abigail Adams, who implored her husband John to “remember the ladies” as he helped form the new American nation. Along with Susan B. Anthony, Stanton fueled the movement for women’s suffrage. She advocated for change in both the public and private lives of women–regarding property rights, equal education, employment opportunity, more liberal divorce provisions, and child custody rights. By addressing such a wide range of women’s issues, she laid down the foundation for the three main branches of feminism that are in existence today: Liberal feminism, which focuses on women’s similarities to men and emphasizes equality; cultural feminism, which celebrates women’s differences from men and aims for gender equity; and dominance feminism, which focuses on male power / female submission and aims to overturn all forms of gender hierarchy.
Stanton was motivated by liberal humanist ideals of egalitarianism and individual autonomy, which were an outgrowth of the Enlightenment. She was familiar with the philosophical thinkers whose works and ideas were discussed among American intellectuals at the time: Jean-Jacques Rousseau, Immanuel Kant, Mary Wollstonecraft, Johann Wolfgang Goethe, Alexis de Tocqueville, and later John Stuart Mill and Harriet Taylor Mill. Stanton’s writings and speeches demonstrate this. In addition, her years of studying and bantering with the apprentices in her father’s law office ensured that she was acquainted with the works of English legal theorists Edward Coke, William Blackstone, and Jeremy Bentham, as well as with those of her father’s influential colleagues, Joseph Story and James Kent.
Although she was theoretically minded, Stanton had no interest in living the life of an intellectual, removed from the hubbub of social and political life. In fact, her feminist theory grew out of the real-life problems women faced in her age and was developed to solve them. This places her squarely in the American tradition established by Benjamin Franklin, of developing philosophical thought that can be applied to everyday life. Stanton, then, could be termed an applied philosopher or a philosopher-practitioner. She did not seek out theory for theory’s sake, but instead put theory into practice for the purpose of improving social and political life.
Elizabeth Cady, the third surviving child and second of the five daughters of Margaret (formerly Livingston) and Daniel Cady (1773-1859), was born November 12, 1815, in Johnstown, New York. Her mother was from a well-to-do family with ties to the American Revolution. Margaret Livingston’s father had been a colonel in the Continental Army, assisting in the capture of John Andre, one of Benedict Arnold’s co-conspirators. Daniel Cady was a prominent lawyer and politician in the state of New York. He became a member of the New York State Assembly (1808-13), held office as a member of Congress (1815-17), and served on the New York Supreme Court (1847-54).
From a young age, Elizabeth was keenly aware of the gender-based power imbalances that were in place in her day. With bitterness, she later recounted the many times her father responded to her aspirations and achievements by declaiming that she should have been born a boy. After the death of her older brother, the only boy in the family to have reached adulthood, she resolved to do her best to fill the void his death left in her father’s life. She learned to play chess and ride a horse. She studied Greek with the family’s minister, the Rev. Simon Hosack. She entered Johnstown Academy and won prizes and awards. Though still unable to please and impress her father to her satisfaction, these moments clearly motivated her to achieve. In all likelihood, Daniel Cady was not quite as indifferent to his daughter’s achievements, nor as hostile to feminism as her memoir sometimes suggests. His laments that she was not a boy were perhaps more a recognition of the social constraints she would face as a grown woman than an expression of his own need for a son.
When Elizabeth was a child, she overheard a conversation her father had with a woman, a would-be client for whom the law provided no remedy. She voiced her dismay to her father, and this is the counsel he gave her: “When you are grown up, and able to prepare a speech, you must go down to Albany and talk to the legislators; tell them all you have seen in this office–the sufferings of these Scotchwomen . . . if you can persuade them to pass new laws, the old ones will be a dead letter” (Eighty Years, pp. 31-32). Prior to their conversation, young Elizabeth’s plan had been to destroy all the laws that were unjust to women by cutting them out of his law books! His advice gave her an alternative and foreshadowed the career she would make for herself as a reformer.
Born into a world of wealth and privilege, Elizabeth benefited from a better education than most girls were granted in her day. After attending Johnstown Academy, she entered the Troy Female Seminary. She felt it unjust that she was barred from attending the more academically rigorous Union College, then an all-male institution. While she gained greater understanding of women and feminine culture at Troy, overall her experience there convinced her that male-female co-education is superior to single-sex education. Seeing and visiting with men was such a novelty at Troy that it created an almost unnatural obsession with the other sex. In Elizabeth’s view it also exaggerated any differences between the genders and intensified the deficiencies of each.
Elizabeth did not complete a degree at Troy. In part this was because of the influence of the evangelist Charles Finney, a pivotal regional figure in America’s “Second Great Awakening”. Attendance at Finney’s revival sessions was mandatory at Troy, and several of her classmates were readily converted by his “fire and brimstone” sermons. Yet his preaching left Elizabeth terrified and perplexed. She considered his calls to give her heart to Jesus irrational, if not incomprehensible, and she refused to repent. Even so, she was still disturbed by the images of hell and damnation Finney had planted in her mind. Her parents, like many traditional Protestants, rejected the heightened emotionalism of Finney’s evangelical fervor and allowed her to withdraw from Troy. They treated her to a retreat in Niagara where all talk of religion was forbidden, so that she could settle herself and regain her spiritual bearings. After this exposure to Protestant revivalism, Elizabeth remained a religious skeptic for the rest of her life.
Elizabeth continued to study on her own after her time at Troy Seminary. She read the moral philosophy of George Combe and discussed the novels of Sir Walter Scott, James Fenimore Cooper, and Charles Dickens with her brother-in-law Edward Bayard. She also spent time with her intellectual and reform-minded cousins in nearby Peterboro, New York. These were the children of her mother’s sister Elizabeth (Livingston) and her husband Peter Smith.
In the Smith household, Elizabeth was exposed to a number of new people as well as to new social and political ideas. Her aunt and uncle were egalitarians not only in the ideal, but in the everyday, sense. Their home was open to African Americans on their way to freedom in Canada as well as to Oneida Indians they had befriended. It also teemed with activists and intellectuals who discussed, debated and strategized about the social and political events of the day–chief among them abolition. Her uncle, Peter Smith, was a staunch advocate of racial equality who sought an end to American slavery. Her cousin Gerrit Smith followed closely in his father’s footsteps. Gerrit and his friends in the abolition movement would not only influence Elizabeth, but introduce lifelong challenges as she and other social reformers sought to bring full equality to all people, regardless of color, creed, or gender.
It was at the home of her cousin, Gerrit Smith, that Elizabeth Cady met Henry Stanton, a man ten years her senior. He was already an extremely prominent and influential abolitionist orator. Beginning his career as a journalist, Stanton met Theodore Weld while attending the Rochester Manual Labor Institute and Weld was touring the country to learn more about manual labor schools. Both were compelling public speakers. Both were committed to social and political reform. And both had been influenced by Charles Finney. In Rochester, Stanton first met Finney when he was serving as replacement pastor at a local church. Like Weld–and in stark contrast to his future wife–Stanton was thoroughly impressed by Finney as an orator and theological thinker. In contrast to Elizabeth Cady’s response, the excesses of Finney’s fire and brimstone approach were of no concern to Stanton. He was simply full of awe and admiration for the man.
Stanton and Weld became lifelong friends, and at Weld’s behest, Stanton began attending the newly-established Lane Theological Seminary in 1832. Lane was based on the manual labor model and initially was a great success. In 1834 however, a student-sponsored debate over slavery raised the ire of the institution’s board of trustees, and a gag order was issued: Henceforth, no events related to political issues were to be held without prior approval from the board. Nearly half the students at the seminary–Stanton and Weld among them–withdrew from the institution in protest. Stanton then began working alongside Weld, first as an agent of the American Anti-Slavery Society, then as an officer of the organization. Studying law under Daniel Cady after he and Elizabeth married, Henry then became a lawyer and a political operative. He aspired to hold office himself, and succeeded in doing so for a short time in the early 1850s. However, he was mostly known as an orator, a social/political activist, and a journalist, writing for the Anti-Slavery Standard, The Liberator, The New York Tribune, and The New York Sun.
In the 1830s, Stanton was a frequent visitor to the Smith household and a chief contributor to their many discussions about social and political issues. When Elizabeth and Stanton met in 1839, she was under the illusion that he was already married. So her earliest interactions with him were as simply an acquaintance who shared his interest in abolition, not as a potential love interest. Once the two discovered the misunderstanding, they began courting against the wishes of Elizabeth’s father. Daniel Cady was no more fond of abolitionism than he was of social reformers in general, and Stanton’s personal cause with Cady was not helped by his questionable financial viability.
After succumbing to family pressure and breaking her engagement to Stanton, Elizabeth had a change of heart, and the two married hastily in May 1840. They then went to London, where Henry was due to serve as a delegate at the World Antislavery Convention. Well-known within women’s rights history is the fact that none of the female delegates at the meeting were allowed to take a seat on the convention floor, but were segregated behind a screen in the balcony. This enraged Elizabeth as well as other American women present, such as Lucretia Mott, Abby Southwick, and Elizabeth Neal. Significantly, Henry gave a speech in favor of full participation by the women present, but his support stopped there. He did not join William Lloyd Garrison and a handful of other male delegates when they sat in the women’s section as an act of protest against such overt inequality.
Henry Stanton’s moderate support of women’s rights in London signaled an ongoing point of disconnect between Elizabeth and her husband. His passion was for abolition. The suffragists and feminists argued that women needed more social and political freedom than they currently had. For Henry, however, the plight of slaves held in bondage, abused, oppressed, and murdered at their masters’ whim was a far greater concern than women’s liberty to fill out a ballot or to hold office. Elizabeth’s passion was for women’s rights. Certainly American slavery was cruel and unjust, but the system of oppression that permitted it was the same system that allowed men to rule over women with arbitrary and capricious authority. A woman who was married to a kind and egalitarian man was simply lucky. The legal system still maintained the power of all men over their wives, no matter how cruel and unkind they may be.
Biographers have debated whether Henry was truly an advocate of Elizabeth’s quest for women’s rights, merely moderately supportive, or actually antagonistic to both her quest and her stature as a suffragist. Like both Henry Blackwell and Theodore Weld, Stanton accepted Elizabeth’s decision to excise the word “obey” from the vows she spoke at their wedding. The minister performing the ceremony was troubled by this detour from convention, and Elizabeth was convinced that the lengthy prayer he offered after the ceremony–lasting nearly an hour–was payback for this crucial omission from their marriage vows. There is no evidence that the matter troubled her husband. Even so, others in their reform-minded circles went further to advance equality in marriage. Theodore Weld, who wed the feminist and abolitionist Angelina Grimke in 1838, vowed to treat his wife as an equal partner in their marriage. Marrying in 1855, Henry Blackwell went much further, denouncing marriage as an institution that enforced male dominance over women. In addition, Blackwell accepted Lucy Stone’s decision to keep her own surname after marriage, the first woman on record in America to have done so. Other male reformers supported or worked alongside their wives in the suffrage struggle. For example, Henry Blackwell spoke on behalf of women’s suffrage and essentially co-edited The Woman’s Journal with Stone. Clearly, Henry Stanton did not match this level of commitment to his wife’s suffrage work.
Yet the level of support that Henry Stanton gave to Elizabeth’s work as a women’s rights advocate must also be measured by the standard set by her father. Daniel Cady repeatedly lamented the fact that Elizabeth was female because he believed her intellect and forceful personality would go to waste in a woman. Women in the world they lived in were meant to attend to the hearth and home, not to go out into the world to become intellectuals or, worse still, rabble-rousing activists. At the same time, her father was not completely unmoved by seeing Elizabeth act on her convictions. After she read one of her upcoming women’s rights speeches to him, he asked if she–a woman of position, privilege, and relative power–genuinely believed that she was at a disadvantage as a woman. When Elizabeth responded by reminding him of all the laws that privileged men and harmed women, her father turned to his law books to provide her with another example that would help further illustrate her point. While never more than outwardly lukewarm to her feminist efforts, Daniel Cady often provided support in this way–giving her legal ammunition to use in her writings and speeches.
Elizabeth was accustomed to receiving only the dimmest signs of approval from her father. So as an adult, she neither expected nor needed the motivation of resounding applause for her suffrage work from Henry Stanton. She had found her calling as a women’s rights advocate, and though she was a formidable force at the podium, Henry was always able to write to his “Dear Lizzie” when the two were apart. Though not a proponent of women’s rights himself, he does not appear to have been hostile to her leadership role in the women’s movement. It simply seems that, like her father, he found it difficult to fully comprehend Elizabeth’s passion for women’s rights when he saw her as a woman of considerable privilege. Because both Elizabeth and Henry were fairly protective of their private life together, it may be impossible to know for certain how each felt about the other’s reform work. Each seems to have been impressed by the other’s achievements in their chosen reform efforts, though neither was exactly a cheerleader for the other’s cause.
After the London antislavery convention, Elizabeth and Henry toured Europe for six months, returning home in the winter and settling with Elizabeth’s parents. During this period, Henry studied law under Daniel Cady, before taking up a position in Boston in 1843. In Boston Elizabeth met prominent reformers and intellectuals, among them Lydia Maria Child, Frederick Douglass, Ralph Waldo Emerson, Margaret Fuller, Nathaniel Hawthorne, Robert Lowell, Abby Kelly, Elizabeth Palmer Peabody, John Greenleaf Whittier, and Paulina Wright. She regularly listened to the sermons of the radical Unitarian and abolitionist minister, Theodore Parker, and was eager to attend the “conversations” of Amos Bronson Alcott and Margaret Fuller. She also visited the utopian Brook Farm community, admiring its idealism, though not the spartan way of life of its inhabitants.
Elizabeth loved Boston, and the art, culture, and intellectual life it had to offer. The loss of all this made the adjustment to rural life difficult for her when, in 1847, the couple moved to Seneca Falls in upstate New York. But with a house generously provided by Daniel Cady for his daughter’s growing family, there was really no way the couple could refuse. By 1847 they had three children, and there would be more–each named in honor of a beloved family member or friend: David Cady (born 1842), Henry Brewster (1844), Gerrit Smith (1845), Theodore Weld (1851), Margaret Livingston (1852), Harriot Eaton (1856) and Robert Livingston (1859).
Elizabeth Cady Stanton became acquainted with women’s rights activists for the first time at the antislavery convention in London. Women’s abilities, achievements, and rights had been of concern to her since her youth, when she bantered with boys at Johnstown Academy and with the young men apprenticing at her father’s law office. Yet it was her experience as a housewife in Seneca Falls that prompted her to take action on behalf of women’s rights.
In her earliest years as a wife and mother, Cady Stanton found fulfillment in managing a household. In fact, she thrived on the day-to-day challenge to do so with order and efficiency. After a time, the novelty had worn off, and she found housework mundane and depressing. She also found herself sympathizing with everyday women who did not have the same access to power and privilege that she had. Assisting victims of domestic abuse in the area on several occasions, Cady Stanton saw how the same unjust laws that she had intuitively resented and wanted to change as a child were especially burdensome to women without means. Just at this point in her life, an invitation for a visit came from Lucretia Mott, who was only eight miles away in Waterloo. Cady Stanton eagerly took the trip to meet with Mott and other reformers in the community, and the idea was born to hold a convention to discuss women’s rights. In one afternoon, the group planned and announced the two-day meeting, the first of its kind. It was to be held only five days later. The event was a success that far exceeded the expectations of Cady Stanton and her convention co-planners. While a group of about fifty devoted social reformers from nearby Rochester and Syracuse were expected to participate, over two hundred people attended. Nearly seventy signed the Declaration of Sentiments, which Cady Stanton had authored, modeling it after the American Declaration of Independence.
The Seneca Falls Women’s Rights Convention was followed a month later by another such meeting in Rochester, thus setting in motion a tradition that was to shape the nineteenth century women’s movement. Conventions to discuss women’s rights were held annually between 1850 and 1860, with Elizabeth Cady Stanton and her good friend and colleague, Susan B. Anthony, playing complementary roles. Anthony was the strategist, tactician, and all-round logistics coordinator. Cady Stanton was the philosophical thinker, writer, and theoretician. Anthony sometimes chastised Cady Stanton for letting family obligations, namely childrearing, get in the way of her women’s rights work. At the same time, however, she was known to Elizabeth’s children as “Aunt Susan”. After they had turned seven they often went on extended visits to Anthony’s home in Rochester, a landmark in their lives later described with awe and wonder.
A network of countless brilliant and talented women worked to advance women’s rights in nineteenth-century America, among them Amelia Bloomer, Olympia Brown, Paulina Wright Davis, Abby Foster, Matilda Joslyn Gage, Frances Watkins Harper, Isabella Beecher Hooker, Julia Ward Howe, Mary Ashton Rice Livermore, Lucreita Mott, Ernestine Rose, Caroline Severance, Anna Howard Shaw, Lucy Stone, Sojourner Truth, Frances Willard and Victoria Woodhull. The lifelong friendship of two of them, Elizabeth Cady Stanton and Susan B. Anthony, makes for a unique and compelling story. On the surface, the two could not have been more different. Cady Stanton was born of privilege, had a forceful and sometimes challenging personality, was fond of luxury, was a religious skeptic, and refused to believe that women had to choose between motherhood and public activism. Anthony was not born into wealth, had a quiet and calm demeanor, eschewed self-indulgence, was a devout Quaker who later converted to Unitarianism, and felt strongly that domesticity seriously compromised women’s participation in public life. But for some reason, the contrasts between Cady Stanton and Anthony served to complement, rather than to compete with, each other. Anthony had a room in Cady Stanton’s home where she was welcome to stay at any time. When Cady Stanton was unable to attend a convention, Anthony would often read the speech Elizabeth had written. Writing with eloquence, Cady Stanton could pen an essay or speech with ease, an ability that Anthony greatly admired.
While the relationship between Stanton and Anthony remained stable, the movement they were part of was not always placid. During the Civil War, suffrage leaders agreed to focus on supporting the war effort, forming the Women’s Loyal League. Once the war had ended and slavery had been abolished, Stanton and Anthony joined Frederick Douglass and others to form the American Equal Suffrage Association. This organization was devoted to securing voting rights for newly-freed African Americans and for all women simultaneously. However, when the fifteenth amendment to the Constitution was being ratified without the word “sex” included in the text, the branch of the women’s suffrage movement that was led by Stanton and Anthony was outraged. The text read: “The right of citizens of the United States to vote shall not be denied or abridged by the United States or by any state on account of race, color, or previous condition of servitude”. It was inconceivable to Stanton and her colleagues that their male advocates had failed to bring women along in the struggle for voting rights. In response Stanton and her white female colleagues made arguments on behalf of women that today smack of elitism, if not outright racism. How, they asked, could persons who were uneducated and lacking autonomy while held for years in bondage be given the right to vote when well-educated and “cultured” white women continued to be treated like children at best, chattel at worst? In their anger, they allied themselves with race-baiters in the months prior to the amendment’s passage. Stanton, Anthony, and others felt strongly that any change to the constitution involving voting rights simply must be universal–it must include African American males and females, as well as white women and others who did not yet hold the franchise. Yet clearly the pair of activists were willing to turn a blind eye to the ways in which their arguments fueled the fires of race-hate across the nation.
The race issue contributed to a schism in the women’s movement that would last for two decades. Some women, led by Lucy Stone and joined by Julia Ward Howe and Caroline Severance, formed a new organization based in Boston, the American Woman’s Suffrage Association. The AWSA ultimately endorsed the amendment giving only African American males the vote, believing that their good will and co-operative spirit would be rewarded in time. Unfortunately the NWSA and the AWSA had to struggle to distinguish themselves from each other to the rank and file of women’s rights supporters. They printed rival publications to promote women’s rights from the perspective of the leaders of each organization. Stanton and Anthony published The Revolution (1868-1872) and Stone The Woman’s Journal (1870-1917). They also competed for members and political support. It was not until 1890 that the divided movement reunited and was renamed the National American Suffrage Association, continuing the voting rights struggle for another thirty years.
As noted, Elizabeth Cady Stanton was an eloquent and prolific writer. While she served as the philosopher of the suffrage movement, Susan B. Anthony served as its strategist. Historians have noted that their respective strengths complemented each other. Equally significant is the different approaches they took to securing rights for women. Anthony was single-minded in her quest for the vote as the stepping stone that would provide women access to all other rights. If only women could vote and hold public office, they would then be able to self-advocate: Women could vote for candidates with policies that empower and support women and their families. They could press for changes to laws related to marriage, divorce, and custody for children. Women could help enact any number of provisions that would give them more power and influence in society. If only they had the vote.
Stanton also believed in the power of voting rights, but she also saw no reason not to carry on the battle for women’s equality on all fronts at once. Women had needed property rights when legislatures began to pass them in the 1830s and ‘40s. They continued to need and deserve other rights related to property and financial self-determination in the 1860s, ‘70s, and ‘80s, and Stanton spoke out about how and why these rights should be granted. Similarly, laws dealing with the most intimate aspects of women’s lives–marriage, divorce, and child custody–merited attention in Stanton’s “here and now,” not at some future time when women would hold the power of the franchise.
Stanton’s published works addressed four main areas of feminist concern: personal/social freedom, marriage/family matters, legal/political rights and religion’s role and influence. Chief among the social constraints that restricted women’s freedom in Stanton’s day was access to education. She began discussing this subject early in her work as a reformer. Prohibitions against rigorous academic training for girls and women thwarted their intellectual growth and thus the levels of personal and social development they could achieve. The tradition of single-sex education further exacerbated this problem. The respective weaknesses of men and women (which Stanton believed were not natural to each gender but nurtured by social norms and values) were reinforced when they were deprived of interaction. This perpetuated the imbalance of power based on gender. The inferior education women received when Stanton began her work also had the potential to contribute to women’s moral inferiority. Without properly exercising their intellectual powers and being challenged to make difficult academic and moral distinctions, women were unable to function as independent decision-makers. This harmed not only women as individuals, but also the social institutions they are a part of: The family, the local community, and the state. In this sense, Stanton laid the foundation for what would later be called liberal feminism, a school of feminist thought which maintains that women are more similar to men than they are different from them. Thus, it aims for equal treatment of men and women, particularly in matters related to education, employment, pay equity and political participation.
Stanton was among the more bold women’s rights advocates in her era in that she took on issues relating to marriage that other suffragists considered off-limits. She and Anthony both referred to the institution of marriage as it existed in their time as “male marriage”, that is, a civil union made for and by men, which was used to perpetuate male power and authority. Among the most controversial was divorce. She was under none of the popular illusions that marriage was a blessed institution that, fairytale-like, brought out the best in people. She resented the suggestion that a virtuous and patient woman could persuade–through her love, faith or virtue–a domineering, alcoholic or abusive man to become a more kind and considerate husband. Women were only and always harmed by their relationships with such men in Stanton’s view. Their own moral character was compromised, as was the overall moral tone of their home and family. Speaking in favor of pending legislation in New York that would liberalize divorce policies, Stanton said that rather than prevent a woman from leaving an abusive and alcoholic husband, the law should prohibit such men from getting married. Such a policy would go much farther toward protecting the institution of marriage than the laws that prevailed in the day were able to do. Here we see in Stanton’s thought a kernel of what would later become dominance feminism. This is a branch of feminist thought that focuses on the differences between men and women. It concludes that, whether natural or socially constructed, gender distinctions are used to reinforce male dominance and female submission. Like Stanton, today’s dominance feminists are concerned with marriage and divorce. They also venture into territory that Stanton and her contemporaries only dared to hint at in the age of Victorian propriety: Domestic violence, rape, incest, pornography, and prostitution. The aim of dominance feminism is to overturn the male power structure that makes these abuses of women possible.
Stanton’s discussion of the legal and political rights of women is the best known within popular discussions of women’s history today. Women’s right to participate fully in public, political life was certainly of paramount importance to her. Over and over in her lectures and essays, Stanton emphasized the ways in which men’s dominance in public life disabled and disgraced women. With men as the chief arbiters of legal and political right, women were rendered “civilly dead” as Stanton so eloquently termed it at the Seneca Falls convention. Women were powerless to stop their husbands if they chose to squander the family’s resources, even if the source of those resources was the savings or inheritance that women themselves had brought into their households. Men made all the laws regarding education, employment, marriage, divorce, child custody, property, inheritance, breaches of the civil and the criminal codes–every aspect of life that could and did affect women’s lives, but over which women were powerless to effect change. Men thus became like monarchs ruling over all classes of society, who could readily wield tyrannical force, if they willed to do so. All the other social inequalities that concerned Stanton trickled down from this one arena–that of legal and political rights.
Significantly, when Stanton spoke in favor of universal suffrage–that is, of extending voting rights to not only all African American males but also to all women–after the Civil War, she cautioned against maintaining distinctions among the various classes of people in society. The entire class of African Americans held in slavery had been prohibited from voting since the founding of the country. As legislators considered extending the franchise, Stanton implored them to erase all similar social distinctions. Women should no longer be treated as a separate class of individuals who are prohibited from voting any more than newly freed African Americans should. On American soil, Stanton said, all citizens were to be granted equal consideration in this way.
This stance, too, created some friction for Stanton as the post-Civil War discourse on voting rights got underway. She and Anthony were absolutely unyielding in their call for women’s full political equality. While other suffragists, like Lucy Stone, were willing to consider partial suffrage, which would allow women to vote on local issues of concern to them, like education or municipal budgets, Stanton and Anthony held firm: Women are equal in all ways to men and should be treated as such. At times they displayed their own class biases on this point. Why should an ignorant and uneducated man of any race be granted the right to vote in all matters when well-educated and cultured women were allowed to vote only about matters like school policies and local road construction? Most critically, as the post-War discussion advanced and feminists were being urged to accept this as “the Negro’s hour” (as Frederick Douglass so famously put it), Lucy Stone and others were willing to surrender women’s voting rights for the time being to appease their allies in Congress. Stone and others assumed the discussion of women’s voting rights would be resumed in a timely fashion, but they believed that, for the peace of the nation, they needed to step aside temporarily. Stanton and Anthony saw the writing on the wall, as such, and held to insisting on female suffrage until the very last legislators had cast their vote. Ultimately, the controversy over universal suffrage resulted in the schism between Stone and her camp and the Stanton-Anthony coalition discussed above.
Stanton had always been critical of the ways in which the Christian churches contributed to women’s oppression, but she addressed this topic head-on in the last decade of her life. In publishing The Woman’s Bible, Stanton was far ahead of the feminist curve. Biblical criticism of any sort was relatively new, having been initiated in mid-nineteenth-century Germany by thinkers like Johann Gottfried Eichhorn (1752–1827), Wilhelm Martin Leberecht de Wette (1780–1849) and Julius Wellhausen (1844–1918). The idea of a largely secular examination of the Bible that investigated its implications, flaws and shortcomings as related to women was virtually unthought of.
The Woman’s Bible consists of a collection of essays by a committee of women intellectuals on passages of the Judeo-Christian scriptures that discuss women. Stanton and her colleagues took a critical approach to the story of Eve in the Garden of Eden, for instance. First of all, the story is deemed an allegory, not a factual account. Darwin’s theory of evolution provides us with a more plausible account of the development of human beings over time, not in one act of creation. Secondly, Eve is praised, rather than blamed, for taking the fruit, because this act demonstrates her thirst for knowledge. As one contributor stated it, “Fearless of death if she can gain wisdom [she] takes of the fruit” (The Woman’s Bible, p. 26). The work takes a similar realist approach to the story of Jesus’ life. Cady Stanton and her contributors readily write about him as a man, not as God nor even as God’s Son. Stanton’s view on the miracles he performed is that human development is such that any human being could perform miracles, if only they have the will to make themselves as pure and good as Jesus was.
Other passages, such as those that recount the marriages of the patriarchs, are discussed so as to reify ideals of marital love. In both the Old and New Testament passages, Stanton and her contributors highlight and heighten the role of the women in question. They put particular emphasis on Miriam’s role in the quest for Jewish freedom, for instance. They also discuss the important work of Deborah the judge, as well as of female disciples in the early Christian church, noting that they were committed to their cause and were conveyors of God’s word. In this sense, Stanton sowed the seed of cultural feminism–the ideal that women bring a special perspective and set of values to their participation in society. Therefore they bring a special set of values that needs to be recognized, understood, and appreciated.
The overall objective of The Woman’s Bible was to use textual analysis and historical criticism to dismantle the traditional interpretation of any one biblical passage and replace it with a feminine, if not a feminist, perspective. The effort was a success on this level. Though it went into additional printings, The Woman’s Bible brought Elizabeth Cady Stanton a great deal of criticism, more for her audacity in taking on the project than in what she actually said about the Bible or its merits.
Although Stanton’s efforts in The Woman’s Bible did not match the increasingly rigorous standards of her contemporaries in theology who were beginning their own critical examinations of the Jewish and Christian scriptures, neither did it fail as an intellectual exercise. This was simply a groundbreaking work, which called into question a number of widely accepted claims about the nature of God, God’s esteem for and relation to women, and women’s place within faith communities. It also paved the way for future work for and by women in religion in the twentieth century. Second wave feminists in the 1960s and 1970s, who were struggling for the full ordination of women in the Christian and Jewish traditions, relied heavily on this early work of early feminist criticism by Stanton. Academic women in the same era were inspired by her example and produced more modern and academically rigorous works that scrutinized sacred texts and religious traditions from a feminist perspective as well. Despite her own religious skepticism, Stanton would have been heartened to have seen a future in which over half of the students in mainstream Protestant seminaries are women, and the ordination of women is commonplace in liberal Protestant and Jewish traditions.
Certainly Elizabeth Cady Stanton had an immense amount of influence in her day; her influence and her legacy continue even if she is not always an overtly recognized source by today’s feminists. At the heart of her ideals and advocacy lies a blurring of the distinction between the “public” world of law and politics, and the “private” world of home and family–a distinction that held sway through so much of the eighteenth and nineteenth centuries. Feminists in the 1970s and ‘80s would craft a mantra of sorts that got to the heart of this distinction-blurring: “The personal is political”. Cady Stanton’s work is truly the source of such thinking. Stanton wanted the “public” realm, particularly law and politics, to be imported into the home. She wanted to bring an end to the abuse and neglect men were allowed to impose on women because the law turned a blind eye to domestic violence as a “private” matter. Other women activists of the day, such as Frances Willard the temperance activist, wanted to see women’s “private” virtues exported into the public realm: Give us access to the vote, and we will clean up the crime and corruption of the “public” political realm. Susan B. Anthony’s position represented a middle ground. She rejected the public/private distinction as much as Cady Stanton did, but she did so from a different angle and for different reasons. Access to the vote and the ability to hold public office would allow women to speak for themselves and act on their own behalf. If they are dissatisfied with the laws governing marriage and divorce, then give them voting rights and let them change such laws.
Fond of luxury and susceptible to self-indulgence all her life, Elizabeth Cady Stanton became obese late in life and suffered from maladies that were related to her overall poor health: Fading eyesight, decreased mobility and chronic fatigue. Even so she remained active and engaged in life, and optimistic that women would indeed succeed in winning the vote in the twentieth century. At the very least she could rest knowing that she had passed on the legacy of the suffrage struggle to her daughter’s generation of women’s rights activists. Stanton’s daughter, Harriot Stanton Blatch, was a feminist activist in her own right who helped compile the six-volume History of Woman’s Suffrage, which Stanton, Anthony, Matilda Joslyn Gage and others had begun in 1881. While her daughter was able to vote for the last twenty years of her life, Elizabeth Cady Stanton was never able to register a ballot. She died October 26, 1902, in New York City, just shy of eighteen years before the passage of the nineteenth amendment.
Montclair State University
Last updated: December 18, 2010 | Originally published: