Leslie Stephen was a 19th century British philosopher, man of letters, and first editor of the Dictionary of National Biography. The portion of his writings which bear upon philosophy is small only in relation to his total literary output. He was born in Kensington Gore on November 28, 1832. In 1842 Stephen’s parents moved to Brighton for the sake of his health. He attended a day school, but soon entered Eton College. His parents took a house at Windsor so that he could live at home. Stephen made little progress, and was removed by his father in 1846. He was later sent to King’s college, and later entered Cambridge’s Trinity Hall in 1850. He won a scholarship in mathematics and gained a reputation as an athlete. He was ordained a deacon in 1855, appointed junior tutor in 1856, and ordained a priest in 1859. In 1862 his position at Cambridge changed. His reading in Mill, Comte, and Kant led him to reject the historical evidences of Christianity. He declined to take part in the chapel services. Thereupon at the Master’s request, he resigned his tutorship. Hs skepticism steadily grew, and on in 1875 he relinquished his holy orders. When freed from his tutorial and clerical duties, his interests took a wider range, and he subsequently published in the fields of politics, literary criticism, and social criticism. Religious and philosophical speculation engaged much of his attention, and he presented his views in Fraser’s Magazine, and Fortnightly Review. A collection of religious and philosophical essays entitled Essays on Free Thinking and Plain Speaking came out in 1873. The book make him a leader of the agnostic school, and a chief challenger of popular religion, which he charged with being unable to satisfy genuine spiritual needs.
He devoted much of his time to his History of English Thought in the Eighteenth Century (1876) in which he explained the arguments of the old English deists and the skepticism of Hume. He places the philosophers and moralists in their due position in the whole literary activity of the period. A further stage of the same history —The English Utilitarians (1900) was completed toward the end of his life. That same year appeared his “An Agnostic’s Apology” in the Fortnightly Review; this further revealed his private convictions and helped familiarize the public with the term “agnostic” which had been invented in 1870 by Thomas Huxley, but had not yet become in vogue. In 1878 he joined the Metaphysical Society on the eve of its dissolution, and read two papers at its meetings, In 1882 he produced his Science of Ethics, in which he summed up his final conclusions on the dominant problems of life, in light of his study of Mill, Darwin, and Spencer. He devoted the remainder of his life to other literary projects and died in 1903 of cancer. After his death his monograph on Hobbes appeared (1904).
The first writers who worked out more general consequences of the theory of evolution were scientists with a philosophical turn of mind. Others outside the sciences soon followed in drawing out the consequences of evolution; Stephen was foremost among these, particularly in the area of the ethics. His own independent contribution is given in The Science of Ethics (1882). After Spencer’s Data, this is the first book which worked out an ethical view determined by the theory of evolution. He followed Mill and Darwin as an ally of the empirical and utilitarian creed; but he came to see that more extensive changes were necessary. Spencer’s compromise between hedonism and evolutionism failed to satisfy him, and he found the ethical bearing of evolution better expressed by the conception of social vitality than by that of pleasure. The great merit of the work consists in its presentation of the social content of morality in the individual mind as well as in the community; but it does not sufficiently recognize the distinction between the historical process traced by the evolution theory and the ethical validity which evolution is assumed to possess.
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Last updated: October 24, 2004 | Originally published: