Stilpo was a Philosopher of Megara and the most distinguished member of the Megarean school of ancient Greek philosophy. He was not only celebrated for his eloquence and skill in dialectics, but for the success with which he applied to moral precepts of philosophy to the correction of his natural propensities. Though in his youth he had been much addicted to intemperance and licentious pleasures, after he had ranked himself among philosophers he was never known to violate the laws of sobriety or chastity. With respect to riches he exercised a virtuous moderation. When Ptolemy Soter, at the taking of Megara, presented him with a large sum of money, and requested him to accompany him to Egypt, he returned the greater part of the present, and chose to retire, during Ptolemy’s stay at Megara, to the island of Aegina. Afterward, when Megara was again taken by Demetrius, son of Antigonus, the conqueror ordered the soldiers to spare the house of Stilpo; and, if anything should be taken from him in the hurry of the plunder, to restore it. So great was the fame of Stilpo, that when he visited Athens, the people ran out of their shops to see him, and even the most eminent philosophers of Athens took pleasure in attending his discourses.
On moral topics Stilpo is said to have taught that the highest happiness consists in a mind free from the dominion of passion, a doctrine similar to that of the Stoics. (Diog. Laert. ii. 113-118; Sen. Epist. 9).
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Last updated: October 24, 2004 | Originally published: October/24/2004
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