Stoic Ethics

The tremendous influence Stoicism has exerted on ethical thought from early Christianity through Immanuel Kant and into the twentieth century is rarely understood and even more rarely appreciated. Throughout history, Stoic ethical doctrines have both provoked harsh criticisms and inspired enthusiastic defenders. The Stoics defined the goal in life as living in agreement with nature. Humans, unlike all other animals, are constituted by nature to develop reason as adults, which transforms their understanding of themselves and their own true good. The Stoics held that virtue is the only real good and so is both necessary and, contrary to Aristotle, sufficient for happiness; it in no way depends on luck. The virtuous life is free of all passions, which are intrinsically disturbing and harmful to the soul, but includes appropriate emotive responses conditioned by rational understanding and the fulfillment of all one’s personal, social, professional, and civic responsibilities. The Stoics believed that the person who has achieved perfect consistency in the operation of his rational faculties, the “wise man,” is extremely rare, yet serves as a prescriptive ideal for all. The Stoics believed that progress toward this noble goal is both possible and vitally urgent.

Table of Contents

  1. Definition of the End
  2. Theory of Appropriation
  3. Good, Evil, and Indifferents
  4. Appropriate Acts and Perfect Acts
  5. Passions
  6. Moral Progress
  7. References and Further Reading

1. Definition of the End

Stoicism is known as a eudaimonistic theory, which means that the culmination of human endeavor or ‘end’ (telos) is eudaimonia, meaning very roughly “happiness” or “flourishing.” The Stoics defined this end as “living in agreement with nature.” “Nature” is a complex and multivalent concept for the Stoics, and so their definition of the goal or final end of human striving is very rich.

The first sense of the definition is living in accordance with nature as a whole, i.e. the entire cosmos. Cosmic nature (the universe), the Stoics firmly believed, is a rationally organized and well-ordered system, and indeed coextensive with the will of Zeus, the impersonal god. Consequently, all events that occur within the universe fit within a coherent, well-structured scheme that is providential. Since there is no room for chance within this rationally ordered system, the Stoics’ metaphysical determinism further dictated that this cosmic Nature is identical to fate. Thus at this level, “living in agreement with nature” means conforming one’s will with the sequence of events that are fated to occur in the rationally constituted universe, as providentially willed by Zeus.

Each type of thing within the universe has its own specific constitution and character. This second sense of ‘nature’ is what we use when we say it is the nature of fire to move upward. The manner in which living things come to be, change, and perish distinguishes them from the manner in which non-living things come to be, change, and cease to be. Thus the nature of plants is quite distinct from the nature of rocks and sand. To “live in agreement with nature” in this second sense would thus include, for example, metabolic functions: taking in nutrition, growth, reproduction, and expelling waste. A plant that is successful at performing these functions is a healthy, flourishing specimen.

In addition to basic metabolism, animals have the capacities of sense-perception, desire, and locomotion. Moreover, animals have an innate impulse to care for their offspring. Thus living in agreement with a creature’s animality involves more complex behaviors than those of a plant living in agreement with its nature. For an animal parent to neglect its own offspring would therefore be for it to behave contrary to its nature. The Stoics believed that compared to other animals, human beings are neither the strongest, nor the fastest, nor the best swimmers, nor able to fly. Instead, the distinct and uniquely human capacity is reason. Thus for human beings, “living in agreement with nature” means living in agreement with our special, innate endowment—the ability to reason.

2. Theory of Appropriation

The Stoics developed a sophisticated psychological theory to explain how the advent of reason fundamentally transforms the world view of human beings as they mature. This is the theory of ‘appropriation,’ or oikeiôsis, a technical term which scholars have also translated variously as “orientation,” “familiarization,” “affinity,” or “affiliation.” The word means the recognition of something as one’s own, as belonging to oneself. The opposite of oikeiôsis is allotriôsis, which neatly translates as “alienation.” According to the Stoic theory of appropriation, there are two different developmental stages. In the first stage, the innate, initial impulse of a living organism, plant, or animal is self-love and not pleasure, as the rival Epicureans contend. The organism is aware of its own constitution, though for plants this awareness is more primitive than it is for animals. This awareness involves the immediate recognition of its own body as “belonging to” itself. The creature is thus directed toward maintaining its constitution in its proper, i.e. its natural, condition. As a consequence, the organism is impelled to preserve itself by pursuing things that promote its own well-being and by avoiding things harmful to it. Pleasure is only a by-product of success in this activity. In the case of a human infant, for example, appropriation explains why the baby seeks his mother’s milk. But as the child matures, his constitution evolves. The child continues to love himself, but as he matures into adolescence his capacity for reason emerges and what he recognizes as his constitution, or self, is crucially transformed. Where he previously identified his constitution as his body, he begins to identify his constitution instead with his mental faculty (reason) in a certain relation to his body. In short, the self that he now loves is his rationality. Our human reason gives us an affinity with the cosmic reason, Nature, that guides the universe. The fully matured adult thus comes to identify his real self, his true good, with his completely developed, perfected rational soul. This best possible state of the rational soul is exactly what virtue is.

Whereas the first stage of the theory of appropriation gives an account of our relationship toward ourselves, the second stage explains our social relationship toward others. The Stoics observed that a parent is naturally impelled to love her own children and have concern for their welfare. Parental love is motivated by the child’s intimate affinity and likeness to her. But since we possess reason in common with all (or nearly all) human beings, we identify ourselves not only with our own immediate family, but with all members of the human race—they are all fellow members of our broader rational community. In this way the Stoics meant social appropriation to constitute an explanation of the natural genesis of altruism.

3. Good, Evil, and Indifferents

The Stoics defined the good as “what is complete according to nature for a rational being qua rational being” (Cicero Fin. III.33). As explained above, the perfected nature of a rational being is precisely the perfection of reason, and the perfection of reason is virtue. The Stoics maintained, quite controversially among ancient ethical thought, that the only thing that always contributes to happiness, as its necessary and sufficient condition, is virtue. Conversely, the only thing that necessitates misery and is “bad” or “evil” is the corruption of reason, namely vice. All other things were judged neither good nor evil, but instead fell into the class of “indifferents.” They were called “indifferents” because the Stoics held that these things in themselves neither contribute to nor detract from a happy life. Indifferents neither benefit nor harm since they can be used well and badly.

However, within the class of indifferents the Stoics distinguished the “preferred” from the “dispreferred.” (A third subclass contains the ‘absolute’ indifferents, e.g. whether the number of hairs on one’s head is odd or even, whether to bend or extend one’s finger.) Preferred indifferents are “according to nature.” Dispreferred indifferents are “contrary to nature.” This is because possession or use of the preferred indifferents usually promotes the natural condition of a person, and so selecting them is usually commended by reason. The preferred indifferents include life, health, pleasure, beauty, strength, wealth, good reputation, and noble birth. The dispreferred indifferents include death, disease, pain, ugliness, weakness, poverty, low repute, and ignoble birth. While it is usually appropriate to avoid the dispreferred indifferents, in unusual circumstances it may be virtuous to select them rather than avoid them. The virtue or vice of the agent is thus determined not by the possession of an indifferent, but rather by how it is used or selected. It is the virtuous use of indifferents that makes a life happy, the vicious use that makes it unhappy.

The Stoics elaborated a detailed taxonomy of virtue, dividing virtue into four main types: wisdom, justice, courage, and moderation. Wisdom is subdivided into good sense, good calculation, quick-wittedness, discretion, and resourcefulness. Justice is subdivided into piety, honesty, equity, and fair dealing. Courage is subdivided into endurance, confidence, high-mindedness, cheerfulness, and industriousness. Moderation is subdivided into good discipline, seemliness, modesty, and self-control. Similarly, the Stoics divide vice into foolishness, injustice, cowardice, intemperance, and the rest. The Stoics further maintained that the virtues are inter-entailing and constitute a unity: to have one is to have them all. They held that the same virtuous mind is wise, just, courageous, and moderate. Thus, the virtuous person is disposed in a certain way with respect to each of the individual virtues. To support their doctrine of the unity of virtue, the Stoics offered an analogy: just as someone is both a poet and an orator and a general but is still one individual, so too the virtues are unified but apply to different spheres of action.

4. Appropriate Acts and Perfect Acts

Once a human being has developed reason, his function is to perform “appropriate acts” or “proper functions.” The Stoics defined an appropriate act as “that which reason persuades one to do” or “that which when done admits of reasonable justification.” Maintaining one’s health is given as an example. Since health is neither good nor bad in itself, but rather is capable of being used well or badly, opting to maintain one’s health by, say, walking, must harmonize with all other actions the agent performs. Similarly, sacrificing one’s property is an example of an act that is only appropriate under certain circumstances. The performance of appropriate acts is only a necessary and not a sufficient condition of virtuous action. This is because the agent must have the correct understanding of the actions he performs. Specifically, his selections and rejections must form a continuous series of actions that is consistent with all of the virtues simultaneously. Each and every deed represents the totality and harmony of his moral integrity. The vast majority of people are non-virtuous because though they may follow reason correctly in honoring their parents, for example, they fail to conform to ‘the laws of life as a whole’ by acting appropriately with respect to all of the other virtues.

The scale of actions from vicious to virtuous can be laid out as follows: (1) Actions done “against the appropriate act,” which include neglecting one’s parents, not treating friends kindly, not behaving patriotically, and squandering one’s wealth in the wrong circumstances; (2) Intermediate appropriate actions in which the agent’s disposition is not suitably consistent, and so would not count as virtuous, although the action itself approximates proper conduct. Examples include honoring one’s parents, siblings, and country, socializing with friends, and sacrificing one’s wealth in the right circumstances; (3) “Perfect acts” performed in the right way by the agent with an absolutely rational, consistent, and formally perfect disposition. This perfect disposition is virtue.

5. Passions

As we have seen, only virtue is good and choiceworthy, and only its opposite, vice, is bad and to be avoided according to Stoic ethics. The vast majority of people fail to understand this. Ordinary people habitually and wrongly judge various objects and events to be good and bad that are in fact indifferent. The disposition to make a judgment disobedient to reason is the psychic disturbance the Stoics called passion (pathos). Since passion is an impulse (a movement of the soul) which is excessive and contrary to reason, it is irrational and contrary to nature. The four general types of passion are distress, fear, appetite, and pleasure. Distress and pleasure pertain to present objects, fear and appetite to future objects. The following table illustrates their relations.

Table of Four Passions (pathê)

Present Object
Future Object
Irrationally judged to be good
Pleasure
Appetite
Irrationally judged to be bad
Distress
Fear

Distress is an irrational contraction of the soul variously described as malice, envy, jealousy, pity, grief, worry, sorrow, annoyance, vexation, or anguish. Fear, an irrational shrinking of the soul, is expectation of something bad; hesitation, agony, shock, shame, panic, superstition, dread, and terror are classified under it. Appetite is an irrational stretching or swelling of the soul reaching for an expected good; it is also called want, yearning, hatred, quarrelsomeness, anger, wrath, intense sexual craving, or spiritedness. Pleasure is an irrational elation over what seems to be worth choosing; it includes rejoicing at another’s misfortunes, enchantment, self-gratification, and rapture.

The soul of the virtuous person, in contrast, is possessed of three good states or affective responses (eupatheiai). The three ‘good states’ of the soul are joy (chara), caution (eulabeia), and wish (boulêsis). Joy, the opposite of pleasure, is a reasonable elation; enjoyment, good spirits, and tranquility are classed under it. Caution, the opposite of fear, is a reasonable avoidance. Respect and sanctity are subtypes of caution. Wish, the opposite of appetite, is a reasonable striving also described as good will, kindliness, acceptance, or contentment. There is no “good feeling” counterpart to the passion of distress.

Table of Three Good States

Present Object
Future Object
Rationally judged to be good
Joy
Wish
Rationally judged to be bad
Caution

For example, the virtuous person experiences joy in the company of a friend, but recognizes that the presence of the friend is not itself a real good as virtue is, but only preferred. That is to say the company of the friend is to be sought so long as doing so in no way involves any vicious acts like a dereliction of his responsibilities to others. The friend’s absence does not hurt the soul of the virtuous person, only vice does. The vicious person’s soul, in contrast, is gripped by the passion of pleasure in the presence of, say, riches. When the wealth is lost, this irrational judgment will be replaced by the corresponding irrational judgment that poverty is really bad, thus making the vicious person miserable. Consequently, the virtuous person wishes to see his friend only if in the course of events it is good to happen. His wish is thus made with reservation (hupexhairesis): “I wish to see my friend if it is fated, if Zeus wills it.” If the event does not occur, then the virtuous person is not thwarted, and as a result he is not disappointed or unhappy. His wish is rational and in agreement with nature, both in the sense of being obedient to reason (which is distinctive of our human constitution) and in the sense of harmonizing with the series of events in the world.

The virtuous person is not passionless in the sense of being unfeeling like a statue. Rather, he mindfully distinguishes what makes a difference to his happiness—virtue and vice—from what does not. This firm and consistent understanding keeps the ups and downs of his life from spinning into the psychic disturbances or “pathologies” the Stoics understood passions to be.

6. Moral Progress

The early Stoics were fond of uncompromising dichotomies—all who are not wise are fools, all who are not free are slaves, all who are not virtuous are vicious, etc. The later Stoics distinguished within the class of fools between those making progress and those who are not. Although the wise man or sage was said to be rarer than the phoenix, it is useful to see the concept of the wise man functioning as a prescriptive ideal at which all can aim. This ideal is thus not an impossibly high target, its pursuit sheer futility. Rather, all who are not wise have the rational resources to persevere in their journey toward this ideal. Stoic teachers could employ this exalted image as a pedagogical device to exhort their students to exert constant effort to improve themselves and not lapse into complacency. The Stoics were convinced that as one approached this goal, one came closer to real and certain happiness.

7. References and Further Reading

  • Becker, Lawrence C. 1998. A New Stoicism. Princeton: Princeton University Press.
    • A daring exposition of what Stoic philosophy would look like today if it had enjoyed a continuous development through the Renaissance, the Enlightenment, modern science, and the fads of twentieth century moral philosophy.
  • Brennan, Tad. 2003. “Stoic Moral Psychology,” in Brad Inwood, ed., The Cambridge Companion to the Stoics, 257-294.
  • Cooper, John. 1989. “Greek Philosophers on Euthanasia and Suicide,” in Brody, B.A. ed., Suicide and Euthanasia. Dordrecht, 9-38.
  • Inwood, Brad and Donini, Pierluigi. 1999. “Stoic ethics,” in Algra, Keimpe, et al. eds. The Cambridge History of Hellenistic Philosophy. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 675-738.
    • A detailed treatment of the subject.
  • Long, A. A. 1986. Hellenistic Philosophy: Stoics, Epicureans, Sceptics. 2nd ed. Berkeley and Los Angeles: University of California Press.
    • A very readable introduction to the three Hellenistic schools.
  • Long, A. A. and D. N. Sedley. 1987. The Hellenistic Philosophers, Volume 1. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
    • Readings from the main schools: Epicureanism, Stoicism, Scepticism, and the Academics. Includes commentaries on the readings. This is the standard primary source text.
  • Schofield, Malcolm. “Stoic Ethics,” in Brad Inwood, ed., The Cambridge Companion to the Stoics, 233-256.
    • A fine overview that argues that Zeno (founder of the Stoa) systematized the Socratic and Cynic philosophies. Two different types of projects in Stoic ethics are identified: (1) laying out the definitions and divisions of the key concepts in discursive ethical discourse, and (2) trying to explain and establish by argument the Stoic view on key ethical subjects.
  • Sorabji, Richard. 2000. Emotion and Peace of Mind: From Stoic Agitation to Christian Temptation. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
    • A meticulous study of Stoic moral psychology and much more.

Author Information

William O. Stephens
Email: stphns@creighton.edu
Creighton University
U. S. A.

Categories: Ancient Philosophy, Ethics